18th Century British Aesthetics

First published Thu Jul 6, 2006; substantive revision Thu Oct 6, 2022

18th-century British aesthetics addressed itself to a variety of questions: What is taste? What is beauty? Is there is a standard of taste and of beauty? What is the relation between the beauty of nature and that of artistic representation? What is the relation between one fine art and another? How ought the fine arts be ranked one against another? What is the nature of the sublime and ought it be ranked with the beautiful? What is the nature of genius and what is its relation to taste?

Although none of these questions was peripheral to 18th-century British aesthetics, not all were equally central. The question on which the others tended to turn was the question concerning the nature of taste. But this question was not simply how best generally to define taste. Everyone seems to have been in at least rough agreement with Joseph Addison’s early definition of taste as “that faculty of soul, which discerns the beauties of an author with pleasure, and the imperfections with dislike” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 409). But agreeing with Addison meant agreeing only to use “taste” to refer to that faculty and to acknowledge that such discerning has something of the phenomenology of sensation. The central question was how to think of taste so defined. Is taste a higher, cognitive faculty, akin perhaps to reason, with objects of a primarily intellectual nature? Or is it a lower, bodily faculty, more akin to the five bodily senses, and with objects of a primarily material nature? The major theories that arose in response to this question can be grouped into three main lineages: (a) internal-sense theories, of which the theories of Shaftesbury (1711), Hutcheson (1725), Hume (1739–40, 1751, and 1757) and Reid (1785) are representative; (b) imagination theories, of which theories of Addison (1712) and Burke (1757/59) are representative; and (c) association theories, of which the theories of Gerard (1757) and Alison (1790) are representative.

1. Internal-Sense Theories

1.1 Shaftesbury

Shaftesbury takes up aesthetic questions from time to time across his Characteristics of Men, Manners, Opinions, Times (first published in 1711), particularly within its third, fourth, and fifth Treatises. But it is perhaps only within this last treatise—the dialogue The Moralists, a Philosophical Rhapsody—that he can be said to develop a theory of taste. Near the beginning of the dialogue’s climactic section (Section II of Book III) Shaftesbury’s spokesman, Theocles, issues a pair of imperatives: one ought “never to admire the Representative-Beauty, except for the sake of the Original; nor aim at other Enjoyment than of the rational kind” (Cooper 1711 [2001, 221]). It is largely in the subsequent explication of these imperatives that Shaftesbury’s highly influential theory of taste emerges.

Shaftesbury does not intend the force of these imperatives to be negative merely. He clearly thinks that one ought to admire the original beauty referred to in the first imperative; indeed he later identifies it with the beauty of the divine mind. Moreover, the admiration of beauty referred to in the first imperative just is the enjoyment of the rational kind referred to in the second. Hence the two imperatives, reversing their order, might be paraphrased as follows: one ought to seek the enjoyment of beauty as opposed to the rival enjoyments that one might mistake for the enjoyment of beauty; and the enjoyment of beauty that one ought to seek ought always to be for the sake of the original as opposed to the sake of the representative merely. To say that the rival enjoyments that one might take for the enjoyment of beauty are not “of the rational kind” is to say that they are merely sensory or bodily in nature. Such non-rational enjoyments, moreover, are “interested” in the sense that they depend on the thought of, and beget a desire for, the use or possession of their objects. Theocles illustrates this point with a series of examples culminating in that of sexual pleasure taken at the sight of a human body. “I … was apprehensive,” says his interlocutor, Philocles, that

you wou’d force me at last to think of certain powerful FORMS in human Kind, which draw after ’em a Set of eager Desires, Wishes, and Hopes; no way suitable, I must confess, to your rational and refin’d Contemplation of Beauty. The Proportions of this living Architecture, as wonderful as they are, inspire nothing of a studious or contemplative kind. The more they are view’d , the further they are from satisfying by mere View. (Cooper 1711 [2001, 222])

An example surfacing a bit later serves both to reinforce the distinction between such non-rational enjoyments and the rational enjoyment of beauty and to introduce the distinction between the admiration of representative beauty for its own sake and that for the sake of the original. Enjoyment taken in the sight of a coin is enjoyment taken in its beauty only if it arises not from any thought of what the coin may buy, but merely from the contemplation of the design or form of the coin’s inscription. Whether in addition this is admiration of the coin’s representative beauty for the sake of the original depends on whether one recognizes the representative nature of the coin’s beauty. Because the coin is beautiful in virtue of its design or form, it is beautiful not in virtue of its material properties but in virtue of the effect that some mind has had upon it. But if the coin is beautiful in virtue of the effect of some mind upon it, this can only be because that mind is itself beautiful, the beauty of the coin being representative merely of the original beauty of that mind. Hence to admire the beauty of the coin (or the beauty of any material object) without acknowledging that its beauty merely shadows the beauty of the mind that designed it is to fail to admire representative beauty for the sake of the original (Cooper 1711 [2001, 225–226]).

But there is a complication. If the mind that formed the coin is a human mind, then, while its beauty is original relative to the coin, it is representative relative to the beauty of the mind that formed it. Hence there are “Three Degrees or Orders of Beauty”:

first, the dead Forms … which bear a Fashion, and are form’d, whether by Man, or Nature; but have no forming Power, no Action, or Intelligence … the second kind, the Forms which form; that is, which have Intelligence, Action, and Operation … [and] that third Order of Beauty, which forms not only such as we call mere Forms, but even the Forms which form. (Cooper 1711 [2001, 227–228])

Hence all beauty ultimately “resolves it-self” (Cooper 1711 [2001, 228]) into the beauty of the divine mind:

whatever Beauty appears in our second Order of Forms, or whatever is deriv’d or produc’d from thence, all this is eminently, principally, and originally in this last Order of Supreme and Sovereign Beauty. (Cooper 1711 [2001, 228])

Thus admiring the representative beauty of the coin for the sake of the original requires tracing its beauty not merely to the mind that designed it, but also to the mind that designed that mind.

A consequence of the view that the divine mind is the source of all beauty is that beauty is not relative to human nature merely, but is absolute and real. Indeed, given Shaftesbury’s pantheistic leanings, things turn out, on his view, to be beautiful quite literally from the point of view of the universe. A further consequence is that beauty, inhering only in mind or in its reflection, cannot be grasped by any bodily sense, but only by the mind itself:

there is nothing so divine as BEAUTY: which belonging not to Body, nor having any Principle or Existence except in MIND and REASON, is alone discover’d and acquir’d by this diviner Part, when it inspects it-self, the only object worthy of it-self. (Cooper 1711 [2001, 238])

But Shaftesbury does not rest with the claim that it is the mind that grasps beauty: he adds the claim that it is by a “mental” or “inward” sense that the mind does so. Though it is difficult to know just what Shaftesbury takes this claim to come to, the general idea is that the faculty by which the mind discerns beauty has enough in common with external sense to warrant the term “sense” and to be regarded as no less natural (or basic) than external sense. In The Moralists he observes that the discernment of beauty has the immediacy of external sensation and so must be regarded as natural as external sensation. No sooner is an object of the right kind placed before the mind

than straight an inward EYE distinguishes, and sees the Fair and Shapely, the Amiable and Admirable, apart from the Deform’d, the Foul, the Odious, or the Despicable. How is it possible therefore not to own “That these Distinctions have their Foundation in Nature, the Discernment it-self is natural, and from Nature alone?” (Cooper 1711 [2001, 231])

And, in a famous passage from An Inquiry concerning Virtue and Merit (Treatise IV), Shaftesbury observes that the discernment of beauty has the necessity or will-independence of external sensation and so again must be regarded as natural on a par with external sensation. Once an object of the right kind is placed before the mind, a verdict as to its beauty cannot be withheld:

The Mind, which is Spectator or Auditor of other Minds, cannot be without its Eye and Ear; so as to discern Proportion, distinguish Sound, and scan each Sentiment or Thought which comes before it …. It … finds a Foul and Fair, a Harmonious and a Dissonant, as really and truly here, as in any musical Numbers, or in the outward Forms or Representations of sensible Things. Nor can it with-hold its Admiration and Extasy, its Aversion and Scorn, any more in what relates to one than to the other of these Subjects. So that to deny the common and natural Sense of a SUBLIME and BEAUTIFUL in Things, will appear an Affectation merely, to any-one who considers duly of this Affair. (Cooper 1711 [2001, 17])

Shaftesbury, it bears mentioning, did not originate the idea that it is by an inward sense that we lay hold of the sublime and the beautiful. That idea is an element of the neoplatonic tradition which Shaftesbury’s work extends, and can be traced back to St. Augustine (2005/389–391, De vera religione §59) and Plotinus (250 [1991, 1.6.7–9]), if not to Plato himself (1989, 210a-211d).

1.2 Hutcheson

On the title page of the first edition of his An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1725), Francis Hutcheson acknowledges a deep debt to Shaftesbury, announcing that “The Principles of the late Earl of Shaftsbury” would be explained and defended therein. But it is open to question whether Hutcheson overstates his debt. The debt is deepest with regard to the notion of internal sense, but Hutcheson can fairly be said to make this notion his own. That is certainly the judgment of history: anyone undertaking to explain, defend, or refute the notion of internal sense after 1725 took himself to be explaining, defending, or refuting the principles of Dr. Hutcheson.

Hutcheson gives one argument for the sensibility, and another for the internality, of the power by which we discern beauty. His argument for its sensibility is largely a systematization and amplification of Shaftesbury’s. That the discernment of beauty is sensible follows from the immediacy, necessity, and disinterestedness of the arising of the pleasure by which beauty is discerned:

This superior Power of Perception is justly called a Sense, because of its Affinity to the other Senses in this, that the Pleasure does not arise from any Knowledge of Principles, Proportions, Causes, or the Usefulness of the Object; but strikes us at first with the Idea of Beauty …. And further, the ideas of Beauty and Harmony, like other sensible Ideas, are necessarily pleasant to us, as well as immediately so; neither can any Resolution of our own, nor any Prospect of Advantage or Disadvantage, vary the Beauty or Deformity of an Object. (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 25])

It is in arguing for the internality of the power of discerning beauty that Hutcheson’s departure from Shaftesbury begins to show. Shaftesbury, it will be recalled, argues that the discernment of beauty is internal (or mental) on the grounds that the objects of beauty necessarily are: mind alone can discern beauty because mind alone is beautiful, external objects managing a degree of beauty only by having a bit of mind imprinted on them. But Hutcheson cannot make this argument because he does not think that objects of beauty are necessarily internal. Hutcheson does follow Shaftesbury in maintaining that things are beautiful in virtue of their proportion or order (Hutcheson’s preferred and more precise term is “uniformity amidst variety”) and he may follow Shaftesbury in thinking all proportion or order to be the effect of mind. But he importantly does not follow Shaftesbury in inferring from the premise that things are beautiful owing to the effect of mind to the conclusion that mind alone is beautiful.

Hutcheson begins his argument for the internality of the power of discerning beauty by observing that the five external senses are insufficient for that discernment—one could have all five in perfect working order and yet be insensible to beauty (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 23]). This observation, however, does not seem to show the discernment of beauty to be internal. It seems to show merely that such discernment cannot be identified with any known external power. But Hutcheson continues:

There will appear another Reason perhaps … for calling this Power of perceiving Ideas an Internal Sense, from this, that in some other Affairs, where our External Senses are not much concern’d, we discern a sort of Beauty, very like, in many respects, to that observ’d in sensible Objects, and accompany’d with like Pleasure. Such is the Beauty perceiv’d in Theorems, or universal Truths, in general Causes …. (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 24])

Here the reasoning is that the power of discerning beauty must be internal because some objects of beauty are. But given that Hutcheson concedes that many objects of beauty are not internal, the proper conclusion seems to be that the power of discerning beauty is neither exclusively internal nor exclusively external. In any case, the power of discerning beauty cannot be internal after Shaftesbury’s manner.

But after what manner is it internal then? Hutcheson simply never says in An Inquiry into the Original of Our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue, though he wastes no time supplying this deficiency in the immediately subsequent An Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions and Affections (first published in 1727). An internal sense, he there clarifies, is one whose ideas arise only if certain other ideas have already arisen. Sight is not an internal sense since the arising of the idea of blue, for example, does not depend upon the previous arising of any other idea. But the sense of beauty is internal because the arising of the pleasurable idea of beauty depends “upon the previous Reception and Comparison of various sensible Perceptions … or intellectual ideas, when we find Uniformity … among them” (Hutcheson 1742 [2002, 16]). Another way of putting the point is to say that internal senses depend for their objects on the operation of other powers while external senses do not. Hence in point of internality internal senses are apparently on a par with the powers of reason and memory, for example: unless some other power or powers has operated to place an object before the mind, there is nothing about which to reason, nothing to remember, and nothing internally to sense. This use of “internal” and “external” may be thought misleading, given that it allows both external and internal powers to operate on objects both bodily and intellectual, both from within and from without. Hutcheson came to agree with this criticism apparently. In later works, he replaces “internal” with “reflex” or “subsequent” to refer to powers that depend on others for their objects, and “external” with “direct” or “antecedent” to refer to powers that do not. (Hutcheson 1747, 12–13 and 1744, 48).

This transformation of Shaftesbury’s notion of an internal sense is not the only consequence of Hutcheson’s rejection of the view that mind alone is beautiful. It will be recalled that it is this view—or, more particularly, the view that all beauty reduces to the beauty of the divine mind—that undergirds Shaftesbury’s aesthetic realism and hence his absolutism. But Hutcheson has neither this nor any substitute view by which to prop up an alternative version of realism, and settles hesitantly on a version of idealism, and hence relativism, that understands the idea of beauty on the model of an idea of a Lockean secondary quality:

Beauty, like other Names of sensible Ideas, properly denotes the Perception of some Mind; so Cold, Hot, Sweet, Bitter, denote Sensations in our Minds, to which perhaps there is no resemblance in the Objects, which excite these ideas in us, however we generally imagine that there is something in the Object just like our Perception …. were there no Mind with a Sense of Beauty to contemplate Objects, I see not how they could be call’d beautiful. (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 27])

Moreover there seems to be no necessity that the idea of beauty should arise, as it does, in response to objects having uniformity amidst variety. Had it pleased him to do so, God might have given us a sense of beauty responsive to irregularity amidst simplicity (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 80]).

But that God might not have given us a sense of beauty responsive to uniformity amidst variety raises the question why he did. Though it is a question that never arises for Shaftesbury, Hutcheson gives it an answer that narrows the distance between the two. As Shaftesbury had famously stressed, the universe is highly ordered—at least “Uniformity, Proportion, and Similitude [are diffused] thro all the Parts of Nature which we can observe” (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 81]). In such a universe, “[t]he manner of Knowledge by universal Theorems … must be most convenient for Beings of limited Understanding and Power” (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 79]). But if such is the manner of knowledge most convenient for beings such as us, a benevolent God may be expected to provide some immediate motive—a motive, that is, that does not require that we reflect on what is most convenient for us—to our pursuit of it. Because a theorem by nature possesses uniformity amidst variety—a theorem simply is the unification of various particulars under a single principle (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 36])—it stands to reason that

the Author of Nature has determin’d us … to receive from uniform Objects the Pleasures of Beauty and Harmony, to excite us to the Pursuit of Knowledge, and to reward us for it. (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 99])

So it is in the perception of objects of intellect—theorems, namely—that the internal sense of beauty has its raison d’être, and it is by resembling theorems in point of uniformity that other objects, including material objects, are beautiful. In this way Hutcheson recovers an element of Shaftesbury’s theory that had apparently been lost in his transformation of Shaftesbury’s notion of internal sense—he recovers a priority of the intellectual over the material as object of beauty. This is not to say, however, that Hutcheson recovers Shaftesbury’s priority exactly. Shaftesbury’s priority is reductive, having its ground in the distinction he draws between representative and original beauty. Hutcheson draws no corresponding distinction and so allows material objects to be beautiful in their own right. That difference is consequential. If material objects can be beautiful, then the sense by which we find them so must be capable of training outward. If the notion of internal sense that Hutcheson took over from Shaftesbury is essentially the one we find in Augustine, Plotinus, and Plato, the notion of aesthetic perception that Hutcheson left to us is essentially the one we find in Frank Sibley (Sibley 2001).

1.3 Hume

Hume takes his notion of taste over from Hutcheson. He regards taste as an “internal sense” which depends on the operation of other mental faculties to “pave the way” for its pronouncements by supplying it with an object upon which to pronounce (Hume 1751 [1986, 173]). Which mental faculties must operate, and which operations those faculties must perform, varies from object to object:

… in order to … give a proper discernment of [an object of taste], it is often necessary, we find, that much reasoning should precede, that nice distinctions be made, just conclusions drawn, distant comparisons formed, complicated relations examined, and general facts fixed and ascertained. Some species of beauty, especially the natural kinds, on their first appearance, command our affection and approbation … . But in many orders of beauty, particularly those of the finer arts, it is requisite to employ much reasoning, in order to feel the proper sentiment. (Hume 1751 [1986, 173]).

Hume shows less interest than Hutcheson does in determining which feature or features of objects result in our finding them beautiful. Hutcheson, it will be recalled, argues that we take the pleasure of beauty in response to all and only objects in which we find uniformity amidst variety. Hume resists any such tidy formula, speaking of multiple principles of taste. The only time he elaborates on any particular principle is in The Treatise, where he holds, contra Hutcheson, that the beauty we find in many objects owes, at least in part, to their usefulness. Hutcheson had denied that the usefulness of an object could play any role in our finding it beautiful, on the grounds that judgments of taste are necessarily disinterested whereas judgments of usefulness are necessarily interested. Against this Hume observes that judgments of taste are necessarily disinterested only in the sense that they are necessarily non-self-interested, and that I might therefore judge a chair to be beautiful on the basis of its being useful to someone, though not on the basis that it is useful to me (Hume 1739–40 [1987, 363–365]).

Hume follows Hutcheson in regarding the idea of beauty as analogous to a Lockean secondary quality, and so follows Hutcheson in holding beauty to be subjective, having no existence outside of the mind that contemplates it (Hume 1757 [1987, 230]). But Hume reckons more directly than Hutcheson does with the price such a subjectivism exacts, namely, its apparent inconsistency with our practice of counting some judgments of beauty as correct and others as incorrect. This reckoning starts with the observation that the subjectivity of colors is no barrier to our counting some color judgments correct and some incorrect. Anyone who has the idea of redness can recognize the conditions under which we count an object as veridically manifesting redness, namely, “its appearance in day-light to the eye of a man in health” (Hume 1757 [1987, 233–234]). Similarly, Hume holds that anyone with the idea of beauty can recognize the conditions under which we count an object as veridically manifesting beauty (Hume 1757 [1987, 233–234]). These conditions are the appearance of beauty to those (1) whose taste is delicate (Hume 1757 [1987, 234–237]), (2) who have practiced (Hume 1757 [1987, 237–238]), (3) who have made certain comparisons (Hume 1757 [1987, 238]), (4) who lack prejudice (Hume 1757 [1987, 239–240]), and (5) whose understanding is sound (Hume 1757 [1987, 240–241]). Conditions (1), (2), and (5) are evidently supposed to guarantee that the object is grasped as having all and only the aesthetically relevant properties it has, whereas conditions (3) and (4) are evidently supposed to guarantee that a properly calibrated sentiment arises from the object as grasped. In sum, we take an object’s beauty to appear as it is, according to Hume, when and only when the right sentiment arises from the object rightly grasped.

1.4 Reid

Thomas Reid’s theory of taste, as developed in the final essay of his Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (first published in 1785), makes use of a range of theoretical resources that had become available by the last decades of the Eighteenth Century. Its account of sublimity owes to Burke; its treatment of novelty owes to Addison and to Gerard; the use it makes of association may owe to Gerard as well. But as an internal-sense theory its debt is principally to Hutcheson and to Shaftesbury.

Reid adheres to Hutcheson’s notion of internal sense rather than to Shaftesbury’s. Indeed Reid’s account of Hutcheson’s notion is arguably sharper than any Hutcheson ever gives:

Beauty or deformity in an object, results from its nature or structure. To perceive the beauty therefore, we must perceive the nature or structure from which it results. In this the internal sense differs from the external. Our external senses may discover qualities which do not depend upon any antecedent perception …. But it is impossible to perceive the beauty of an object, without perceiving the object, or at least conceiving it. On this account, Dr. Hutcheson called the senses of beauty and harmony reflex or secondary senses; because the beauty cannot be perceived unless the object be perceived by some other power of the mind. (Reid 1785 [1969, 760–761])

But while Reid agrees with Hutcheson about what makes the sense of beauty internal, he disagrees with Hutcheson about what is “ingredient” to that sense (Reid 1785 [1969, 782]). Hutcheson, as Reid understands him, posits but one ingredient: an agreeable feeling or emotion resembling nothing in the object. But it is in restricting himself to this single affective ingredient, Reid thinks, that Hutcheson puts himself on the path to Lockean anti-realism with respect to beauty, since it may be thought that if the sensation of beauty consists merely in such a feeling it refers to nothing in the object, and if it refers to nothing in the object then it must refer merely to “the perception of some Mind” (Hutcheson 1726 [2004, 27]).

Reid takes this position to be “not so much an error in judgment, as an abuse of words” (Reid 1785 [1969, 782]). There are words by which one may say of Virgil’s Georgics that it is the cause of a feeling, but these are not the words The Georgics is beautiful; there is no reason to think they say anything of The Georgics other than that it has the property of beauty (Reid 1785 [1969, 759]). Hence a theory of taste that does not contradict “the universal sense of mankind, as expressed by their language” (Reid 1785 [1969, 760]) must allow the internal sense of beauty to have, in addition to its affective ingredient, a cognitive one—a judgment ascribing a property to the object.

Reid appears to acknowledge that allowing the sense of beauty this cognitive dimension does not commit one to realism regarding beauty: he appears to acknowledge that it is one thing to allow that the deliverances of internal sense comprise judgments and yet another to allow that the positive judgments they sometimes comprise are sometimes true (Reid 1785 [1969, 783]). The case Reid makes for realism regarding beauty (and sublimity) is complex. He makes a straightforward appeal to common sense (Reid 1785 [1969, 770]). He argues, after Descartes, that our possession of an inherently fallacious sense would make a deceiver of God (Reid 1785 [1969, 783]). But his deepest and most complicated reason for thinking beauty real has to do with the nature of the properties that he takes to ground beauty. Following Burke, Reid identifies the affect properly inspired by beautiful objects as love (this contrasts with the affect properly inspired by sublime objects, which he identifies as admiration). Since we properly love only what is good, the properties that properly inspire love must be perfections or excellences of some kind. It follows that the beauty of an object has its ground in whatever perfections properly inspire our love for it, and so has whatever reality those perfections have.

Reid concedes that we are only sometimes able to specify the perfections in virtue of which we judge things beautiful. He refers to judgments in which the perfection cannot be specified as “instinctive” and judgments in which it can be as “rational” (Reid 1785 [1969, 785–787]). Hence it is necessarily from an incomplete set of data that his enquiry into beauty-grounding perfections proceeds. That enquiry begins with a consideration of those perfections in virtue of which we judge minds beautiful, that is, the perfections that inspire love for the minds that possess them. Reid finds that these perfections divide into three classes: first, the amiable moral virtues, which include “[i]nnocence, gentleness, condescension, humanity, natural affection, public spirit”; second, the amiable intellectual talents, which include, “knowledge, good sense, wit, humour, cheerfulness, good taste, excellence in any of the fine arts”; and, third, certain perfections pertaining to the mind’s active powers—perfections that “render the body a fit instrument for the mind”—including “health, strength, and agility” (Reid 1785 [1969, 792]). Reid finds further that these perfections are not relative to human nature but absolute:

Is not power in its nature more excellent that weakness; knowledge than ignorance; wisdom than folly; fortitude than pusillanimity? … Let us suppose, if possible, a being so constituted, as to have a high respect for ignorance, weakness, and folly; to venerate cowardice, malice, and envy, and to hold the contrary qualities in contempt …. Could we believe such a constitution to be anything else than madness and delirium? … We can as easily conceive a constitution, by which one should perceive two and three to make fifteen, or a part to be greater than a whole. (Reid 1785 [1969, 770])

Thus Reid concludes that “[t]here is therefore a real intrinsic excellence in some qualities of mind, as in power, knowledge, wisdom, virtue, magnanimity,” and that a mind in possession of such qualities is therein really beautiful (Reid 1785 [1969, 771]).

When Reid enquires next after the perfections in virtue of which we ascribe beauty to material objects, his account takes a Shaftesburian turn. Reid revives Shaftesbury’s distinction between original and representative beauty (though he prefers the term “derived” to “representative”) and also Shaftesbury’s claim that the beauty of material objects derives from the original beauty of minds. This allows him to maintain that the perfections in virtue of which we attribute beauty to material objects just are the perfections in virtue of which we attribute beauty to minds. But whereas Shaftesbury simply infers without further argument the reduction of material to mental beauty from the premise that material beauty is the effect of mind, Reid takes up instance after instance of material beauty, arguing with respect to each that it is best understood as a “sign” of some instance of mental beauty. The beauty we attribute to inanimate nature signifies the wisdom and goodness of the mind that fashioned it for our use (Reid 1785 [1969, 799–800]); the beauty we attribute to animals, insofar as we regard them as minded, signifies “their instincts, their appetites, their affections, their sagacity” (Reid 1785 [1969, 794]); the beauty we attribute to the human form signifies either “some perfection of the body, as a part of the man, and an instrument of the mind” or “some amiable quality or attribute of the mind itself” (Reid 1785 [1969, 806]).

It may be objected that such a reduction of material to mental beauty cannot serve Reid’s case for realism, at least as it applies to material objects. For it may seem that the beauty we attribute to material objects can never be real, by Reid’s lights, given that no material object ever can have any of the mental perfections capable of grounding beauty. But such an objection misses a subtlety of Reid’s position. Strictly speaking, material objects never are beautiful. But this does not imply that the beauty that we attribute to them never is real. It is real, at least generally, though strictly speaking it belongs only to the minds that the material objects in question signify. If it seems to us that these objects themselves possess beauty, this is because beauty is prone to be “transferred” or “communicated” from the minds that really have it to the material objects that merely signify it (Reid 1785 [1969, 788]). Reid never uses the term “association” to refer to the mechanism by which beauty is thus communicated from mental signified to material sign. But that he does not distance himself from association—the mechanism by then at the center of a great deal of theorizing about taste—makes it hard to deny that it has found a positive role in his own theory.

2. Imagination Theories

2.1 Addison

Joseph Addison’s theory of taste resides principally in the work Addison refers to as his “essay on the pleasures of the imagination” (Addison and Steele 1879, nos. 409 and 421). It comprises eleven papers—nos. 411 through 421—appearing in the journal The Spectator on successive days during the summer of 1712. The timing of the essay’s publication raises questions about its relation to Shaftesbury’s Characteristics, which had appeared one year earlier. But it is difficult to detect even a hint of Shaftesbury’s theory of taste in Addison’s. That the two theories deeply oppose one another might suggest that Addison’s is a reaction against Shaftesbury’s. But Addison does not engage Shaftesbury: rather he tends simply to assume what Shaftesbury simply denies and vice-versa. Moreover Addison understood himself to be undertaking something “entirely new” in advancing a theory of taste (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 409). It seems best to conclude, therefore, that there are two original British theories of taste. While it would be hard to say which was more influential, it is easy to say that each was greatly so: every subsequent British theory of taste, at least until the close of the Eighteenth Century, shows the strong influence of one, the other, or both.

Addison’s fundamental idea is that the pleasures of taste are pleasures of the imagination. This should not be taken to imply that Addison identifies taste with the imagination. Taste is a faculty of judgment: it discerns the perfections of an author with pleasure (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 409). Imagination is a faculty of representation: it represents things in images; it is the faculty of visual representation (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 411). Hence Addison’s fundamental idea comes to this, apparently: taste judges what the imagination represents; the perfections that taste discerns with pleasure are perfections that things have as objects of visual representation. But if objects of taste are objects of visual representation, then objects of taste are first and foremost material objects: mountain ranges, waterfalls, sexually attractive bodies are among the paradigms Addison offers (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 412). It is here that the contrast with Shaftesbury becomes plain. It will be recalled that Shaftesbury holds objects of taste to be first and foremost objects of intellect, and that the fundamental difficulty that his theory must overcome is to explain our intuition that material objects are also capable of beauty. With Addison it is just the reverse.

Addison distinguishes two classes of pleasures of the imagination: primary pleasures, which derive from images of objects currently present to sight; and secondary pleasures, which derive from images of objects currently absent from sight and so called up before the mind in some other way. He then divides primary pleasures into three classes: those proceeding from the sight of what is great (or sublime); those proceeding from the sight of what is novel; and those proceeding from the sight of what is beautiful. A great object is one so large as to strain the imagination’s capacity to render it: its apprehension flings the mind into a “pleasing astonishment” and a “delightful stillness and amazement” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 412). A novel object is one new or strange to their viewer; its apprehension “fills the soul with an agreeable surprise” and “gratifies its curiosity” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 412). A beautiful object is either an object of sexual attraction or one possessing a “gaiety or variety of colors” or “a symmetry or proportion of parts” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 412); the apprehension of beautiful objects strikes the mind with a “secret [i.e., inexplicable] satisfaction and complacency” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 412).

Addison’s chief interest in secondary pleasures owes to their comprising the pleasures of artistic representation: representational artworks, he maintains, function centrally to call up mental images of objects that are great, novel, or beautiful. So Homer excels in the representation of great things, Virgil in the representation of beautiful things, Ovid in the representation of novel things, and Milton in the representation of all three (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 417). But Addison acknowledges that this account of the pleasures of artistic representation is so far incomplete; indeed he devotes a good portion the latter part of the essay to its supplementation.

It seems clear, for starters, that our interest in artistic representations is not exhausted by our interest in what they represent: we take pleasure in the representations themselves as representations. To supply this deficiency Addison proposes a “a new principle of pleasure, which is nothing else but the action of the mind, which compares the ideas that arise from [the representation], with the ideas that arise from the objects themselves” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 418). The description of a beautiful scene pleases us, according to this proposal, both for the beauty of the scene and for “the aptness of the description to excite its image” (Addison and Steele 1879, no 418). But Addison himself seems less than fully convinced by this proposal, since there is no reason to think of a pleasure arising from an act of comparison as a pleasure of the imagination; such a pleasure, he concedes, “may be more properly called the pleasure of the understanding” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 418).

A second deficiency concerns our interest in the artistic representations of things positively disagreeable, such as our interest in the performances of tragedies. The difficulty is that it seems we ought always to prefer representations of the agreeable, since they alone are capable of pleasing according to both principles so far advanced. Hence Addison recruits a third principle of pleasure: representations of the disagreeable please us by the contrast they present between the disagreeable scene they represent and the comparatively agreeable situation in which we find ourselves:

When we look on such hideous objects, we are not a little pleased to think that we are in no danger of them. We consider them at the same time, as dreadful and harmless; so that the more frightful appearance they make, the greater is the pleasure we receive from the sense of our own safety. (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 418)

A third perceived deficiency derives from the common intuition that some pleasures of artistic representation derive from the representation of purely intellectual objects, such as abstract moral, critical, or scientific truths. Addison concedes the truth of this intuition, but maintains that pleasures derived from the representation of such intellectual objects are pleasures of taste only insofar as the objects are represented metaphorically as having material form:

a truth in the understanding is as it were reflected by the imagination; we are able to see something like color and shape in a notion, and to discover a scheme of thoughts traced upon matter. (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 421)

The materialist basis of Addison’s theory disposes it to a relativism and so to an anti-realism with respect to the perfections of taste, much as the intellectualist basis of the theories of Shaftesbury and Reid disposes them to an absolutism and so to a realism. Because the pleasures of taste are pleasures taken merely in the visual representation of material objects, there is no reason to think any creature capable of visual representation incapable of such pleasures. But there is also no reason to think all creatures capable of such pleasures capable of all the same pleasures from all the same objects. Indeed there is every reason to think that

every different species of sensible creatures has its different notions of beauty, and … each of them is most affected with the beauties of its own kind. (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 412)

Hence Addison concludes that “[t]here is not perhaps any real beauty … more in one piece of matter than another” and that beauty—and also greatness and novelty, presumably—exists in the mind merely merely (Addison and Steele 1879, nos. 412 and 413).

2.2 Burke

The conception of imagination at work in Edmund Burke’s A Philosophical Enquiry into the Origin of our Ideas of the Sublime and the Beautiful (published in 1757 [1759]) is a successor to Addison’s, though it has undergone expansion along one dimension and contraction along another.

The expansion presumably responds to a problem arising from the application Addison’s fundamental idea—the idea that the pleasures of taste are pleasures of visual representation—to objects that do not present themselves visually, such as literary and musical works. With respect to such objects Addison is forced to maintain either that they function mainly to prompt mental images of objects that do present themselves visually, or that the pleasures they afford are not mainly pleasures of taste (he takes the former line with respect to literary works and the latter, apparently, with respect to music (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 416)). It is presumably to mitigate this difficulty that Burke adopts a conception of the imagination that encompasses all five sense modalities. Thus whereas for Addison one can imagine merely how things look, for Burke one can also imagine how they sound, taste, smell, and feel. Though this broadened conception is not unique to Burke, it is unlikely that any other theorist of taste so fully exploits its breadth: each sense modality has its moment in A Philosophical Enquiry, from a section on the beauty of surfaces as revealed by touch (Burke 1757 [1990, 110–111]) to one on the sublimity of “Bitters and Stenches” (Burke 1757 [1990, 78–79]).

The contraction also presumably responds to problem in Addison, this time to an apparent inconsistency in the conception of imagination itself. Addison opposes the pleasures of the imagination to the pleasures of sense, on one hand, and to the pleasures of the understanding, on the other (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 411). But he also defines the pleasures of the imagination as those arising from the visual representation of things, and allows that some of those pleasures—those he calls “the primary pleasures of the imagination”—arise from things present to vision (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 411). Thus it becomes hard to say what the opposition between the pleasures of sense and the pleasures of the imagination can amount to. It is presumably to relieve this tension that Burke recasts Addison’s distinction between primary and secondary pleasures of the imagination as a distinction between “the primary pleasures of sense” and “the secondary pleasures of the imagination” (Burke 1757 [1990, 22]).

It is a complicated question whether Burke takes the primary pleasures of sense and the secondary pleasures of the imagination jointly to exhaust the pleasures of taste. In the 1759 addition to A Philosophical Enquiry (the “Introduction on Taste”) Burke allows that objects of the understanding constitute “a very considerable part of what are considered objects of Taste” (Burke 1757 [1990, 22]). But that objects of the understanding cannot be objects of taste seems a guiding assumption of much of the rest of the Enquiry: consider, for example, Burke’s claim that it is only as an object of the imagination, and specifically not as an object of the understanding, that God can be found sublime (Burke 1757 [1990, 62]). It is worth noting, moreover, that in other respects Burke’s theory is more thoroughly materialist than Addison’s. Although Addison maintains that the pleasures of taste are pleasures of the imagination, his explanations as to why certain objects of imagination please are not particularly materialist. He traces the pleasure we take in “an unbounded view,” for example, to our regarding it as “an image of liberty” (Addison and Steele 1879, no. 412). Burke’s tendency, by contrast, is to explain the pleasures of sense and imagination by appeal merely to our physical constitution. He holds the delight we take in the viewing very large objects, for example, to be a consequence of the retina’s being struck, all at once or in quick succession, by the relatively many light rays that very large objects reflect (Burke 1757 [1990, 124–125]).

But Burke’s chief innovation consists neither in his conception of the imagination, nor in the extent of his materialism, but in his theory of the perfections of taste. It will be recalled that Addison posits three such perfections—sublimity (or greatness), novelty, and beauty—though he offers no explanation as to why there should be just these three. Burke argues, briefly, that novelty is too superficial and ubiquitous to keep rightful company with sublimity and beauty (Burke 1757 [1990, 29]). And he argues, at length, that sublimity keeps rightful and exclusive company with beauty on the grounds that it stands to one great class of human passions as beauty stands to the other (Burke 1757 [1990, 30–50]). According to Burke’s account of the passions—which owes much to Hume’s—most all passions answer either to the ends of society or to the ends of self-preservation (Burke 1757 [1990, 35–36]). Moreover, all societal passions “turn” on pleasure, that is, each has either pleasure or its felt absence as a constituent (Burke 1757 [1990, 37]). The societal passion of love has pleasure as a constituent, for example, while the societal passion of grief has the felt absence of pleasure as a constituent (Burke 1757 [1990, 34–35, 39]). All self-preservative passions, by contrast, “turn” on pain, that is, each has either pain or its felt absence of pain as a constituent (Burke 1757 [1990, 37]). The self-preservative passion of simple terror has pain as a constituent, for example, while the self-preservative passion of astonishment—a passion which arises when pain threatens though from a relatively safe distance, and which combines feelings of sobriety, awe, and “tranquility shadowed with horror”—has the felt absence of pain as a constituent (Burke 1757 [1990, 32, 36–37, 53]). Thus there are both desirable and undesirable societal passions and desirable and undesirable self-preservative passions. The beautiful is that which excites the desirable societal passion of love, the sublime that which excites the desirable self-preservative passion of astonishment (Burke 1757 [1990, 36–37, 39, 53]). The objective foundations of beauty and sublimity turn out to be largely opposing: whereas the beautiful tends to the small, the smooth, the various, the delicate, the clear, and the bright, the sublime tends to the great, the uniform, the powerful, the obscure, and the somber. Hence Burke concludes that:

[t]he ideas of the sublime and the beautiful stand on foundations so different, that it is hard … to think of reconciling them in the same subject, without considerably lessening the effect of the one or the other upon the passions. (Burke 1757 [1990, 103])

The impact of Burke’s aesthetic dualism was immediate. Before its appearance, the sublime could be ignored: there is almost no mention of it in Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, or Hume. Afterward it could not be: indeed the major theorists of the second half of the century—Reid, Alison, and Kant—all advance substantial theories of the sublime. But toward the century’s end Burke’s dualism began to come under pressure, not from those who thought two perfections too many, but from those who thought it too few. Uvedale Price, following suggestions in the writings of William Gilpin, argued that there are objects—landscapes, paradigmatically—which please the eye, but which can be considered neither beautiful nor sublime. These objects cannot be considered sublime because they need not be grand (Price 1796, 106–107); they cannot be considered beautiful because they are not smooth, their pleasure depending on “sudden protuberance, and lines that cross each other in a sudden and broken manner” (Price 1796, 61–62). Because the play of form, color, light, and shadow afforded by such objects renders them ideal subjects for painting and drawing, Gilpin referred to them as “picturesque” (Gilpin 1794, 3–5). By the end of the century, the picturesque came to be regarded widely as occupying the position vacated by the novel, i.e., that of a third perfection of taste.

3. Association Theories

3.1 Gerard

Alexander Gerard’s theory of taste, advanced in his 1759 Essay on Taste, is an attempt to mediate, or perhaps to transcend, the dispute between internal-sense and imagination theorists.

Gerard accepts as sound Hutcheson’s argument for the internal sensibility of taste: that the perceptions of taste are simple, that they arise immediately, and that they arise necessarily, show taste to be a sense; that they are separate from and consequent upon those of external sense and reflection show taste to be internal (Gerard 1759, 160–161). But Gerard rejects what Hutcheson regards as a corollary—that taste is an ultimate or irreducible power. Hutcheson may have taken the irreducibility of taste to follow from the simplicity of its perceptions. Or he may have taken the irreducibility of taste to follow, by analogy, from the irreducibility of the external senses. But whether taste is irreducible depends merely on whether its perceptions can be traced to some more basic mental power. Gerard believes that they can be: in fact he believes that they can all be traced to “certain exertions” of the more basic power of the imagination (Gerard 1759, 167). Thus while taste is “itself a species of sensation … in respect of its principles, [it is] justly reduced to imagination” (Gerard 1759, 160).

But what Gerard means by “imagination” is not what either Addison or Burke means, though it is not wholly unrelated either. Officially at least, Gerard follows Addison and Burke in regarding imagination as a representational power and in opposing imagination to sense. But Gerard breaks from Addison and Burke crucially in also opposing imagination to memory. This allows him to group sense and memory together as representational powers that purport to present ideas in correspondence with reality and to isolate imagination as the representational power that does not. That imagination is thus untethered from reality does not, however, imply its utter lawlessness. It is governed by roughly Humean laws of association, according to which it

associat[es] chiefly ideas which resemble, or are contrary, or those that are conjoined, either merely by custom, or by the connection of their objects in vicinity, coexistence, or causation. (p. 168)

Hence another way of putting the contrast between sense and memory, on the one hand, and imagination, on the other, is to say that the former present ideas according to “real bonds of union” whereas the latter presents ideas according to laws of association (Gerard 1759, 167). In this way association becomes an essential element of imagination. Indeed on Gerard’s view there seems, unofficially at least, to be no real difference between association and imagination—at most imagination is the locus of association.

So when Gerard claims that the perceptions of taste can be traced to “certain exertions of imagination,” the exertions he has in mind are acts of association. The idea, roughly, is this. The reducibility of taste implies that the perceptions of taste, which are pleasures, are not natural to their objects in the way Hutcheson, for example, supposed. Objects of taste must, in other words, acquire their pleasurability, and association is the mechanism by which they do so. Just how they do so varies, and the variations are too numerous for cataloguing here. There is, however, a basic mechanism to which Gerard recurs often in his explanations. It seems that the mind forges very strong associations between its own processes and their objects, such that any pleasure natural to a mental process will transfer to its object. It also seems that any process that requires the mind “to exert its activity, and put forth its strength, in order to surmount any difficulty,” is naturally pleasurable, as is the mind’s consciousness of its success in surmounting any difficulty (Gerard 1759, 3). Hence any object whose processing is difficult enough to require the relevant exertion, but not so difficult as to prevent its success, will give pleasure (Gerard 1759, 3–4). Novel objects give pleasure because their unfamiliarity renders their conception just difficult enough (Gerard 1759, 5–6). Sublime objects give pleasure because their sheer scale renders their conception just difficult enough (Gerard 1759, 14). Imitations give pleasure because marking resemblances between them and their originals is just difficult enough (Gerard 1759, 49–51). And ridiculous (that is, humorous) objects give pleasure because marking dissonance or inconsistency amongst their elements is just difficult enough (Gerard 1759, 66–69).

In these and similar ways Gerard reduces internal sense to imagination. An important consequence of the reduction is that it allows Gerard to be neutral on the question of the primacy of the intellectual or the material with respect to objects of taste, over which internal-sense theorists and imagination theorists had divided. Gerard, unique among the major British theorists of his century, shows no inclination to make one sort of object prior to the other. Indeed, within the essay’s first pages he offers a rural prospect, a scientific discovery, a philosophical theory, a poem, and a painting, all as equally uncontroversial examples of objects of taste (Gerard 1759, 6).

3.2 Alison

Archibald Alison, whose Essays on the Nature and Principles of Taste first appeared in 1790, follows after Gerard in several respects. He follows after Gerard in holding that objects of taste are not naturally pleasurable, as Hutcheson had supposed, and so follows after Gerard in holding that objects of taste must acquire their pleasurability from something else that is naturally pleasurable. He follows after Gerard, moreover, in holding that this acquisition depends centrally on association, and follows after Gerard, finally, in holding that the naturally pleasurable something else is—at least typically and at least in part—a mental operation of some sort. But he departs from Gerard regarding both the role of association and the identity of the naturally pleasurable mental operation. Whereas Gerard holds association merely to be a vehicle by which pleasurability is transmitted from the naturally pleasurable mental operation to the object of taste, Alison holds association also to be the central mental operation from which pleasurability is transmitted to the object taste.

The process by which Alison takes the object of taste to acquire its pleasurability is complicated. It begins with the object’s eliciting some simple emotion, such as, cheerfulness, tenderness, melancholy, solemnity, elevation, terror, delicacy, grace, dignity, or majesty (Alison 1811, 57–58, 66). This simple emotion then awakens a train of associated ideas such that each idea is emotionally charged and each is united to each by a single associative principle, usually the principle of resemblance (Alison 1811, 53–57). The awakening of such a train of ideas is commonly known as “the seizing of the imagination” and is naturally attended with a simple pleasure (Alison 1811, 8, 103). This pleasure combines with the pleasure attending the emotion that awakens the train, and with the pleasures attending the emotions that arise from the ideas constituting the train, to form the complex pleasures attending the complex emotions of taste, namely, the emotions of beauty and of sublimity. The claim that the pleasures of beauty and sublimity are in this way complex is an important one, in that it obviates any need to posit a special internal sense by which the pleasures of taste arise:

The pleasure … which accompanies the emotions of taste, may be considered not as a simple, but as a complex pleasure; and as arising not from any separate and peculiar sense, but from the union of the pleasure of SIMPLE EMOTION, with that which is annexed, by the constitution of the human mind, to the exercise of IMAGINATION. (Alison 1811, 103)

When the object of taste is a material object the process by which it becomes pleasurable is more complicated still. The complication is that material objects are not naturally productive of any emotion; they are often naturally productive of simple pleasures and pains, but these are sensations merely. Yet it cannot be doubted that material objects often do produce the complex emotions of beauty and sublimity, and so must also produce the simple emotions that initiate unified trains of ideas of emotion. Hence, material objects, in order to acquire the capacity to produce the complex pleasures of taste, must first acquire the capacity to produce simple emotions. They do so, according to Alison, by coming to signify, through association, qualities of mind that are naturally productive of emotion (Alison 1811, 105–107). These include both active and passive qualities of mind,

[both] its powers or capacities, as beneficence, wisdom, fortitude, invention, fancy, &c. [and] its feelings and affections, as love, joy, hope, gratitude, purity, fidelity, innocence, &c. In the observation or belief of these qualities of mind, we are formed, by the original and moral constitution of our nature, to experience various and powerful emotions. (Alison 1811, 418)

Just how material qualities come to be associated, and hence to signify, such qualities of mind is a topic Alison considers in great detail, devoting separate and sometimes lengthy chapters to the sublimity and beauty of sounds (Alison 1811, 113–163), of colors (Alison 1811, 163–176), of forms (Alison 1811, 176–310), of motion (Alison 1811, 310–315), and of the human countenance and form (Alison 1811, 315–417).

Of course the doctrine that the beauty of matter derives from the beauty of mind is not new to Alison, who acknowledges a particular debt to Reid:

The opinion I have now stated coincides, in a great degree, with a DOCTRINE that appears very early to have been distinguished the PLATONIC school; … which has been maintained in this country, by several writers of eminence—by Lord Shaftesbury, Dr. Hutcheson, Dr. Akenside, and Dr. Spence, but which has no where so firmly and so philosophically been maintained as by Dr. Reid in his invaluable work ON THE INTELLECTUAL POWERS OF MAN. The doctrine to which I allude, is, that matter is not beautiful in itself, but derives its beauty from the expression of MIND. (Alison 1811, 418)

What is perhaps new, at least to eighteenth-century Britain, is Alison’s thorough uncoupling of this Platonic doctrine from that of internal sense.

Alison’s theory of taste, perhaps more than any other here considered, is apt to strike the present-day aesthetician as alien to her concerns. But it is perhaps not so alien. Alison differs from his present-day counterpart by defining the qualities she now terms “aesthetic” according to the distinctive emotions he takes each to produce. Hence many of Alison’s claims about the emotions of beauty and sublimity and about the simple emotions on which these depend can be translated into claims about aesthetic qualities. Consider, for example, the claim—central and distinctive to Alison’s theory—that the emotions of beauty and sublimity depend on simple emotions such as delicacy, grace, dignity, and majesty. Surely it is a precursor to present-day claims about the dependence—e.g., the supervenience—of comparatively evaluative aesthetic qualities on comparatively descriptive aesthetic qualities.


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James Shelley <shelljr@auburn.edu>

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