Antonio Rosmini (1797–1855), Italian priest, philosopher, theologian and patriot, and founder of a religious congregation, aimed principally in his philosophical work at re-addressing the balance between reason and religion which had largely been lost as a result of the Enlightenment. To this purpose, he absorbed the tradition of philosophia perennis, read extensively the works of post-Renaissance philosophers, and developed his own views on philosophical fundamentals and many of their applications. Best known in Italy, but a controversial figure there during his life and for a century or more after his death, his philosophical work, centred upon the notion of being and the dignity of the human person, can be summarised under the headings: aims and method, the objectivity of thought and the concept of certainty; the dignity of the human person; morality; human rights; the nature of human society; natural theology; and being. The following article will examine Rosmini’s work under these titles, which are of perennial relevance and broad enough to embrace more particular themes, such as art, politics, education and marriage, which form a constant preoccupation of many of his lesser works, but can only be mentioned in passing here. His theological principles, other than those pertaining to natural theology, are considered only in so far as they throw light on the origin and development of his philosophical tenets.
- 1. Life and Works
- 2. Aim and Method
- 3. The Objectivity of Thought and the Concept of Certainty
- 4. The Dignity of the Human Person
- 5. Morality
- 6. Human Rights
- 7. The Nature and Purpose of Society
- 8. Natural theology
- 9. Being
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1. Life and Works
Rosmini was born in 1797 at Rovereto, Italy, a staunchly Italian-speaking town, but at the time part of the Austro-Hungarian Empire and ruled from Vienna. The Rosmini family, citizens of Rovereto for several centuries, had become rich through the manufacture of silk, and enjoyed the way of life proper to the lesser aristocracy. Antonio’s primary and secondary education was, however, catered for at the public school, and through his own intensive reading. Tertiary education was completed at the University of Padua. After ordination to the priesthood in 1821, Rosmini studied and wrote at Rovereto until 1826, and from 1826–28 at Milan. Despite his instinctive distaste for the excesses of the French Revolution, which inevitably played a large part in the cultural formation of persons growing to maturity in the first quarter of the 19th century, Rosmini was not afraid to take a stand against State interference in religious affairs. His Panegyric for Pius VII (1823) was considerably censored by the Austrian-Hungarian government and published only in 1831. By this time, Rosmini had founded his religious order (1828), and published at Rome his fundamental philosophical work, A New Essay concerning the Origin of Ideas (1830). As the title suggests, this was intended to supersede Locke’s famous Essay concerning Human Understanding. From then on, a torrent of philosophical and theological works poured out until his death at Stresa. From 1836 until 1855, Rosmini was involved in constant controversy. The approbation of his religious order (1836–38), his work on conscience (1840), theological disputes (1843–48) and his participation in the political events of 1848, occasioned strong debate which led in 1849 to the inclusion of two of his works, The Five Wounds of Holy Church and the Civil Constitution according to Social Justice, in the Index of Prohibited Books. Strengthened by this, Rosmini’s theological and political opponents pressed for an examination of all his works which led, however, to his exoneration (1854), a year before his death at Stresa in northern Italy (1855). Condemnation came posthumously (1888–9) when forty propositions, taken mostly from books published after his death, were included in the decree Post Obitum of Leo XIII. A remarkable swing in ecclesiastical opinion took place in 2001 when a Vatican Note stated: ‘The motives for preoccupation and for doctrinal and prudential difficulties which determined the promulgation of the decree Post Obitum condemning the “Forty Propositions” drawn from the works of Antonio Rosmini can now be considered as surmounted’ (CDF, Osservatore Romano, 1 July 2001).
2. Aim and Method
Rosmini describes his aim and method at some length in his On the Studies of the Author. He sets out to combat error, to systematise the truth, to present a philosophy that can serve as a basis for the various branches of knowledge, and to offer philosophy as an aid to theology. To achieve this, he upholds freedom to philosophise, and sets out to reconcile, whenever possible, apparently contrasting views. His intention throughout is to present an image of knowledge as one, simple and indivisible.
2.1 Combating error
No one, he maintains, would err for the sake of erring. Philosophical tradition in particular provides an object lesson in the movement towards truth, and the elimination of error. Nevertheless, the path forward is not pursued without error because the movement towards higher levels of reflection takes place unevenly. Responses to questions at level A are no longer adequate in form to resolve questions at level B, which inevitably take on new aspects through their application to new circumstances. The role of the philosopher is to distinguish the form of difficulties, which may vary from age to age or generation to generation, and to formulate questions in such a way that it is possible to see both their historical antecedents and the underlying principles to be employed in solving them. The process, however, will never be complete. The same principles will always cry out for application to new cases, and the same struggle to avoid error will ensue.
2.2 Systematising the truth
The negative task of combating error is not, however, sufficient. What is needed in addition, says Rosmini, is a ‘system of truth’, that is, a system which shows clearly how the passage is made from the most general, self-evident principles to more particular levels of knowledge. Knowledge-wise, we move instinctively from the more general to the particular. A mother does not begin by naming roses, carnation and other species for her children; she first indicates them all as ‘flowers’ before calling them by their particular names. So ‘being’, which is the most general of all notions, is the fundamental principle of human knowledge which draws together every aspect of being. When ‘being’ is seen as the supreme principle of unity on which all knowledge depends, truth—‘being as known’—has been systematised and is seen in all its beauty. Since, however, the full application of being is never seen once and for all, it is better to ensure adherence to principle than to grasp at unconnected facts which serve at best as a ragbag of erudition—better to grasp the principle of the wheel, for example, than to know only a number of its applications.
2.3 Philosophy as a basis for the various branches of knowledge
Philosophy as ‘the study of the final reasons’ is thus central to Rosmini’s understanding. For him, the Enlightenment, with its sensistic, subjectivist attitude and devotion to the act of reasoning, rather than to the light of reason, degenerates inevitably into a hotchpotch of negation and ignorance, leading to radical corruption in ethics, and every other branch of philosophical endeavour.
2.4 Philosophy as an aid to theology
The fragmentation of philosophy and its consequent separation from theology is, according to Rosmini, a necessary consequence of sensationalist thinking. There can be no place for revealed doctrine to be expounded as true science unless certain truths are already demonstrated, in the logical order at least, by philosophical reason. On the other hand, theology itself often cannot make progress unless it is prepared to turn to philosophy for assistance. The notions of body, of person and of many other matters essential to theology, cannot be adequately expressed in isolation from philosophical teaching. In its turn, according to Rosmini, divine revelation does not cancel, but completes and ennobles reason, especially by drawing its attention to problems such as the relationship between person and nature which would otherwise escape its attention.
2.5 Freedom to Philosophise
Error, the antithesis of knowledge, is the only intellectual impediment to free, philosophical thought. From this principle, Rosmini concludes that assent to erroneous prejudices, not assent to prejudice as such, is the principal obstacle to be overcome by philosophers. Their work consists in examining preconceptions and determining their truth in order to provide grounds for rational persuasion about what they know. To maintain, as many do, that the possession of some unproven truth is inimical to philosophical thought is tantamount to requiring nil knowledge in the prospective philosopher. Rather, a person who knows something, but has not yet come to grips with the reasons leading to it, is like a person who knows the answer to a problem, but still has to consider the reason for the answer. In this case, freedom is not constrained. The point at issue, therefore, in the case of religion, is not that Christians, or Buddhists, or Muslims, or any other religious persons, are necessarily hampered by their beliefs, but whether these beliefs are true, and to what extent they are true. It is not sufficient to state simply that only persons who are devoid of any belief are capable of philosophising freely. Rather
total freedom is a necessary condition of the truth of faith. If faith were considered divine although in conflict with reason, it would impose an impossible obligation and totally inhibit our reasoning activity. We would be unable to give our assent to either reason or faith, and would thus remain deprived of truth (IP 39 [All numbers in references to Rosmini’s works are to paragraphs, not to pages]).
It is not the case, Rosmini would affirm, that only non-believers have the capacity to enter the world of philosophical enquiry.
2.6 Reconciliation of Conclusions
According to Rosmini, eclecticism, especially that upheld by Victor Cousin, is not the way to promote reconciliation between conclusions. Philosophical systems are not brought together as a result of arbitrary choice between what they offer. Each system, if it is truly such, will have a principle from which deductions are made, and will be able to be reconciled, despite accidental differences, with every other system sharing the same principle. On the other hand, systems will not be reconcilable, despite their accidental agreement, if their basic principles differ. In the former case, agreement will be possible by working back to the principle, and setting out once more from there; in the second case, apparent agreement will only be skin-deep. Only shared principles allow for effective reconciliation between systems.
3. The Objectivity of Thought and the Concept of Certainty
Rosmini sets out to establish the nature of thought and certainty in his A New Essay concerning the Origin of Ideas. Faced by the critical philosophy of Kant on the one hand, and by British empiricism on the other, Rosmini reaches back to the pre-Socratics, to Plato and Aristotle, to Augustine, Thomas Aquinas and Bonaventure, in an endeavour to establish the nature of thought and the basis of certainty in human existence. As his guiding principles he takes the following rules:
In explaining facts connected with the human spirit, we must not make fewer assumptions than are required to explain them... [nor must we] make more assumptions than are needed to explain the facts (NE, vol. 1, 26–7).
With this as his methodological foundation, he places Locke, Condillac, Reid and Dugald Stewart among those whose explanation of the fact of thought is deficient; Plato, Aristotle, Leibniz and Kant are listed amongst those whose explanation is in many ways excessive. In other words, he distinguishes between sensationalists who, according to him, cannot explain the origin of ideas, and idealists who posit in their explanation more ideas or forms than are necessary. For him, however, human thought must depend upon the innate idea of being, without which nothing is intelligible. We cannot think of what is not. At the same time, nothing more is needed than the single idea of being, and its possible determinations, brought about through sensation, to explain all intellectual principles and the ramifications of thought.
After observing the fact of thought, Rosmini concludes that its absolute basis, without which nothing is thought and thought is nothing, must be the knowledge of being. Reflection can remove everything from thought, and still leave it embryonically sound provided the mind is granted the idea of being as its governing light. This idea, which possesses the divine attributes of universality, infinity, necessity and possibility, is not God himself but merely the possibility of things. Moreover, it acts in the mind, but without becoming a subjective part of the mind. As intellectual light, it illuminates, but from outside the mind. And it illuminates without revealing its source, as natural light can be seen without our looking at the sun. It is, as Dante would say, ‘the light connecting intellect and truth’ (Purgatorio 6: 45) and, as such, is the quasi-form of the intellect and the image of truth. Determinations of this idea, all of which possess in some way the characteristics of being, especially its objectivity, are provided through sensations experienced in the animal part of human existence and illuminated, being-wise, through the innate idea in which they are seen. Of themselves, sensations do not constitute knowledge but, when felt in the human subject, provide the matter of knowledge which determines the idea of being, that is, the form of knowledge. Knowledge consists first in the intuition of being, the universal, and then in a subsequent series of judgments, or direct perceptions, through which knowing subjects affirm the actual existence of what they have experienced sensationally. These direct perceptions cannot err, although reflection upon them, and a subsequent series of judgments, may be the source of error. In a word, Rosmini holds that basic knowledge, consisting of the idea of being and its immediate determinations, provides all that is needed for objective thought. Against idealists, he reduces the formal requirements of thought to the intuition of being; against sensationalists, he maintains the per se inadequacy of the senses to provide more than the matter of thought.
Objectivity, therefore, is essentially a characteristic of what is known. Certainty, in Rosmini’s view, is a characteristic of the person who knows, and can be defined as ‘a firm and reasonable persuasion that conforms to the truth’ (NE, vol. 3, 1044). In other words, we can be certain only of knowledge, not of error, and this because, according to Rosmini, to know and to know the truth is the same thing. The person who does not know the truth, does not know. There is no doubt, of course, that it is possible to be persuaded, and firmly persuaded, of error. But rational persuasion of error arrived at through one’s own reasoning is not possible. In this case, either the premiss is wrong, or the argument is erroneous. On the other hand, the persuasion must be firm. Certainty is not achieved without energy directed into persuasion. Certainty requires that we know something to be true, to be what it is, that we are persuaded that it is what we know it to be, and that we have an adequate reason for our persuasion. And precisely because error attempts to alter the being of things, formal error will not be found rooted in the intellect nor in the senses nor in involuntary reflection. It begins with the will, the only human faculty capable of drawing the reason to invent what it does not see, or to deny what it sees. Under pressure from the will, reason will falsely affirm that being is not, or deny that being is.
4. The Dignity of the Human Person
It is already clear from what has been said that Rosmini, in his solution to the basic problem of knowledge, has offered a perspective which places human dignity on a transcendent level. Human beings are made such, he would maintain, by the intuition of being which accompanies them from the first moment of their existence. Through this intuition, they share in the finality of being itself and in some finite way participate in its infinite characteristics. Nevertheless, the subjective element proper to the human being neither can nor should be denied. Indeed, it has to be examined thoroughly if a rational account is to be rendered of the essential unitary make-up of human nature. This examination was carried out initially in Rosmini’s A New Essay concerning the Origin of Ideas as part of his explanation of what he called ‘impure’ ideas, that is, ideas which, as perceptive (not simply intellective), require for their origin some sense experience. He pursued the investigation in his Anthropology as an Aid to Moral Science and in Psychology where in four volumes entitled The Essence of the Human Soul, The Development of the Human Soul, Laws of Animality and Opinions about the Human Soul, he observed and discussed at length the animal, as well as the intellectual side of human nature.
The first fact presented by observation on ourselves is the essential distinction in human beings between that which feels and that which is felt. According to Rosmini, these are quite different and unconfusible elements with opposite characteristics. That which feels is an immaterial principle (soul); that which is felt is the term (body) of this principle. Together feeler and felt constitute feeling, the underlying subject of reflection when attention is concentrated on ‘myself’ and those elements which constitute ‘myself’. The chief action of body is to produce an undetermined, shapeless extension which enables that which feels to experience determined sensations of various kinds. This ‘fundamental feeling’, with its permanent perception of unlimited space, is that in which all other feelings are perceived, and runs parallel, as it were, with the idea of being in which all other ideas are intuited. Reaction to perceived feelings constitutes vital instinct (relative to the fundamental feeling) and sensuous instinct (relative to the adventitious sensations). All feeling and instinct is per se unknown in Rosmini’s view, and comes to be known through the formation in the knowing subject of ideas and perceptions which depend upon the illumination provided by the idea of being. Thus, for Rosmini, the human being is a knowing and feeling subject, having within itself a principle which, formed by the light of being, knows and reacts to what it knows through the faculties of intellect and will, and feels and reacts to what it feels through the faculties of sense and instinct. Within the human subject, the will - which reacts to what is known—is the supreme active principle and as such constitutes ‘person’ in the individual. The dignity of the human being lies within the will as such, in the first place, and then within the will’s choice to second whatever the intellect knows. This is also the foundation of genuine freedom within the human subject. Free to adhere to or reject what is known, human beings cannot be coerced by attempted external pressure or used as a means by others without prejudice to the inviolable truth in which they share innately through their participation in the light of being and which they attain adventitiously through the direct perception that unfolds determined truths to their intellectual gaze.
Rosmini’s ethical philosophy springs directly from the analysis summarised in the previous section. For him, ‘the human being is a knowing and feeling subject whose will, as supreme principle of activity, provides the basis of the incommunicable individuality that constitutes each real human nature as a person’ (Life, p. 26). ‘Person’, as supreme principle, is also the subject of moral activity, and is to be distinguished from all those habits and acts within human beings which take place without the necessary intervention of the person or, at most, effect the person indirectly. For example, a good pianist is not necessarily a good person. Morality deals necessarily with what people do as persons, with what affects themselves as subjects who cannot step aside from the truth they know without violating their adherence to truth. Rosmini deals with ethics, the science of morality, in his Principles of Ethics and in Comparative and Critical History of Systems dealing with the Principle of Morality. The History first offers an overview of systems which throughout history deny morality, or make it impossible, or provide it with a subjective foundation. It then moves on to summarise the objective view expressed by philosophers and developed by Rosmini in Principles of Ethics .
5.1 Moral Obligation
This view, as stated by Rosmini, depends upon what he sees as a self-evident principle that cannot be denied by any sane person. We are bound, he says, to acknowledge (recognise) what we know for what we know it to be. Granted that knowledge, according to Rosmini, is co-terminus with truth, never with error, it is clear that Rosmini’s affirmation depends upon the self-evident need to affirm what one knows. This, in turn, is an act by which the human subject is elevated, at a reflective level, to the level of the truth which, already known in the essential idea of being, is as sublime as being itself. On the other hand, to deny what one knows is equivalent to stepping into non-being, the antithesis of dignity. In more philosophical terms, Rosmini maintains that the principle he enunciates, in which every other moral dictate is implicitly included, may be characterised as follows: it expresses moral essence because it calls for agreement between the intellective act of the will and the ideal and real entities of things known; it is simple and as such able to be participated by every moral activity; it is evident because it is nothing more than an expression of the principle of contradiction; it is universal because all moral effects, denoted through external actions, depend upon it; it is supreme because it offers no possibility of further investigation; it provides the foundation for the recognition of the human subject as an essentially moral being, that is, one who, through the innate presence of the idea of being and the principle of will, is furnished with the object of morality and essential adherence to it. Finally, Rosmini’s distinction between the subject and object of morality opens a way, according to him, between the extremes of ethical theory. On the one hand, the limitation of the human subject provides for the possibility of moral error; on the other, the necessity and immutability of the object, the idea of being, furnish morality with its undeniable sense of obligation. It is a fatal but all too frequent mistake, Rosmini contends, to attribute characteristics proper to the subject (fallibility, error, and so on) to the object, and characteristics of the object (necessity, immutability and so on) to the subject.
5.2 Moral Good
A way is now present to describe adequately the nature of moral good as opposed to eudemonological good. That which is good is desirable, but what is desirable may either be desirable in itself, that is, as it stands in the order of being, or simply desirable in so far it is good, or imagined as good, for the individual. Moral good, says Rosmini, is found when the will adheres to what is good according to the order of being; eudemonological or utilitarian good is what is desired as good for the individual, without reference to what is good in itself. Human dignity is preserved only when, through an act of will, individuals adhering in practice to beings as they are in their order, implicitly adhere to the whole of being and to their presence in that order. Immorality, by which entities are appreciated or desired but not in their known order and thus not as they are, implies an essential rebellion against the order of being and thus against being itself. Self-imposed human indignity can go no lower than this.
Having dealt with the nature of morality and moral obligation, Rosmini turns his attention to conscience. He himself admits that such a treatise is almost universally neglected by philosophers, and feels himself constrained to justify such a study, which he undertakes with an almost inevitable admixture of religious and theological elements. Nevertheless, it is not difficult to filter the philosophical principles in his work from characteristics proper to the faith he professes. This is especially apparent in his approach to the nature of conscience, an area in which his views first prompted the dissension’s between him and some of his co-religionists that would go on until the end of his life. Rosmini defines conscience as a ‘speculative judgement that a person makes about the morality of his practical judgement’ (C19), that is, a judgement by which individuals come to know the moral value of their actions without necessarily acting upon it.
Several consequences can be drawn from this. First, morality in the individual is prior to conscience, and can be present without conscience; second, conscience can be mistaken (it is possible to form a incorrect notion of the moral value of one’s own action); third, it does not follow that conscience, once formed, will give rise to action in the person who forms it; fourth, conscience, if incorrect in its judgement, must as far as possible be reformed. Conscience, therefore, is only an adequate guide to morality when it provides accurate information of the moral state of a subject’s past, present or future action. In the light of these affirmations, it is possible to see how Rosmini lays the groundwork for overcoming the dilemma posed by the question: must conscience always be followed? While it is certain that the dictates of conscience can never be morally disregarded, it is equally certain that a deliberately misleading act of conscience cannot morally be followed. Sometimes, therefore, it will be morally imperative to correct conscience, which is always possible through proper reflection on the moral value of the human act posited or about to be posited by the individual. Rosmini goes on to distinguish between problems about conscience and problems connected with the formation of conscience. In fact, conscience, according to him, is not present as long as judgement is suspended about the moral value of an individual’s own action. Difficulties at this point are connected with the formation of the judgement, not with the judgement itself.
6. Human Rights
Rosmini’s view of ‘person’, seen as an inviolable end which can never be reduced to the status of ‘means’, leads spontaneously to what today is seen as paramount in human existence, that is, the question of human rights. These rights are studied at length in The Philosophy of Right, a six-volume treatise in the only extant English translation. The general title of the work shows immediately that for Rosmini all rights are founded in a single element called ‘right’ from which all ‘rights’ emanate, some innate in human beings, others springing from the determined circumstances of individuals or societies. The treatise can be summed up under three heads: the essence of right, individual rights, social rights.
6.1 The Essence of Right
The basis of Rosmini’s teaching on human rights is a consequence of his moral theory, of which he gives a careful synthesis in a preface to The Philosophy of Right. If each person is morally obliged to recognise in practice what is known for what it is known to be, every other human being will be recognised as essentially on a par with the knowing person, and will have to be acknowledged as such. But because each person is obliged to act in accordance with moral propriety, every person is obliged to respect this obligation in the other on pain of violating the moral law itself. Granted this principle as foundation, and ‘right’ as a relationship between one person and others by which a person has a claim to what is his own, Rosmini maintains that ‘person’ is subsistent right. In other words, all rights are founded on that to which persons have a claim in so far as they are acting morally or are at least not acting immorally. Such activity cannot be the object of attack on the part of others without violation of persons as ends. ‘Right’, as he says, ‘is a moral governance or authority to act, or: right is a faculty to do what we please, protected by the moral law which obliges others to respect that faculty’ (ER, vol. 1, 237).
The essence of right is, therefore, the activity of a person or persons relative to other persons. This activity, however, can be exercised either by individuals or by persons acting as members of a society.
6.2 Rights of individuals
When a person’s activity is actuated in a moral way, the object of that activity becomes the person’s own, that is, becomes proper to the person in such a way that it cannot be violated without damage to the person in whose ownership it is. Practical experience of this is found in what Rosmini calls ‘jural resentment’, the injured feeling that occurs on the occasion of violation of some right and gives rise to an instinct for repossession or restitution. Such an experience is obviously not a fact related solely to matter; it is fundamentally a fact of the spirit where alone it can be felt. It is also an indication of the sphere of jural freedom within which a person is and must be left free. More importantly, ‘person’ does not possess right, but—because formed by the light of being—is right itself; does not possess freedom, but is freedom. The divisions of activity give rise to two major kinds of rights in people. If what is possessed is such from the very beginning of existence in a human being (life, for example), the individual possesses innate right(s) which may be called ‘natural’ (pertaining essentially to human nature) or ‘rational’ (the rights are what they are and cannot be otherwise). But rights may also be acquired by human beings during the course of life through adventitious activity. When rights have been established in this way, they too are inviolable although there are circumstances, such as lack of use, which dissolve the relationship of ownership and thus leave the field open to others who may wish to extend their activity to the matter in question. Leaving these circumstances aside, however, individual rights cannot be absorbed by others. The State, for example, cannot absorb the inalienable rights proper to persons, nor can it be considered as more than its individual members in such a way that persons can be sacrificed for the sake of society.
6.3 Social right
Nevertheless, societies exist within which rights arise from the bonds between intellectual beings. According to Rosmini, these societies fall under three headings: theocratic society, that is, society between God and his creatures; domestic society, which is divided into conjugal and parental society; and civil society, that is, the communion desired by several families who wish to entrust the preservation and the regulation of their rights to a single or collective mind called ‘government’. Rosmini considers at some length the rights arising in these societies. In particular, he ponders the title of rights possessed by the Creator over human beings, the rights proper to husband and wife, and to parents. Of special interest is his description of the State as a society which, while it has the duty to influence for the common good only the modality and exercise of rights in its citizens, has no power to create or destroy human rights. In fact, the general purpose of the State is to arrange the exercise of individual rights in such a way that individuals are better able to enjoy the use of their innate and acquired rights. Thus, although in time of war the exercise of certain rights may be curtailed or even suspended, the rights remain invested in individuals to whose exercise they must be restored in normal circumstances. It is clear that Rosmini’s view of civil society is completely anti-totalitarian. He does not, however, espouse the cause of modern democracy According to him, the principle of democracy is not ‘one person, one vote’, but would depend rather upon the contribution made by citizens to the well-being of the State. Difficult to arrange in practice, the principle is nevertheless important, and can be considered the obverse of ‘No taxation without representation’.
7. The Nature and Purpose of Society
It is clear that Rosmini’s view of rights in human society depends to a great extent on his views about the nature of society as such. In fact, his earliest work as a philosopher (1818–1826) was almost totally taken up with a study of society, and was only abandoned when he saw that his ideas would lack a solid foundation unless the problem of knowledge had first been confronted. Eventually (1837), he published his ideas on society in The Philosophy of Politics in which he deals with the principle according to which societies stand or fall, and the end to which societies are directed. . However, despite the universality of the principles examined in this work, their application is restricted to civil society. According to Rosmini, the first rule and criterion for governing any society whatsoever is this: That which constitutes the existence or substance of a society is to be preserved and strengthened even at the cost of neglect to accidental refinement. This is also the first rule of politics. It follows that the greatest errors of government are those by which the government of a society, because of its excessive concern for the society’s accidental progress, loses sight of that which constitutes the substance of the society. The steps taken towards decline, that is, towards the substitution of essential matters by accidental, can be considered on four levels: the periods of founders of societies and basic legislation; of genuine development; of external splendour; of frivolity. Beginning from the first stage, when attention is inevitably fixed on the nature itself of a society, there is a gradual diminution of interest in underlying societal values until weakness, manifested in attention to frivolities and inability to concentrate on weightier matters, undermines the society’s inner cohesion and its ability to withstand external inimical pressures. This would explain the profound truth lying behind Machiavelli’s observation: ‘If a sect or republic is to survive for any length of time, it must return frequently to its beginning’ (quoted in PP, vol. 1, 41)
For Rosmini, every society is simply the union of two or more people undertaken with the intention of obtaining a common advantage. ‘All the persons in this union [forming a society] together have the role of end, and the advantage expected from the association is applied equally to all (PP, vol. 2, 39). In other words, there must be in every society a moral element, an element of justice, which affects the behaviour of the members towards one another, even if collectively (as in Plato’s case of a band of robbers) they are unjust towards non-members. Hence the excellence of what Rosmini calls ‘the social bond’; where it is present and actuated, there is no injustice; injustice begins in its absence. In other words, the nature of society requires that those who form it, enjoy within it the personal dignity of end. There is, therefore, a moral element inherent in every society. Using some persons, some members, as means, even for the apparent good of the whole, is repugnant to the very nature of society. In a coherent universal society, such as that described by Cicero—‘This entire world is to be considered simply as a city common to both gods and human beings’ (quoted in PP, vol. 2, 49)—there will inevitably be a tendency to maximum justice. This means, however, that no one in any society can make one person subservient to another. All that is pertinent only to nature can be used as means; all that which is proper to person, or to which persons have extended themselves so that some thing or things have become proper to them, must be respected as end. Here again, though, a distinction must be made between that is proper to a member of a society as a person, and the modality of that which is proper. In certain cases, the government of a society may change the modality of what is proper if this is for the common good. A piece of land required for a road may, for instance, be substituted with an adequate sum of money. But those things which have no modality, such as innocent life, cannot be violated under the pretext of common good. It is clear that these principles must direct the government of every society.
Rosmini also deals with the nature of the good which is the aim or end of society. For him, this good is human good which ‘resides in virtue and the eudemonological appurtenances of virtue, and in general in every good in so far as it is connected with virtue.’ He concludes, therefore, that every society, in so far as it is contrary to virtue, is illegitimate because its aim is contrary to the essence of society. At the same time, every law of society is invalid if, or in so far as, it prevents members from achieving virtue. ‘Without virtue there is no human good, the end for which society is established’ (PP, vol. 2, 189). But while anti-virtue is essentially detrimental to the good of any society, virtue of itself is not the only element forming the good in question. Contentment of spirit, that is, of the whole person, as distinct from passing pleasure confined to parts of human nature, is also included in every society’s essential aim. Anything, therefore, opposed to contentment is inevitably detrimental to society, whatever favour it may have found in public opinion. Rosmini finds support for this affirmation in Hamilton, whom he quotes approvingly (PP, vol. 2, 195).
When occasions present themselves in which the interests of the people are at variance with their inclinations, it is the duty of the persons whom they have appointed to be the guardians of those interests to withstand the temporary delusion in order to give them time and opportunity for more cool and sedate reflection.
Public opinion, it would seem, is not an infallible criterion of public good.
8. Natural theology
Rosmini’s natural theology, in the conventional philosophical sense of natural theology, can be summarised under two headings: proofs for the existence of God, found scattered throughout his philosophical writings, and theodicy, developed at length in a work of that name. But it will also be considered, under the heading ‘Being’ according to the meaning given it by Rosmini.
8.1 The existence of God
In his natural theology, Rosmini offers considerations which are consistent with the basic principles of his philosophical teaching. Although he does not deny the validity of a posteriori proofs of the existence of God, he affirms that an a priori method is more satisfactory because it sets off from the idea of being, the foundation of his philosophy, and argues to the necessity of God’s existence. First, however, he posits a fundamental barrier to the perception of God at a purely natural level of human nature. For Rosmini, what is real can only be perceived through feeling, which indeed is part of human existence but only at a finite level where it cannot be the vehicle of the perception of God’s infinite reality. Ideal being, however, while expressing only the possibility, not the reality of things, is shown on analysis to be characterised by necessity, eternity and immateriality, factors which are intrinsic marks of possibility. The idea of being, therefore, with its divine characteristics serves as a bridge between God and human beings, enabling us to posit proofs of God’s existence without our knowing him through perception, or real contact. One example of the a priori proofs may be given here. If infinite, intelligible being is present to the human mind—and Rosmini would maintain that it is—an infinite mind capable of giving this idea to humans must exist. But such a mind cannot not be God. In this and all similar proofs, there is a common mode of procedure. The existence of God is necessary for the existence of intelligible being; but intelligible being certainly exists; the existence of God is therefore necessary. Having determined the existence of God, Rosmini then makes use of divinely revealed truth as a basis on which to offer some reflections about the nature of what he has proved to exist. These reflections, he would maintain, lie within the scope of philosophy because they depend methodologically solely on reason, and conclude with rational, not authoritative affirmations. Their basis in revelation, however, precludes any examination of them here.
Rosmini provides an exact description of his aim in his work on theodicy. ‘Theodicy (theou dike) means “justice of God”. The intent of this work, therefore, is simply this: to justify God’s equity and goodness in the distribution of good and evil in the world.’ (Theodicy preface).
He also provides a clear indication of the method he will follow in the three books composing his Theodicy. The first prescribes the norms to be followed in judging about the disposition of divine providence if error is to be avoided; the second considers the laws of nature, the necessary limitations of what is created and the chain of causes operating in the universe; the third is devoted to the laws according to which God’s action takes place in the world he has created. These laws all spring from a single norm, the law of the least means, which Rosmini, following Aquinas, posits as follows: ‘The wise worker carries out his work in the briefest way possible’ (Sapiens operator perficit opus suum breviori via qua potest. ST, III, q. 4, art. 5, ad 3um). From this law, another ten are deduced whose titles provide a useful indication of their possible application. They are the laws of: excluded superfluity, the permission of evil, excluded equality, unity in the divine work, heroism, antagonism, rapidity in work, accumulation of good, and germ. These laws, according to Rosmini, are concerned with God’s providence relative to universal good. At the same time, but relative to particular good, the law followed is that of: supreme justice, equity, fittingness and conformity to God’s divine attributes. Divine governance consists in acting in such a way that the aspects of universal and particular good are harmonised.
The last nine years of Rosmini’s life, with the exception of 1848–9 when he was actively engaged in political affairs, were spent in great part working on his Theosophy (Teosofia). Despite its size (five volumes), this monumental work remained unfinished at Rosmini’s death and was published posthumously. The title itself, despite its obvious etymological implications, is today unhelpful. It would seem to indicate a philosophy ‘professing to achieve a knowledge of God by spiritual ecstasy, direct intuition or special individual relations’ (COD). Rosmini, however, is concerned here only with reasoning about God, and takes the word ‘theosophy’ in its fundamental meaning of ‘wisdom about God’ in so far as God is the supreme Being and the apex of philosophical speculation. Such speculation must sooner or later deal with the problem of the One Being and many beings, with unity and plurality in all their manifestations. In many ways, the book is a direct challenge to Hegel and Schelling with whose philosophy Rosmini had become thoroughly familiar as a result of the great editions of their works published in the 1830s and early 1840s. Kant’s teaching, already challenged in Rosmini’s A New Essay concerning the Origin of Ideas, was now to be opposed in what Rosmini perceived as the delirium and exaggerations of Kant’s Idealist successors.
Whenever we try to reduce the whole human being to speculation, and substitute the part for the whole, we presume that all human good must lie solely in speculation. As result, we make every effort to turn what is real into an idea; we try to derive from the idea the matter which constitutes the sensible world, together with the Spirit and finally God himself… But although Schelling and Hegel claimed that they had reached such total science, they still needed to teach it publicly not only for the sake of attaining the practice of virtue (which would make it worthwhile), but even to draw a salary. This proves without doubt that their absolute idea did not contain everything. If the world were present in it, as they said it was, wheat, bread and wine would have been there also. My theosophy certainly cannot give the public such magnificent and wonderful promises, but it will explain how the speculative human mind is inclined to find everything in itself. In other words, it will demonstrate that there must be an object which contains effectively within itself the universality of things, and that this object is not the idea in our mind. Nevertheless, the idea which shines in the human mind draws its form as object from that object. Hence, because the idea also is per se object, we easily confuse it, in our speculation, with the complete, subsistent object. A strong desire then arises in us of attributing to the idea which we intuit the attributes of the subsistent object which we know must exist, although we do not intuit it. The tendency to unity, an essential element of every intellect, causes this error and forces us towards an abyss of unseen absurdities in the hope that these will satisfy our desperate purpose. We should acknowledge (and this theosophy will demonstrate) that if being itself has an objective existence, it is per se intelligible, and that if it contains everything (that which is not being is nothing), everything must also be contained in that which is intelligible. Theosophy will also clearly show that, although being must actually have this primal form, human nature cannot intuit the intelligible which contains all. Human nature arrives at this solely by reasoning, which can provide only a formal, negative concept of it. We cannot therefore have either the absolute knowledge which Schelling attributes to us through direct intuition, or the absolute idea which his disciple, George Hegel (who was opposed to all immediacy), promised us by mediate reasoning… (TH, vol. 1, Preface, 9–10)
But the main thrust of the work is positive, rather than critical.
Theosophy will not be wasting time by demonstrating that behind this well-conceived and ingenious error [of Hegel] lies a great truth which those courageous speculative minds [Schelling and Hegel] tried in vain to grasp but could not. This truth is precisely the necessity I spoke of: there must be ‘something intelligible and eternal which contains everything’... Nevertheless, although absolute knowledge is proper to God but not to us, we do have an absolute knowledge relative to form, but not to matter (cf. NE, vol. 1, 325, 474–476). This kind of absoluteness of human knowledge caused errors in the German school, which I have already discussed. Theosophy must speak at length about absolute human knowledge, indeed it must use it and more importantly be it. Theosophy is simply the Theory of Ens (this definition is not to be despised, despite its being only two words). Because ens is first of all infinite and absolute, and only later enclosed and existing within limits as finite, no thought could attain it unless thought itself somehow became absolute. A thought informed by an object which is in some way absolute, is itself in some way made absolute. Plato therefore rightly called the treatise on what is greatest, the treatise about ens. There is nothing in the universe or in our mind antecedent to ens or being. When, in the order of things, we remove being, nothing remains except darkness in the order of cognition. For this reason the doctrine of ens, which I call ‘theosophy’, corresponds to the concept of philosophy in the ancients. According to them, philosophy differs from other sciences in that all other sciences suppose undemonstrated principles. Philosophy, however, which borrows nothing from anywhere, uses its own materials to construct itself. It starts from no gratuitous hypothesis or supposition—on the contrary, it seeks and establishes what is undemonstrable, which gives it an unshakeable basis, and admits only what is necessary (Ibid., 10–12).
For Rosmini, the problem of being is finally considered under the three divisions of the science of theosophy: ontology, rational theology and cosmology, each of which must enter into the other if the science is to be complete. In fact, he maintains, it is impossible to speak of being in all its universal essence (ontology), without regard to the infinity and absoluteness of Being (rational theology), just as it is impossible to consider the world philosophically (cosmology) without taking its cause into consideration. Each of the three divisions of theosophy is as essential to the whole as, according to his example, the various vital organs are necessary to the existence of an animal. But the centre and substance of the whole treatise is teaching about God, without which there is no final explanation of the being or the world. Theosophy, therefore, is a single science which, through its division into three parts, is both one and three. Such an affirmation is paradigmatic of the thrust of Rosmini’s theosophy which eventually enables him to confront this rational science with the doctrine of the Trinity.
Ontology, according to Rosmini’s description of it, considers being in all its universality, but only as the object of human thought which puts limited, intellectual beings in contact with the possibility of all that is, not with actuality (it is impossible, for instance, to assuage hunger by thinking about a meal). Thought must, therefore, reach out to absolute reality not through direct perception of God, but by means of concepts. Ontology, dealing with these concepts analytically and synthetically is, as it were, an immense preface to rational theology. Ontology as the theory of being in all its possibility is the necessary propedeutic to theology as the theory of absolute being without which ontology itself is inevitably incomplete, and cannot progress beyond a treatise on categories and on dialectic.
9.2 Rational theology
If, as Rosmini suggests, ontology is the ‘theory of abstract being’, rational theology is the ‘theory of subsistent Being’. These two parts of theosophy cannot, however, can be distinguished only if the same universal concepts, of which both are formed, can in some way be differentiated. This is done by considering that ontology serves to find, review, and describe the nature and relationship of these concepts; theology, in Rosmini’s understanding, synthesises them to form a single concept of the infinite Being. It is true that such a concept remains abstract (the essence contained in the concept is not beheld by the knowing subject), but the ‘theologian’ passes from the concept to affirm subsistent Being, which is therefore no longer a mere concept, but something which must exist in itself. An effort is then made in rational theology to see how the ontological concepts have their truth and their foundation in first subsistent Being. While this takes place, the concepts themselves are identified and become one. Their separation, now considered anew, is seen to be relative not to first subsistent Being, but to the beholding, finite mind. The problem of the One and the many is rooted not in the nature of absolute, subsistent Being, but in being by participation.
Ontology, while a preface to rational theology, is also necessary for knowledge of the intimate nature of finite being and the world. Rosmini posits three reasons for this. First, although finite being is perceived, perception is limited to very few beings. If the essential conditions of this being are to be known, it is necessary to know the common conditions of all finite beings. This cannot be done without recourse to universal principles which enable us to deduce what is lacking to limited experience. Second, the same principles are needed to provide a notion of finite beings in themselves, divested of the sensory phenomena that accompany their perception. Third, subsistent Being, if known, would be intelligible per se. This is not the case with finite beings, which are known through their participation in intellectual light, and consequently remain unknown without some relationship to concepts.
References in this article to Rosmini’s works use the following abbreviations:
- A New Essay concerning the Origin of Ideas
- Introduction to Philosophy
- The Philosophy of Right
- The Philosophy of Politics
- Antonio Rosmini: Introduction to his Life and Teaching
- Congregation for the Doctrine of the Faith
- Concise Oxford Dictionary
- Opere edite e inedite di Antonio Rosmini. Rome-Stresa. 1966–. Città Nuova Editrice (80 projected volumes —including 19 of correspondence — of which approximately 40 have been published )
- For a complete list of editions of all Rosmini’s published works in Italian or in translations, cf. Bergamaschi, Cirillo. Bibliografia degli scritti editi di Antonio Rosmini Serbati, 1815–1998, 4 vols., Milan-Stresa, 1970–98.
- Cleary, D., Watson, T., and Murphy, R. (trans.), 2001, A New Essay concerning the Origin of Ideas. 3 vols. Durham: Rosmini House.
- Cleary, D., and Watson, T. (trans.), Durham: Rosmini House.
- Principles of Ethics. 1988.
- Conscience. 1989.
- Anthropology as an Aid to Moral Science. 1991.
- The Philosophy of Politics. 1994.
- vol. 1
- The Summary Cause for the Stability or Downfall of Human Societies.
- vol. 2
- Society and Its Purpose.
- The Philosophy of Right.
- vol. 1
- The Essence of Right. 1993.
- vol. 2
- Rights of the Individual. 1993.
- vol. 3
- Universal Social Right. 1995.
- vol. 4
- Rights in God’s Church. 1995.
- vol. 5
- Rights in the Family. 1995.
- vol. 6
- Rights in Civil Society. 1996.
- Psychology. 1999.
- vol. 1
- Essence of the Human Soul.
- vol. 2
- Development of the Human Soul.
- vol. 3
- Laws of Animality.
- vol. 4
- Opinions about the Human Soul.
- Theosophy. 2007.
- vol. 1
- The Problem of Ontology Being-as-one
- vol. 2
- Trine Being
- vol. 3
- Trine Being Continued
- Grey, M. (trans.), 1887, The ruling Principle of Method applied to Education. Boston.
- Murphy, R. (trans.), 2004, Introduction to Philosophy, Durham, UK: Rosmini House.
- Signini, F. (trans.), 1912, Theodicy. 3 vols. London
- Bergamaschi, Cirillo, 2001, Grande dizionario antologico del pensiero di Antonio Rosmini, (4 vols of explanations of words and phrases from Rosmini’s works in Rosmini’s own words), Rome: Città Nuova Editrice. [CD version available.]
- Bergamaschi, Cirillo, 1967–96, Bibliografia Rosminiana, 8 vols, Milan-Stresa, (covers Rosminian bibliography in all languages from 1814–1995).
- Cleary, Denis, 1992, Antonio Rosmini: Introduction to his Life and Teaching. Durham: Rosmini House.
- Davidson, Thomas, 1882, The Philosophical System of Antonio Rosmini Serbati, London.
- Pozzo, Riccardo, 1999, The Philosophical Works of Antonio Rosmini in Translation in American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, LXXIII no. 4.
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