Arabic and Islamic Philosophy of Religion

First published Wed May 31, 2023

This entry focuses on the historical sources and formative moments in the development of Islamic theology and philosophy of religion. While most of the thinkers and ideas are from the classical period of Islam (ca. 800–1300) in a few cases we have extended our survey to the seventeenth century to include influential post-classical thinkers, like Mulla Ṣadrā. Despite this limitation, the period covered was one of the most intellectually robust periods in the development of Islamic philosophy of religion. While most of the topics covered in this entry are common to philosophy of religion—such as the existence of God, God’s relation to the cosmos, the issue of evil and the like—Muslims and those under the influence of Islam frequently imprinted these issues with their own unique stamp. Such unique moments include the thoroughly developed occasionalism of Muslim theologians, the development by philosophers and theologians of a Necessary Being theology and even framing the problem of evil differently from the one frequently seen among contemporary western philosophers of religion.

1. Faith and Reason

A foundational question in the philosophy of religion concerns the relation between faith and reason. As with perhaps all religions, the spectrum of Muslim responses is broad. Before looking at these responses, it is important to note that ‘reason’ is used in two distinct senses. In one sense, reason refers to the ability, power or faculty by which we understand, judge and explain things. Reason in this sense corresponds with our intellect (ʿaql). In a second sense, reason refers to the philosophical and scientific explanations and theories about the things that the intellect understands, judges and explains. In this sense, reason corresponds with science or philosophy. Analogously, ‘faith’ has at least two meanings. In one sense, it may refer to an epistemic notion and mean to believe or to trust in something, perhaps uncritically (taqlīd), usually based on the authority of some (religious) source. In a second sense, faith may refer to a particular religion, understood as the body of knowledge encompassed in one’s sacred scriptures and religious traditions as in the sense of the ‘Islamic faith’. These different senses of reason and faith in turn give rise to no less than three distinct questions concerning what the relation between faith and reason is:

  1. What role, if any, does the unaided human intellect play in acquiring religious knowledge?
  2. What role, if any, does the intellect play in justifying specific beliefs?
  3. How should one reconcile conflicts between one’s religious belief and the finding of one’s best science or philosophical system?

As one may expect, these questions were raised and debated in the Islamicate world.

1.1 Reason and religious knowledge

The first way that the faith-reason question may be understood involves the extent, if any, to which the unaided human intellect can discover the various claims of a religion, whether theological or ethical. In answer to this question, Muslim philosophers and theologians defended three major positions. One is that unaided human reason is sufficient to reach true knowledge about what can (or needs to) be known about God and our moral duties. A second position is that unaided reason can discover at least the basic claims of a religion, like God exists and is absolutely perfect, but this basic knowledge must be augmented by truths that only a prophet can provide. The third position is that human reason cannot reach the knowledge that religion provides, and so a religious source is required for true knowledge about God and what God demands of us.

A purported representative of the first position is the physician and philosopher Abū Bakr al-Rāzī (865–925; see entry on al-Rāzī). He is reported to have held that human reason is sufficient to understand all that is necessary for a devout life, and thus scripture is at best superfluous and at worse deceptive and a source of dissension (A. H. Rāzī Proofs of Prophecy: 2.1 and 5.1, pp. 24–6 & 131–4). This is an extreme position.[1] At the other extreme some Muslim scholars in general dismissed the use of unaided reason in religious matters. There must be religious authority in the form of a prophet who teaches others what they should know about God and who establishes rules that must be observed in individual and social life. Such a position not only dismissed independent reasoning about one’s religion, but also discouraged metaphorical interpretations of sacred writ. Between these extremes, Muslim philosophers and theologians believed that while there is a place for unaided reason in acquiring certain religious beliefs, a need for scripture is also essential to that understanding, albeit they disagreed about the nature and extent of that need. Let us begin with the position of most of the Muslim philosophers.

Philosophers most generally defended the view that at least individuals of sufficient intellect could independently acquire a knowledge of all the fundamental claims of religion.They maintained that non-philosophers who constitute the majority of people, in contrast, must rely on religious sources. Those sources, however, the philosophers continue, ultimately agree with what can be rationally known, albeit in a way that describes philosophically correct views in metaphors and symbols so as to be accessible to the masses. One may include al-Fārābī (d. 950), Ibn Sīnā (or Avicenna, d. 1037), Ibn Ṭufayl (d. 1185) and Ibn Rushd (or Averroes, d. 1198) among these philosophers.

Fārābī appears to be the originator of the general view of the Muslim philosophers (Fārābī Perfect State: 276–85 & al-Milla & b, ¶¶ 4–6). Humans divided into three classes based on their intellectual capacities. One class is persuaded of divine truths solely on the basis of demonstrative proofs. These proofs produce a belief that is certain and are discovered independent of scripture. The second class is persuaded on the basis of dialectical proofs. These proofs produce a belief that is highly probable, and so scripture is necessary to confirm the true beliefs and correct any false ones. The final and the most numerous class consists of those who are easily persuaded by rhetorical proofs involving images that hold out threats of torment for non-belief and promises of pleasures for belief. Scripture is of most use for this class, for it provides a simplified version of the religious truths necessary for a devout life, but now put into a language that captures the imagination of even the most dull-witted. Thus, Fārābī’s position has two elements:

  1. the truths relevant to religion can be rationally known, and yet
  2. religious authority is also needed, albeit not by all.

Fārābī’s view can be found in Ibn Ṭufayl’s philosophical novel Ḥayy ibn Yaqẓān (HIY, especially 161–5). The novel relates the story of a child raised by a deer on a desert island, and what he was able to learn through unaided reason, and then his subsequent encounter with a religious community. The story concludes with the protagonist resigning himself to the fact that some people do not want to be intellectually challenged. Ibn Rushd also endorses Fārābī’s tripartite division of humanity in his legal treatise, The Decisive Treatise (Ibn Rushd Decisive: 1–12, esp. 8).

Some theologians gave a similar, but different, answer to this question. They asked whether one who is mentally sound and has reached the age of discernment is accountable before God for their religious beliefs and practices, even if they have never heard the message of Islam. Answering this question, the Muʿtazilite theologian, al-Qādī ʿAbd al-Jabbār (d. 1025) and Abū Manṣūr al-Māturīdī (d. 944), the eponymous founder of the Māturīdī school of theology, held that individuals at the age of discernment are responsible in believing, for example, that God exists, that God is just, that God sends messengers, that there is life after death and that one should lead a morally good life (ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 62–8, 122–4, 563–6 and Māturīdī KT: 3–7, 156–62; also see Hourani 1971: 129–39). A common position among later Māturīdī and Ashʿarī theologians slightly modified this view: In addition to the fundamental truths about God and his relation to the world just mentioned, human reason can verify that Muhammad was a genuine prophet. Having verified Muhammad’s prophecy, one now can go on to endorse all the claims revealed in the Qur’an, which is different than merely ‘believing by faith’ (taqlīd) since the acceptance of the Quranic claims are grounded in an initial proof for the veracity of the Qur’an as a revelatory source of knowledge (Nasafī TA: II 12–28; Juwaynī Proofs, 165–7; Ghazālī Moderation, treatises 3–4; also see Frank 1989).

1.2 The role of reason in justifying specific beliefs

The first faith-reason issue concerned the role, if any, of unaided reason in understanding general religious claims. The second issue concerns the role of reason relative to a specific religion and has two parts: (1) the role of reason in having a justified belief in one’s specific religion, like Islam, and (2) the role of reason in interpreting a specific religion’s sacred sources. As one might expect, this second set of issues is closely tied to the first. Consequently, the various responses to the second issue frequently mirror those to the first, albeit with additional nuances.

1.2.1 Reason and justified religious beliefs

Muslim philosophers and Muʿtazilite theologians, might broadly be described as evidentialists. They held that reason, in the form of rational first principles or proofs based upon them, is essential for justified beliefs, even those found in religion, although in nuanced ways. As for the philosophers, only those who have demonstrative proofs of their beliefs are rationally and truly justified in those beliefs. As for non-philosophers, insofar as they accept a ‘true’ religion—i.e., one that the philosopher would accept on the basis of demonstration—and they do so based upon either highly probably opinions or images from sacred texts that symbolically capture truths that philosophers demonstrate, members of these other two classes are likewise justified, to the extent that they can be, in their beliefs.

In addition to knowledge of certain general religious claims, some Muʿtazilite theologians extended this general knowledge to specific credal beliefs (Frank 1978, esp. 124–9). Their strategy was to observe that having come to recognize that God exists and has certain attributes, one should further speculate about what God wants from us. This speculation leads to certain general ethical axioms; however, more importantly, it leads to the belief that such a wise and powerful being would send a messenger, that is, a prophet, to make the divine intentions known. Once one has reached this point, one would be motivated to seek out self-proclaimed prophets and test them. Upon having tested a prophet and identifying them as a true prophet, then anything based upon that prophetic message would also be rationally justified.

Muslim theologians who denied or limited the role of reason were presented with a problem. Muslim philosophers and Muʿtazilite theologians maintained, to varying degrees, something like the following Evidentialist Premise:

One is rationally justified in one’s belief (as opposed to believing out of fear, believing arbitrarily or even because it is absurd) if and only if one has a reason for that belief that appeals to the human intellectual capacity to acquire the truth about the subject of that belief.

The philosophers and certain theologians leveled a challenge against the Ashʿarites, Maturidites and more traditional theologians like Aḥmad Ibn Ḥanbal (d. 855). Since with few exceptions these latter held that reason is limited in its capacity to acquire those truths or even is incapable, these thinkers either cannot be rationally justified in their beliefs or at best they are only partially justified. Moreover, if one holds a belief without some rational justification, it appears as if one holds that belief arbitrarily or even irrationally.

There were varying responses to this challenge. At the core of these responses, often, is simply a denial of (EP). The theologians’ denial, however, is not obviously arbitrary or irrational, as they note, since (EP) assumes that humans have the intellectual capacity to acquire the truth about either general or specific religious beliefs, and yet this issue is the very one at stake. In some cases, these theologians suggested alternative models of justification. For example, Imām al-Ḥaramayn al-Juwaynī (d. 1085) appears to have had a coherentist theory of justification, at least with respect to prophecy (Juwaynī Proofs, 165–7; also see Siddiqui 2019: ch. 4). For Juwaynī, while reason alone is unable to acquire the tenets of Islam, that inability does not make those tenets irrational, in the sense of being contrary to reason; rather, upon hearing the tenets, one determines that they are at least coherent in which case one is justified in believing them.

1.2.2 Reason and interpreting (taʾwīl) religious sources

The second aspect to the question of what role reason plays in justifying specific beliefs concerns hermeneutics, namely, what is the role of reason in interpreting one’s own sacred sources, like the Qur’an and sayings of the prophet Muhammad? Within the context of Islam, the issue is whether a Muslim must take the Qur’an and prophetic traditions at face-value or should use certain interpretative tools, such as metaphorical readings and analogical reasoning, when approaching scripture and prophetic sayings. On one side, there are positions like that of Fārābī. True religious beliefs are the symbolic expressions of the philosophical truths that philosophy and science provide. Hence when there is a divergence between philosophical theories and religious teachings, one should keep in mind that religious texts are not literal expressions of the truth and perhaps more like ‘noble lies’ (Fārābī Perfect State: 276–85). On the other side of this issue, there is the legal theorist Ibn Ḥanbal, who is usually associated with the position that only the Qur’an and the sayings of Muhammad are sufficient and necessary for an intellectually complete understanding of God, the world and our place in it. Moreover, one must simply accept the claims of these sources as literally true, even the most anthropomorphic ones about God and the divine attributes, such as those about the hands of God, God’s speech and that God is seated or established on the Throne. Between these two positions there were a host of intermediate views.

For example, the Ashʿarīte theologian, Abū Ḥāmid al-Ghazālī (d. 1111), made room for a metaphorical interpretation (taʾwīl) of certain passage from the Qur’an and the sayings of the prophets. In particular Ghazālī maintained that literal anthropomorphic descriptions of God, particularly ones ascribing to God a body, had to be rejected and interpreted metaphorically. Thus, in On Moderation of Belief (I, 8), he divides Muslims into the general public and the scholars. The general public should be disabused of any anthropomorphic reading of God in the Qur’an, and if they ask what such verses and sayings mean, they simply should be told it is not theirs to investigate such matter. In contrast, Ghazālī continues, it is suitable for the scholar to pursue and to understand metaphorically Qur’anic passages, such as “The Merciful is seated/established on (istawā ʿalā) the Thrown” (20:5, trans. by authors), which suggest that God has a body or at least is localized in some specific place. For Ghazālī it is unthinkable that the Qur’an could contain contradictions, and yet he believes that he can rationally prove that anything bodily must be subject to temporal becoming, whereas God cannot be subject to temporal becoming. Consequently, for Ghazālī no bodily state can literally be ascribed of God on pain of contradiction and yet again the Qur’an is free of any contradiction. In general, Ghazālī claims that any religious claims that “the intellect judges impossible” (mā qaḍā al-ʿaql bi-istiḥālatihi) must be interpreted metaphorically.

Ironically, the philosopher Ibn Rushd, who was a critic of Ghazālī, shared a similar view. In his legal work the Decisive Treatise (Ibn Rushd Decisive: §III.B), he notes that Islamic religious sources either treat some given subject of a demonstration or they do not. If the religion does not speak to a given subject, the demonstrated conclusion should not be a matter of religious dispute and one is free to hold the position. If the Islamic sources do treat a given subject of demonstration, then the two either agree or disagree. If they agree, then again there should be no religious dispute. If, however, there is a disagreement between the literal sense of the religious sources and the conclusion of a demonstration, then those intellectually capable can apply metaphorical interpretation to reconcile the conflict.

The issue is how to determine which Qur’anic passages and prophetic statements must be taken literally and which ones metaphorically. Ibn Rushd’s view concerning theoretical matters treated in religion, though not in practical and ethical issues, is that there simply is no consensus (ijmāʿ). Muslim scholars, for Ibn Rushd, simply do not universally agree as to which scriptures and traditions must be taken literally and which can be taken metaphorically. Hence, there is no religious basis for precluding metaphorical interpretation of any text or prophetic saying treating theoretical issues whose apparent meaning conflicts with a demonstration. The only obligation on the religious scholar is that he must not share metaphorical interpretations of sacred sources with those who are incapable of grasping a demonstration. The greatest proponent of Islamic philosophical mysticism, Ibn ʿArabī (d. 1240), also shared this inclusive view of scripture’s intended meaning. For him, every word, verse and chapter of the Qur’an have an indefinite number of senses and interpretations, and God intended all of them. Thus, in the Meccan Revelations, he writes,

When a meaning repeats itself for someone who is reciting the Qur’an, he has not recited it as it should be. This is proof of his ignorance. (cited in Chittick 2005: 18 = (Ibn al-ʿArabī al-Futūḥāt
(a), IV, 367.3)

1.3 Conflicts between religious teachings and science/philosophy

The third faith-reason issue involves responses to apparent conflicts between the teachings of one’s specific religion and the purported demonstrated conclusions of one’s best science or philosophical account. At the heart of this issue is the notion of demonstration (burhān). A demonstration proceeds from purportedly absolutely certain, necessary and true first principles from which one validly deduces some conclusion. Since the conclusion validly follows from purportedly absolutely certain, necessary and true premises, the conclusion is likewise absolutely certain, necessary and true (see Fārābī’s account of certainty = MR07: 63–6; also see Black 2006). Since, for the philosophers, the conclusions of demonstration are certain and necessarily true, any claim apparently contradicting a demonstrated conclusion cannot be literally true. Yet, within Islamic authoritative sources there are claims that are at odds with some of the philosophers’ purported demonstrative conclusions. Few Muslim philosophers were willing to say that the Qur’an and the sayings of the prophets are simply false. Instead, many philosophers appealed to their epistemic hierarchy of human intellectual capacities seen above. For them, both Islamic religious sources and demonstrated conclusion at heart express the same truth, although expressed differently depending upon the intended audience.

Even if some theologians recognized the difficulty with taking all religious statements literally, there still was pushback against the philosophers and particularly their unquestioning faith in ‘demonstrative’ conclusions. Thus, several Muslim theologians, like Ghazālī, ʿAbd al-Karīm Shahrastānī (d. 1153) and Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī (d. 1210), to name a few, took it upon themselves to familiarize themselves with the philosophers’ demonstrative method and show that even by the philosophers’ own standards they had not demonstrated their conclusions.

Ghazālī’s Incoherence of the Philosophers (Tahāfut al-falāsifa) provides an excellent example of this approach. There he vigorously criticizes the philosophers’ attempts to demonstrate twenty philosophical-theological theses, arguing that in all cases the proofs fall short of true demonstration. His strategy is to call into question the supposedly self-evident, certain and necessary character of the premises used in the philosophers’ proofs. He does so by arguing that either those premises fail to have these characteristics and so are not first principles or, if a premise is not a first principle, the philosophers have failed to demonstrate the premise’s necessity. While Ghazālī believes that on at least three counts the philosophers’ positions lead to unbelief, on several other issues he accepts the conclusion of the philosophers even while denying their demonstrative character.

Ghazālī’s general concern in both the Incoherence and other works where he criticizes the philosophers is their claim to having demonstrated truths of religion independent of sacred sources. That is because this position, complains Ghazālī, has led some of those with lesser intellects to accept the philosophers’ arguments uncritically, and so think that they can dispense with religion and religious sources (Ghazālī Deliverance, 60–70, 83–6 and Incoherence, religious preface and introduction 4). Ghazālī’s own position is that while there is a duty to provide a rational defense of the basic tenets of one’s religion, this duty falls only on those intellectually suited and religiously trained and must be prohibited of those who lack this training (Ghazālī Moderation, introductions 1–3).

2. Proofs for the existence of God (Allāh)

Among the basic religious beliefs that some Muslim theologians and philosophers thought that reason alone could establish is the existence of God. To this end various, Muslim thinkers developed different proofs as well as criticisms of each other’s arguments. Here we consider three such arguments and sets of objections: the argument from temporal coming-to-be, the argument from the nature of necessity and possibility/contingency and the argument from knowledge by presence.

2.1 An argument from temporal coming-to-be (hudūth)

Muslim theologians, that is, proponents of kalām, and even certain philosophers like as Abū Yūsuf al-Kindī (d. ca. 866), had several arguments for the existence of God, all of which in some way appeal temporal coming-to-be (see, for example, Ashʿarī TAAT: 6–8; Juwaynī Proofs, 9–16; Ghazālī Moderation, 27–41; Shahrastānī Summa, 1–25) and which fall under the umbrella expression, ‘kalām cosmological argument’. William Lane Craig has defended and brought to the attention of contemporary philosophers of religion the kalām cosmological argument (see section in entry on cosmological arguments). In its simplest form, the argument runs like this:

  1. Everything that begins to exist after not having existed has a cause for its existence.
  2. The world began to exist after not having existed.
  3. Therefore, the world has a cause for its existence, which is God.

Premise (1) is just a particular instance of the general principle that nothing comes from nothing. Within the medieval Islamic world, the principle is associated with the notion of preponderation (tarjīḥ), which at least within the context of the kalām cosmological argument, states that for any action, motion or change some cause or reason exist for that action or change.

The more controversial premise is (2), for unlike the theologians, certain philosophers, like Fārābī, Ibn Sīnā and Ibn Rushd, maintained that the world has existed infinitely into the past. Consequently, these philosophers reject the world’s coming to exist after some point of not having existed. The theologians’ response was either simply to claim that the intellect asserts that the existence of an infinity is rationally impossible or to show that positing an infinity leads to consequences known to be rationally impossible. Those who took the latter strategy drew upon the arguments of the late Neoplatonic Christian philosopher, John Philoponus (d. 570; see entry on Philoponus). Two examples should provide a sense of the general strategy.

First, according to the astronomy of the time, the world consists of the Earth, which was thought to be (approximately) at the center of the cosmos, and the various celestial bodies—the Moon, Sun, five visible planets and stars—that were believed to orbit the Earth. Now, assume that the world has existed infinitely into the past. In that case, the various celestial bodies that apparently orbit the Earth would have all made an infinite number of revolutions; however, the celestial bodies have different periods. For instance, the Moon orbits the earth approximately once a month, that is, twelve times a year, while the apparent revolution of the Sun is only once a year. Consequently, while the Sun has made an infinite number of apparent revolutions around the Earth, the Moon has made twelve times the rotations of the Sun, that is, twelve times infinity, and so seemingly a greater number than that of the Sun. Since it is assumed that there is nothing greater than infinity, reason recoils at the notion of a number greater than that which nothing is greater. The theologians, then, conclude that the assumption of the world’s existing infinitely into the past leads to absurdity and so must be rejected.

Philosophers who accepted the eternity of the world rejected this argument, claiming that the infinity in question is only a potential infinity and not an actual one, that is, one in which all the members of an actually infinite set would presently exist. As such, they continued, there does not exist actual sets of revolutions that can be compared, which had led to the absurdity. The theologians’ second kind of argument cuts off this form of escape. First, they note that for the philosophers, species are eternal, that is, for example, there have always existed human into the infinite past and there will always exists humans into the infinite future. They then continue that the leading philosophers, like Ibn Sīnā, believe that they have demonstrated that the human soul continues to exist after the death of the body.[2] In that case, if the world together with the human species existed infinitely into the past, then even if only one human a day were to die, there would presently and actually exist an infinite number of human souls, and that number would increase infinitely as humans died moving into the infinite future. In short, the distinction between potential and actual infinities does not save the philosophers from the purportedly absurd consequences. Thus, the assumption that the world has existed infinitely into the past must be rejected. Consequently, the world must have begun to exist after not having existed, and so the second premise of the kalām cosmological argument is secured.

We set aside the philosophers’ defense(s) of the thesis that the world always has existed infinitely into the past and merely note that this issue was one of the most vigorously debated one between theologians and philosophers in the Islamicate world.

2.2 An argument from necessity/possibility (wujūb/imkān)

Certainly, one of the most discussed arguments for the existence of God in the medieval Islamic world was Ibn Sīnā’s Burhān al-Siddīqīn, which can be translated as ‘the demonstration of the truthful’ (Avicenna al-Najāt, 261–5 & 271–3 = MR07: 211–16 & ITN1: 4.16–20; see also Morewedge 1979; Mayer 2001; McGinnis 2010b: 163–8; Byrne 2019 and Zarepour 2022). Ibn Sīnā’s proof is unique in that it does not appeal to the impossibility of infinite causal series, as most cosmological arguments, and even entertains the possibility of an actual infinity of causes existing simultaneously, although the argument ultimately shows that such a causal series is impossible. Additionally, it shows that the world is causally dependent upon God for its existence at every moment that it exists, even infinitely into the past.

The proof is embedded within Ibn Sīnā’s own modal metaphysics (see entry on Ibn Sīnā’s metaphysics). He began by laying out the logical space when considering existents, and conceptually distinguishes between a necessary existent through itself (wājib al-wujūd bi-dhātihi) and a possible or contingent existent through itself (mumkin al-wujūd bi-dhātihi). The necessary existent through itself would be an entity whose existence is self-explaining and so exists simply on account of what it is—it cannot not exist. In contrast, a possible existent in itself exists on account of something other than itself (bi-ghayrihi)—it can not exist, and so there is something other that explains why it exists when it does. Again, these distinctions are merely the logically possible ways of thinking of existents. We can safely take it that at least some things, perhaps all things, are possible existents in themselves, for certainly most things around us, considered in themselves, are indifferent to whether they exist or do not exist. The question is whether the conceptual space of the necessary existent through itself is empty or occupied.

To this question, Ibn Sīnā begins by considering what would even count as such an existent. At least one feature of such an entity, Ibn Sīnā argues, is that it must be absolutely simple. His argument assumes two modest mereological claims: one, a whole (jumla) exists through its parts and, two, parts are other than the whole. Now assume that the whole of the necessary existent through itself is not simple and so consists of parts. On the basis of the first mereological assumption, if the whole of the necessary existent through itself consisted of parts, then its necessary existence would be through those parts; however, from the second assumptions those parts are other than the whole. Consequently, the whole of the necessary existent through itself would be necessary through another. To be ‘through another’, however, is to be through what is not itself. We have a contradiction: the whole of the necessary existent through itself exists through not itself. Ibn Sīnā concludes, the necessary existent through itself, should it exist, must be simple. Again, Ibn Sīnā is not claiming that anything meets this description. He is merely describing what would count as a necessary existent through itself. It is still an open question whether anything exists as absolutely simple and necessary through itself.

With these preliminaries in place, we turn to Ibn Sīnā’s proof proper. Clearly, something, x, exists, and so must be either a necessary or a possible existent through itself—these exhaust the possibilities. If x is a necessary existent through itself, the argument is complete. If x is a possible existent through itself, then Ibn Sīnā asks us to consider x along with all and only the other possible existents through themselves, y, z … n, which currently exist. Let the whole of all and only things that are possible existents in themselves be W. Since W currently exists, it itself must be either a necessary or possible existent in itself, given Ibn Sīnā’s modal ontology. W cannot exist as necessary through itself, since it consists of the parts x, y, zn, which are possible existents, and as seen what is a necessary existent through itself cannot have parts but is absolutely simple. Consequently, W is possible through itself but exists through another. This other, o, either is included within W or is outside of W. If o is within W, then, because o exists, it is either a necessary or a possible existent through itself. It cannot be a necessary existent through itself, since only possible existents were included in W, and so there would be a contradiction. Likewise, o cannot be a possible existent through itself, for it is through o that W and so all the members of W exist, which includes o. Thus, o would exist through itself, and so would be a necessary existent through itself. Even if one allowed circular causation, which Ibn Sīnā subsequently rebuts, o ultimately, albeit indirectly, still would be necessary through itself. We assumed, however, that o was a possible existent through itself, a contradiction. Since o cannot exist in W either as a necessary or as a possible existent through itself on pain of contradiction, and yet those are the only conceptually possible ways something can exist, o must exist outside of W. Since W included all and only possible existents through themselves, the only thing outside of W is the Necessary Existent through itself, which Ibn Sīnā identified with God.

2.3 An argument from knowledge by presences (ʿilm ḥuḍūrī)

The discussion of proofs for the existence of God by Ṣadr al-Dīn Muhammad Shīrāzī, simply known as Mullā Ṣadrā (d. 1636), is very much embedded within his own process ontology (see section on the proof in the entry on Mulla Sadra). That ontology itself is an outgrowth of his mystic-inspired philosophical vision of religion, which gives precedence to the direct experience or presence of God. While he believes that there is a definite proof for God, he is skeptical of the earlier traditional arguments for God. In most general terms, his concern with earlier proofs is that they all proceed from the existence of something other than God and then infer to the existence of God, and yet God is the very ground for the existence of everything else. If anything, God is proof of that other. More specifically, Mullā Ṣadrā criticizes the fact that all earlier proofs begin with certain concepts or essences, like necessity and possibility, which are mental, and then illicitly infer from concepts of things to their existence, which is extra-mental. This claim is even true for the kalām cosmological argument, which begins with the concept of ‘the world’, and then from the assumption that that concept refers and so exists infers the existence of God. For Mullā Ṣadrā one simply cannot move from mere concepts to existence—one must begin with existence itself—and so all of these earlier arguments fail.

Mullā Ṣadrā’s own ‘proof’ for the existence of God is less a proof for God’s existence than a pointer that directs one to an experience that one already has and then clarifies that experience. It would be analogous to one who has experienced frogs, toads and salamanders, but then claims that they have never experienced an amphibian. The proof that one has experienced amphibians is to lead them to recognize that their experience of frogs, toads and salamanders is an amphibian-experience. In this vein, Mullā Ṣadrā draws on the Qur’anic verse—“God (Allāh) is witness that there is no god but He” (Qur’an 3.18). He suggests that we all have experienced God, even if we have not recognized that the experience is about God. That is because existence never can be negated or denied. For even if there is non-existence, there is a sense that there is something, and while as simple as it might be, that something exists. There simply cannot not be existence argues Mullā Ṣadrā, and indeed the experience or knowledge of this existence is present to everyone. Nothing, then, stands above existence (not even non-existence), and yet God just is that existence above which nothing stands. For Mullā Ṣadrā existence is not something static but dynamic, a single reality that varies in intensity and modulation (tashkīk). God is existence at its greatest intensity and perfection. To be sure, while the experience or belief that there is this existence is basic for everyone, it is not necessary for everyone to experience this existence as God. To be sure, recognizing this existence as God might take long practice and training as prescribed by Sufi masters. Still, one’s experience of this existence as God and consequent belief that it is God, which follows upon a knowledge by presence, is for Mullā Ṣadrā, properly basic and in need of no further proof.

3. God and the universe: creation and conservation/maintenance of the universe

A question closely related to the existence of God is that of God’s relation to other existents, that is, the universe. There are two distinct but related aspects to this question. The first is whether God is the cause of the universe’s existence, for there have been thinkers, like Aristotle, who believe both that God (or at least a first unmoved mover) exists and is related to the cosmos, while denying that God is the cause of the universe’s very existence. The question here is whether God is a creator. The second aspect to the question of God’s relation to the universe assumes that God is a creator and further asks, “What is God’s immediate and present causal relation to the universe?” Some thinkers, like deists, maintain that God creates the universe and then proverbially steps back and lets the world continue on its own like a well-made clock. Others, in contrast, hold that at every moment that the world exists, it is causally and ontologically dependent upon God’s conserving power and should God remove his proverbial hand, the cosmos would slip into nothingness and oblivion. Muslim philosophers and theologians alike had decided views on both of these issues.

3.1 Creation

Muslim theologians and philosophers, with rare exceptions, agreed that God is a creator and that the cosmos’ existence is in some way causally dependent or grounded upon God. (Ibn Rush, who follows Aristotle and denies that God is strictly an efficient cause of the world, is clearly an outlier.) What was at issue among these thinkers, and where there was virulent disagreement, was the nature of this causal dependence and grounding. There were three competing models to explain God’s divine creative act. Many, but not all, philosophers viewed the world as emanating or flowing (fayaḍān) from the very being of God. Theologians as a group favored a model of temporal coming-to-be, occurrence or origination (iḥdāth), which frequently resulted in some form of occasionalism. Finally, the third model presents creation as a manifestation (maẓhir) of one single reality, a paradigm that Sufis or thinkers with a mystical orientation mainly upheld. Closely aligned with the nature of God’s causal relation to the world is the issue of the age of the universe, and particularly whether the cosmos has existed infinitely into the past. While the question of the world’s age is not the primary focus here, a particular answer to it frequently is tied to a given model of the divine creative act. Let us consider each of these models.

3.1.1 Creation as emanation (fayḍ)

Many of the Muslim philosophers, although again not all, adopted some version of creation by ‘emanation’ (fayḍ or fayaḍān) to explain God’s causal relation to the universe. In general, the emanation thesis makes two claims:

  1. that the universe proceeds from God eternally and
  2. that God’s causation is mediated so that lower things come from higher ones, not directly from God.

The details of this general thesis frequently differed among different thinkers. Here we consider the details of Ibn Sīnā’s version of emanation.

We have seen Ibn Sīnā’s proof for the existence of the Necessary Existent through itself, which in effect shows that at any instant that the universe, understood as the whole of all possible/contingent things, exists, God must be conserving it in existence. We have also seen his proof for divine simplicity (see §2.2). Ibn Sīnā believes that these two doctrines further imply that God’s creative act must be eternal, and so likewise the effect of that creative act must also be eternal. In that case, the cosmos, if not eternal, is at least sempiternal (sarmadī) and perpetual (dahr) (Acar 2010). While Ibn Sīnā has a number of independent proofs by which he argues that the world has always existed (Avicenna MetaH: 9.1 & PhysH: 3.11), one need merely consider how he conceives the world’s relation to God and the nature of God’s creating to grasp why he held this position. His account is embedded within his discussion of God’s knowledge of the world (Avicenna MetaH: 8.6 [6–22] & 8.7).

One of the divine attributes is knowledge. In human intellects, knowledge occurs when we interact with an already existing world, and the things in the world in some way act upon our intellects so that our potential to understand is realized and our intellect in a sense receives some concept that it previously did not have. For numerous reasons such an account of intellect cannot apply to the deity. First, God is free of potentiality, inasmuch as potentiality refers to something possible or contingent, and God as the Necessary Existent in itself is outside of the whole of possible existents. Second, if God were to receive anything, there would be both that which is received and what receives, and so God would be composite, which is impossible given Ibn Sīnā’s doctrine of divine simplicity. Faced with these issues Ibn Sīnā introduces a different model of divine knowledge, which additionally explains God’s creative act.

According to Ibn Sīnā’s model, what God knows directly and primarily is the divine self. Because God is perfect, and indeed above perfection, God must know himself perfectly. In that case, he must know that he is the ultimate cause and grounds of all existence, but in order to know a cause perfectly, one must likewise know the effect of that cause perfectly, which just is the cosmos in this case. Unlike with human knowledge, where our knowledge of a thing, x, is in some way caused by x’s existence, in divine knowledge God’s knowledge of x causes x to exist. In other words, there emanates from God’s self-knowledge the very existence of the cosmos, which Ibn Sīnā identifies with the order of the good. Since God existed infinitely into the past and will exist infinitely into the future and is always self-knowing, the emanation of the cosmos must likewise have existed infinitely into the past and will continue infinitely into the future.

Not merely does Ibn Sīnā think that God must create eternally, he also thinks it is all but heresy (ilḥād) to claim that God started to create at some first moment in the finite past (Avicenna PhysH: 3.11 [9]). That is because if God were not creating the cosmos eternally, there would be some time when the divinity is not willing the creation of the world and some time when it is willing the creation of the world. Consequently, there would be a change in the divine will, and so God would have changed. Whatever is subject to change, Ibn Sīnā continues, must be composite in some way, for there is that which perdures throughout the change and that which is either lost or comes to be. The idea of temporal creation is thus incompatible with divine simplicity, and to adopt it is for Ibn Sīnā is to forgo the doctrine of God’s oneness/uniqueness (tawḥīd), which is central to Islam.

There is one further point about Ibn Sīnā’s conception of God’s relation to creation that should be made, namely, the extent to which Ibn Sīnā’s deity creates as an act of volition. For Ibn Sīnā a willful agent (1) recognizes the action it is doing, (2) is not forced to act and (3) is content or satisfied (riḍan) with its action (Avicenna MetaH: 9.4 [3]). Ibn Sīnā distinguishes an act of will from either an act of intention (qaṣd) or an act of nature (ṭabʿ). God’s act is not by way of nature, since such actions proceed from the agent independent of knowledge and consent, and yet there is nothing about the Necessary Existing through itself that it does not perfectly know and to which it does not perfectly consent. Ibn Sīnā likewise denies that God acts intentionally. That is because intentional actions involve the agent’s conceptualizing some good, then a separate act of acquiring that good and finally the good that is acquired. Consequently, only an agent who is composite and not simple acts out of intention, but again Ibn Sīnā’s deity is absolutely simple. These considerations likewise explain why for Ibn Sīnā, God’s creating does not, and indeed cannot, require choice among options, and yet it is a free act of the will. It is a free, precisely because God knows he is creating, consents to that creation and in no way is forced to create.

3.1.2 Creation as origination (ịdāth) after non-existence

The theologians were not impressed with the emanationist account of God’s creative act. Despite Ibn Sīnā’s move to re-interpret volitional action, emanation seemed to the theologians to be little more than an act of nature, as if the sun were to know and to be glad that it shines, but also having no choice in the matter. A free act of the will, they maintained, essentially involves choice, and so any action not involving choice is not free. The theologians were likewise not impressed with arguments from simplicity that concluded that if God were to choose, God would not be simple. For some of them, like the early Ghazālī, were happy to deny the strong conception of divine simplicity, which many philosophers favored, since it seemed contrary to their belief that God has a number of distinct divine attributes, like life, power, knowledge and will (McGinnis 2022).

A potentially serious challenge to the theologians came in explaining a change in the divine will, namely, the change from willing-not-to-create to willing-to-create. The issue now is what caused that change in God, for if God is the Cause of causes, then nothing outside of God could explain that change of will, whereas if creating is essential to God, it is no longer clear how the theologians’ position substantially differs from some version of emanation. Ghazālī provided what becomes the standard Ashʿarite theological response: From all eternity God freely willed the creation of the world at the moment that it comes to be (Ghazālī Incoherence, disc. 1, [13]). Thus, if one imagines the whole of time as forming a timeline, where God creates at some given moment, t then at every moment on that timeline, God wills the creation of the world at t. Of course, God could have willed from all eternity to create at some moment other than t or indeed not to create at all. Regardless of the case, there would have been no change in the divine will.

There was push back against this account of the immutability of God’s eternal will from multiple directions, perhaps the most pressing is that it only changes the focus of the original concern, namely that there still must be a cause of God’s willing some given moment to be the first moment of creation. More specifically, assume that God eternally willed to create our universe some fourteen billion years ago. Of course, if God is truly omnipotent (and this divine attribute was non-negotiable for Ashʿarite theologians), then God eternally could have willed to create the world fifteen or sixteen billion years ago or even as early as ten-thousand years ago. Indeed, there are an infinite number of moments, all of which seem equally likely candidates for when God could have created our cosmos. Thus, either there is some cause for God’s choosing to create at the moment he does or the choice is haphazard and random and so not the act of an agent acting from knowledge. In short, either there is a reason for God’s creating at the moment that he does—and so God’s action is caused—or there is no reason—and so God’s action is without reason, and so is irrational. Neither option seems appealing.

Ghazālī had a response, which again became the standard one among Ashʿarites (Ghazālī Incoherence, disc. 1 [45–6]). According to him, the essential function of the will is simply to choose among indiscernibles independent of any cause for the particular choice made. Of course, there is a sense in which the choice is ‘arbitrary’, but only in the sense that the action is a result of the will and nothing else. The standard example of this point is that of a starving man presented with identical pieces of food, who is also equally disposed to all of them, e.g., one piece is not closer to the man nor is the man either left- or right-handed, etc. The man will certainly take one piece and eat despite lacking any reason for taking that particular piece of food, and yet assuredly the act is one of a rational agent, for only an imbecile under these circumstances would starve in indecision. This general account of will holds not only for humans but also for God. Thus, maintained Ghazālī, from all eternity God wills to create (and so God’s will does not change), yet purely as an act of the will does God will to create at the particular moment that he does (for that, according to Ghazālī, is exactly what it means to be a rational volitional agent).

3.1.3 Creation as manifestation (maẓhir) of a single reality

A yet third way that the world’s dependence upon God was envisioned within the Islamicate world is that of Mullā Ṣadrā, who drew inspiration from Ibn ʿArabī (Mullā Ṣadrā Penetrations, 68–71; also see Rahman 1975: 59–63 and Kalin 2014: 104–19). Mullā Ṣadrā’s account appeals to his theory of tashkīk al-wujūd (literally, ‘the ambiguity of existence’, but which contemporary scholar commonly label ‘the modulation of existence’) as well as his novel notion of ‘substantial motion’ (al-ḥaraka l-jawhariyya). (See the section on monism and pluralism in the entry on Mulla Sadra.)

Both notions are complex and even to provide a general sense of how Mullā Ṣadrā conceives God’s causal relation to creation would be a move away from the philosophy of religion into general metaphysics. Still, brief, even if inadequate, comments are warranted. As for the modulation of existence, according to Mullā Ṣadrā, God is existence at existence’s maximally perfect, eternal and unchanging limit, and only God is perfect, infinite, eternal and unchanging. Creation is the manifestation of existence at degrees that fall short of the divine infinite existence. This is Mullā Ṣadrā’s doctrine of the ‘modulation of existence’. Mullā Ṣadrā’s doctrine of ‘substantial motion’ complements this ontology. It is the idea that all changes, whether change of location, state or the like, are ultimately the result of continuous change in the very substance and essences of things. This view is radical in that Mullā Ṣadrā is suggesting that absolutely nothing persist through change. There are no perduring matter, forms, species and essences. Everything, apart from God, is in a constant state of evolution. Not random evolution, to be sure, but unceasing evolution directed toward God with creation forever becoming more godlike.

Given the doctrines of the modulation of existence and substantial motion, Mullā Ṣadrā offers a unique response to the question of the world’s age. Since the very substances and essences of things are in a state of constant change, nothing other than God is eternal, existing infinitely into the past and into the future. Instead, everything other than God, and this includes the universe as a whole, comes to exist after not having existed. Thus, among created things there simply can be no existent, such as the universe itself, that has persisted infinitely into the past. Consequently, with the theologians, Mullā Ṣadrā agrees that creation must be viewed in terms of temporal coming to be, in the sense of coming to be after not having existed. Be that as it may, his conception of substantial motion also allows, in the spirit of the emanationists, that infinitely into the past and infinitely into the future God is the wellspring of existence constantly creating with creation constantly evolving. Thus, while God’s creative act can be eternal, nothing in the creaturely order, like matter, forms or essences, remains the same as to have always perdured.

3.2 God’s conservation of the universe

Muslim theologians and most, but not all, Muslim philosophers agreed that the world cannot conserve its own existence and so its existence at every moment that it exists is in some way dependent upon God. The real issue for these thinkers is what role, if any, do creatures play in the ongoing processes that constitute the world? Specifically, do or can creatures have causal powers or is God not merely the Cause of causes but the only Cause? Broadly, there were three responses to this question: that of the philosophers, which appeals to their theories of essential causation in the form of emanation and natural causation among creatures; that of the Muʿtazilite theologians, which tends toward divine occasionalism yet reserved some causal efficacy for rational agents; and that of the Ashʿarites and Maturidite theologians, which is also occasionalist, but reserves all or at least virtually all causal efficacy for God alone. Here we focus primarily on the philosophers’ theory of essential causation and the theory of occasionalism that the theologians shared.

3.2.1 Essential causation and providence

Philosophers such as Kindī, Fārābī, Ibn Sīnā and Ibn Rushd all adopted some form of essential or natural causation, some more influenced by the Neoplatonic emanationist framework, others less influenced by that framework (Kindī RKF: 214–37 = MR07: 1–16; Fārābī Perfect State, ch. 8; Avicenna PhysH: bk. 1.5 (= MR07: 156–63) & 1.9–12 and Ibn Rushd Metaphysics, 105–12 & Questions, 11–14). (Ibn Rushd explicitly rejected emanation, whether from God or from creatures, while allowing that creatures have natural causal powers, i.e., that their natures were the source of actions that are strictly speaking their own; see Kogan 1985, esp. ch. 3 and 5.) For present purposes, we focus on Ibn Sīnā’s emanationist-influenced theory of causation, since it would become both the preferred approach of supporters as well as the preferred target of detractors in the post-Avicennan period. Ibn Sīnā’s proof for the existence of the Necessary Existent through itself is set up in terms of explaining the existence of the whole of all possible/contingent things that exist at any given moment. Given its setup, that proof likewise shows that the world—understood as all the possible things that have, presently do or will exist—is dependent upon God as that which conserves it in existence at every moment that the world exists. The causal mechanism explaining this dependency relation again is emanation, where, on Ibn Sīnā’s own unique theory of emanation, it is a possible existent that emanates from the Necessary Existent in itself.

Here it is worth noting that for many philosophers, while ultimately everything in the world traces its existence back to the divine emanation, God is not the immediate cause of everything. Instead, God is only the immediate cause of a single effect, identified with the First Intellect. Ibn Sīnā is adamant on this point: ‘From the One only one proceeds’ (Avicenna MetaH: 9.4 [5]; also see Amin 2020 and Dadikhuda 2020). Still, from that one effect a plethora of effects, i.e., other possible existents, cascade downward, all of which are mediately but ultimately dependent on God for their conservation and their continued existence at every moment that they exist. In other words, the created order overflows from the Necessary Existent in coherent grades of existents, namely, a hierarchy of immaterial creatures, like intellects or angels, followed by the material realm. In each case the higher-grade functions as the immediate causal principle of the next lower grade.

This emanationist cosmology is rooted in the Neoplatonic principle that “every activity in the world is in some sense double insofar as it possesses both an inner and an outer aspect” (see entry on neoplatonism). The inner aspect is the thing’s nature, which is the principle and cause of those activities that are essential to being a certain kind of thing. For example, the inner activity of a tree, which the tree’s nature determines, gives rise to its producing the shape, leaves, fruit etc. specific to that kind of tree. Another common example is fire’s burning cotton, for fire’s nature is to burn, while cotton is of a nature that when in contact with fire, the cotton is burnt. Our world, for the philosophers, then, is a network of possible existents each having causal powers specific to their kind, all of which are ultimately dependent upon God for their existence.

Finally, while Ibn Sīnā insists that God is not acting with the intention of the world’s good, our world still is the beneficiary of God’s providence. That is because in knowing himself God knows the order of the good in the most perfectly possible way, and God’s self-knowledge, as seen in the discussion of Ibn Sīnā’s account of creations (see §3.1.1), is his very act of emanation. Consequently, what emanates from him is an order that is the most perfectly possible commensurate with the chain of possible existents. This optimal ordering of existents, whose reality is grounded in the Necessary Existent, just is, for Ibn Sīnā, providence (ʿināya).

Here it is certainly worth noting that, for Ibn Sīnā, and others like Fārābī and Ibn Rushd (Fārābī Perfect State, §§6–7, Avicenna MetaH: 8.6 [6]–8.7 and Ibn Rushd Metaphysics ad Textus 51), God does not know particulars in their particularity, e.g., that you are reading this sentence at this very moment; rather, God knows particulars only universally. Moreover, God does not act for our sake such that our good is the final end of God’s creative act, even thought we are the benefactors of the divine goodness (Fārābī al-Siyāsa, 47–8 = MR07: 91–2 [¶¶ 31–2]; Avicenna MetaH: 8.3 [1–3] & al-Najāt, 146–9 = MR07: 216–19 and Ibn Rushd Metaphysics ad Textus 52). Despite these caveats, Ibn Sīnā believes that God’s universal knowledge is sufficient to ensure that

not even the weight of a dust speck, whether in the heavens or on the Earth, escapes your Lord’s notice (Qur’an 10:61). (Avicenna al-Najāt, 247 = MR07: 217).

Thus by Ibn Sīnā’s lights divine providence is still ensured. Ibn Rushd makes a similar point about divine providence (Ibn Rushd Metaphysics ad Textus 52).

3.2.2 Occasionalism

Many Muslim theologians viewed the philosophers’ idea of natures with causal powers as one that impugned God’s omnipotence and his divine sovereignty over all that is. In addition, they found the philosophers’ argumentation for essential or natural causation wanting. First, Muslim theologians were not impressed with either the theory of emanation or the philosophers’ account of essential or natural causation. In the Incoherence of the Philosophers, after faithfully presenting the philosophers’ discussion of emanation, Ghazālī says,

What they have said is arbitrary and really just shadows in the dark. Were someone to utter this while dreaming, we would think they were delirious! (Ghazālī Incoherence, disc. 3 [48])

As for the philosophers’ theory of natures and natural causation, even before Ghazālī, Abū Bakr al-Bāqillānī (d. 1013), a rough contemporary of Ibn Sīnā’s and whom Ghazālī subsequently follows, challenged the philosophers’ account of natures (Bāqillānī al-Tamhīd, 34–47 and Ghazālī Incoherence, disc. 17). These theologians note that the philosophers’ reason for insisting on natures with causal powers and natural necessitation is purportedly drawn from empirical observations: One regularly observes, for example, fire’s contact with cotton and the burning of the cotton or the imbibing of alcohol and the intoxication of the imbiber and a multitude of other such regularities. The philosophers maintain that these regularities require that the nature of fire, for example, causes the cotton to burn because the nature of cotton is to be so affected and similarly for the rest of regularities in the natural order. Bāqillānī and Ghazālī push back on this last assumption. We do not observe causal connections, they note, but merely constant conjunctions: one event followed by another. While natural causation could explain these constant conjunctions, God’s habit (ʿāda) or custom of creating a given event after another could equally explain them.

In place of natural causation, many Muslim theologians held some theory of occasionalism (Fakhry 1958 and Perler & Rudolph, 2000: 13–124). For them, God is not simply the Cause of causes, he in fact is the only cause. God not merely brought the world into existence at some moment in the past, but indeed at every instance, he re-creates the world anew. In its extreme form, there is only the illusion of a continuity between moments or a creature’s persisting through time. Changes in the world, thus, are solely the result of God’s re-creating the world slightly differently at each subsequent moment. Consequently, nothing other than God can truly be an agent of change or action.

Some might find the theologians’ theory of occasionalism metaphysically exotic. For many theologians, it was simply an implication of God’s absolute omnipotence: God truly has all power, and so no concession is made to creatures (see Wolfson 1976: VII.I). Even Ghazālī, who concedes that humans have a modicum of power, hastens to add that when compared to God’s omnipotence our power resembles impotence (Ghazālī Moderation, 99). Bāqillānī himself (Bāqillānī al-Tamhīd, 34–47) has a more philosophically rather than theologically engaged answer. He argues that occasionalism is metaphysically preferable to the theory of natural causation on the grounds of a Principle of Paucity: Given two theories each of which equally well explains the same phenomena, the simpler theory should be preferred. The philosophers must posit at least two ontologically distinct kinds of causes: divine causation and natural causation (which itself burgeons into a passel of further ontologically distinct kinds of causes). In contrast, occasionalism, Bāqillānī observes, needs posit only one kind of cause, God, and so should be preferred.

4. Prophecy and Miracles

Assuming that God exists and stands in some ontological relation with creation, does God, in some way, directly make his will and providential care known to us? For Muslim theologians and some philosophers, humans receive guidance in how to construct a well-ordered society through the message of prophets. These messages are a source of correct beliefs about God, how we should live, our place in the cosmos and our ultimate destiny in the hereafter. Given the centrality of prophecy (nubuwwa) to Islam, two distinct questions faced Muslim philosophers and theologians alike. One is justifying and even explaining prophecy as a source of true justified beliefs. The other is identifying a true prophet and distinguishing him from a charlatan, trickster or even sorcerer.

4.1 Prophecy

Concerning the first issue of justifying and explaining prophecy, proponents of prophecy were faced with a challenge. Since humans are rational, presumably they can acquire knowledge of reality and the rules of conduct regarding their individual and social life on their own. Thus, one may ask, “Why are prophets necessary for acquiring true beliefs and proper rules of conduct?” Indeed, Muslims did encounter opposition to their belief in prophecy, ranging from those who claimed it was redundant—at least as the, admittedly hostile, reports about Abū Bakr al-Rāzī relate—to those who thought it was simply impossible—a position that Muslim theologians ascribed to Ibn al-Rāwandī (b. ca. 815) and the Barāhima, arguably the Brahmans of India (see Stroumsa 1999). Detractors of prophecy formulated the problem regarding the need for prophecy as a dilemma (A. H. Rāzī Proofs of Prophecy: 24–6 & 131–4; Juwaynī Proofs, 165; Nasafī TA: vol. II, 1–3). If, on the one hand, that which a prophet teaches on the basis of revelation agrees with that which reason can show, there is no need for prophecy. If, on the other hand, that which a prophet teaches is inaccessible to reason, then it is not rational, and so to be rejected. The argument continues that it seems impossible that God should act in vain, but if he were to send prophets, he would be acting in vain, since the presence of prophets is either redundant or their message is in a sense irrational.

Theologians and certain Muslim philosophers both wanted to justify and to explain prophecy in light of this challenge. Theologians preferred to show why, despite the above dilemma, prophecy is possible and not vain: If anything, it is a sign of God’s grace. Certain philosophers aimed to show that in addition to prophecy’s being possible, there is a natural explanation for it grounded in natural philosophy. While both groups’ approaches are significantly different, they share a common feature. Both recognized that human cognitive capacities differ and that not all humans are equal with regard to those capacities. Indeed, most humans need the symbolic and simplified message of a prophet to reach genuine knowledge of the key religious, ethical and social elements necessary for a devout life.

Juwaynī followed by his student Ghazālī are representatives of the theologians (Juwaynī al-Irshād, 302–7 = Juwaynī Proofs, 165–7 and Ghazālī Moderation, 188–95; also see Griffel 2004). For them, it is reasonable that different individuals with different intellectual capacities may know one and the same truth in different ways. One way, however, need not make another way redundant, let alone impossible. Also, even if on their own some humans can learn certain specific religious claims, reaching them frequently is difficult and requires a lengthy and diligent inquiry, which not all either are willing to do or even capable of doing. Hence, these theologians conclude, it is appropriate, although not obligatory, that God makes such truths available through prophets in order that people who do not have the time nor capacity to pursue such an inquiry still can learn about God and things divine. In this respect, prophecy, far from being vain, is a sign of God’s grace and concession to human diversity and weakness.

The philosophers’ have multiple strategies when treating prophecy. For example, Ibn Rushd maintains that while philosophy and science provide the most complete theoretical account of the world and God’s relation to it, prophecy and religion more generally provide a practical knowledge of what is good and right with respect to one’s actions (see Taylor 2018). Ibn Rushd makes this point when identify which kinds of purported miracles are genuine signs of a prophet. He likens a prophet to a physician. If two individuals were both to claim to be physicians, and one says, “Here is my proof”, and then walks on water, whereas the other heals the sick, it is the latter’s proof that is truly relevant and convincing that he is a physician. Similarly, if two individuals claim to be prophets, and so bearers of a message about what God wants of us in order to live well and devoutly, and one gives as proof some seemingly supernatural act, while the other provides laws and knowledge that actually allow one to live well and devoutly, it is the latter who is the genuine prophet (Ibn Rushd Expositions, 104–5). It is noteworthy that like Fārābī, Ibn Rushd distinguishes between philosophers and those incapable of grasping philosophical proof. As for prophetic messages, the latter group needs only know that prophecy conveys what is necessary for living a religious life, while any theoretical account of prophecy must be withheld from them. The fact is that it is unclear whether Ibn Rushd has or even thinks that there can be a theoretical account of prophecy, since in his works exclusively for philosophers (muʾawwal) he is prone to be completely silent or at most raises unanswered puzzles about prophecy.

A theoretical account of prophecy and the mechanism through which it purportedly occurs are seen in the works of Fārābī and Ibn Sīnā (Fārābī Perfect State: ch. 14 and Avicenna DA: 5.6 = MR07: 204–5; also see Walzer 1957 and Marmura 1964). Both philosophers would agree with Ibn Rushd that the primary aspect of prophecy and revelation is grounded in the need for laws and political institutions. That is because these laws and political institutions delineate and support actions directed toward the proper end of humans, namely, happiness or flourishing (saʿāda), which intimately involves a knowledge of God (Fārābī al-Tanbīh = MR07: 104–20 Avicenna MetaH: 10.2). Unlike Ibn Rushd, they additionally want to provide a theoretical account of prophecy. This theoretical account attempts to show that far from being a supernatural act, as the theologians believe, prophecy is a natural phenomenon and as such has a naturalistic explanation. This attempt at a naturalistic explanation of prophecy is grounded in both their emanationist metaphysics and philosophy of mind (see entry on Arabic and Islamic psychology and philosophy of mind). The details of their positions are complex, so the following is simply to provide a general sense of their strategy.

As seen, for Fārābī and Ibn Sīnā, there emanates from God the order of the good in the form of a cascade of grades of dependent or possible existents, each of which can itself be a source of emanation and a principle of a lower grade. Human cognition is itself part of this overflowing: Human intellects receive this emanation once they are suitably prepared and to the extent that they are capable, which in turn perfects the intellects so that they come to have knowledge of our world and God. Next, as noted earlier, the philosophers recognize varying degrees among human cognitive capacities. At the very apex of these varying degrees of capacity is the intellect and imaginative power of prophets. The prophets’ cognitive powers are wholly and perfectly disposed to receive this emanation, and to the greatest extent possible for humans they grasp the divine order of the good as it emanates from God. Moreover, from their intellects the cascade of emanation continues, now entering into their imagination such that they sensibly experience as symbols and images what they perfectly know through receiving this ultimately divine emanation. It is these symbols and images that the prophets use to convey God’s proverbial plan to those who are otherwise incapable of acquiring this knowledge. While the above presentation overly emphasizes the ‘metaphysical’ aspect of their theory of prophecy, the fact is that the bulk of the theory is discussed and developed in natural philosophy, particularly in works corresponding with Aristotle’s De anima and discussions in the novel reworking of the Arabic version of Aristotle’s Parva Naturalia (for the Arabic verion of the Parva Naturalia see Hansberger 2010). In a real sense, the aim is to naturalize prophecy. Thus, prophecy, for these philosophers, is possible precisely because it is the natural, even necessary, outcome of certain rare, but wholly natural, psychological processes.

4.2 Miracles

The second issue again is distinguishing the true prophet from a charlatan, trickster or even sorcerer. If it is reasonable that God appoints prophets, the question that immediately arises is how to recognize them and to justify their claims to prophethood. In response to this challenge many thinkers in the Islamicate world, theologians and philosophers alike, identified performing miracles as a decisive sign of one’s rightful claim to being a prophet (ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 568–9; Juwaynī Proofs, 167–8; Ibn Fūrak Mujarrad Maqālāt, 176–80; and Bāqillānī al-Tamhīd, 141–60).

The Arabic term for a prophet’s miracle is muʿjiza, which means that which shows the impotence of others. Specifically, a miracle is a challenge by the prophet to others to perform a similar act, which the others are presumably incapable of doing. In general, then, a miracle is any extraordinary event that confirms an individual’s claims to prophethood (Juwaynī Proofs, 168–72). Muslims recognize two kinds of such extraordinary events. The first is any event that follows upon the prophet’s challenge and that is highly unexpected albeit not strictly a violation of the natural order. For example, the occurrence of a plague, which ensues after the prophet predicts it. Also, the very inimitability of the Qur’an (iʿjāz) seems to fall within this category and often is cited as the only, yet most convincing, proof of Muhammad’s claim to prophethood.

And if you are in any doubt about what we (God) have sent down to our servant, produce a sūra of the like of [this Qur’an]. (Qur’an 2:23; also see 11:13, 10:38, 17:88 and 52: 34)

Those who were so challenged apparently were impotent to rise to the challenge. The second class of extraordinary events requires the actual suspension of natural laws. Examples include, the virgin birth and the raising of the dead back to life. (Peterson et al. 2013: 208–9). To distinguish this class from the first, let us call them ‘supernatural’ miracles or events, namely, something that is both extra-ordinary and indeed outside of the natural order of things.

Although many, if not most, medieval Islamic scholars acknowledged prophetic miracles, the issue of whether there truly were both kinds of miracles remained an important topic of discussion. The theologians championed the position that there are both kinds. The philosophers, while not denying that extraordinary acts confirm one’s prophethood, maintained that although miracles are exceptionally rare, they remain part of the natural order, and so they held a position about miracles much like the naturalized view of prophecy. Let us look at the philosophers’ position and then turn to the theologians’ response to it.

Ibn Sīnā’s position may be highlighted here (Avicenna DA: 198–200 & ITN2: 105; also see Davidson 1992: 121–2 and Al-Akiti 2004). For Ibn Sīnā, performing miracles is one of three properties that identify a prophet. We have already seen the other two, namely, (1) to divine future and/or absent events and (2) to relate religious truths in symbolic form that all can grasp. Ibn Sīnā explains miracles in much the same way that he explains these other two properties of the prophet. The intellect and imagination of prophets are of the highest degree possible for humans, and so the prophet fully grasps and understands the order of the good that has its ultimate sources in the divine emanation. Additionally, Ibn Sīnā recognizes the well-established fact that one’s mind and emotions can produce psychosomatic responses even in people of limited intellectual power; however, while for the most parts these responses are limited to one’s own body, in the case of the prophets their minds can affect other bodies, whether animate or inanimate. In so doing, they can cause winds to blow, or rains to fall and even earthquake as well as healing or bringing illness on others. While for us to day the Avicennan account of miracles might appear to border on the occult, within the scientific framework in which he was working, his position provided a legitimate natural explanation of what otherwise could only be called the miraculous. To be sure, not all philosophers accepted Ibn Sīnā’s suggested naturalistic mechanism to explain the apparently miraculous. Still, few denied miracles outright. Thus, even Ibn Rushd apparently allowed that there are miracles—as seen in the miraculous practical value of the laws and religious claims embodied in Qur’an—while remaining virtually silent on how such a miracle as the Qur’an could occur.

Ghazālī provides the theologians’ response to the philosophers in his Incoherence of the Philosophers (Ghazālī Incoherence, disc. 17; also see Fakhry 1958: 56–78; Marmura 1989; López-Farjeat 2016: 131–140). To begin, the Qur’an contains accounts of miracles, some of which clearly appear to be of the supernatural kind, e.g., the virgin birth and resurrection from the dead. A literal reading of these miracle-stories requires violations of essential or natural causation, that is, regular, non-divine causal series that purportedly necessitate their effects. Ghazālī complains that on the philosophers’ account, the Quranic stories of supernatural miracles cannot be taken literally.

Whoever renders the habitual courses [of nature] a necessary constant, makes all these [miracles] impossible. [The philosophers] have thus interpreted what is said in the Qur’an about the revivification of the dead metaphorically. (Ghazālī Incoherence, 163 [23])

While again Ghazālī allows for limited metaphorical readings of the Qur’an, he does so only in those cases where he believes that the literal sense leads to a genuine absurdity or even contradiction. For example, Quranic passage that when taken literally imply that God has a body, for Ghazālī, must be read metaphorically, for to be embodied is to be limited and yet God is unlimited. Miracles of the supernatural kind, that is, violations of natural causation and necessitation, in contrast, do not involve absurdities or outright contradictions. They are admittedly rare, but seemingly possible. Moreover, as we have seen, the theologians view natural causation as nothing more than presumption on the part of the philosophers, preferring occasionalism instead. Thus, for Ghazālī, absent a proof for the impossibility of supernatural miracles, one should accept the Qur’anic stories as literal accounts of real events. Still, Ghazālī does not ultimately believe that these supernatural miracles should be the only, even the primary, basis for one’s belief in the veracity of the Qur’an and Muhammad’s prophethood (Ghazālī al-Munqidh, 41–4 [Deliverance, 83–7]). As for the true proof for the inspired nature of the Qur’an, Ghazālī, in a way that foreshadows and even may have influenced Ibn Rushd’s views, points to the effect of a careful study of the Qur’an and the traditions surrounding Muhammad, the effect of which is the purification of hearts (taṣfiyat al-qulūb) Both the miraculous and the practical confirm the divine sovereignty and governance of all events and testify to the prophetic and miraculous nature of the Qur’an.

5. The Problem of evil

One of the important problems for Abrahamic religions is to explain the presence of evil given the assumption that an all-wise, all-just, all-powerful and all-loving God created and is continuously conserving the world. Modern philosophical discussions of the so-called problem of evil frequently focus on whether the presence of evil provides evidence against the existence of such a God, and so against classical monotheism more generally. In contrast, for medieval Muslim philosophers and theologians, the existence of God was never in question. Instead, ‘the problem’ of evil for these thinkers is a cluster of related issues, not the least of which is “What is evil?” and “Is our world the best possible world?” Additionally, these thinkers wanted to reconcile the divine attributes with the presence of evil or to determine which of the divine attributes, particularly between divine justice and God’s omnipotence, trumps the others.

One strategy for explaining the presence of evil was to emphasize God’s transcendence and sovereignty over the universe. Considering human actions, we judge that some cases of causing others pain are justified, e.g., in disciplining someone or administering justice, while others are not, e.g., gratuitous violence. Given the belief that God created the universe and controls the course of events in the world, how can we explain the suffering that animals, especially humans, undergo? In this regard, some argued that the ethical rules applicable among humans are not applicable to God. Supporters of this account, predeterminists (jabriyya), emphasize that the relation between God and the universe is one between property and owner. Just as a person can do what he wants with his property, so also God has the right to treat his property in whatever way he wants (ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 483–5). Abū al-Ḥasan ʿAlī b. Ismāʿīl al-Ashʿarī (d. 935/6), founder of the Ashʿarite theological school, seems to have defended such a position at an early stage in his career. He highlights God’s absolute control over the course of events in the world (Ashʿarī EIF: 50–1). Thus, the suffering that affects animals and humans, does not need any further justification, since the universe is God’s property and God can treat creatures the way he pleases. He can punish an innocent person and can hold people responsible to do that which they cannot do (Ashʿarī EIF: 111–13).

Instead of emphasizing God’s sovereignty over creation, another approach, which is usually associated with Muʿtazilite theologians, is to consider if there is any reason that justifies an instance of suffering independent of whether the cause of that suffering is God or a human agent (see Hourani 1971 and Vasalou 2008). If one understands evil as unjustified suffering, then in such cases of suffering where there is a valid justification—like a certain derived benefit or as punishment—the suffering cannot be considered evil, at least not in the sense of unjustified suffering (ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 485–6). Consequently, in considering whether some case of suffering is evil, one must take into account, not only the conditions of the agent, that is, whether God or a creature caused it, but also whether there are justifying reasons for the suffering. Since God is good and just, there must be reasons justifying any instance of suffering that is traced back to the divine action—excluding human free actions. Muʿtazilite theologians identified some of these reason as compensation (ʿiwaḍ), admonition (ʿibr), punishment, some kind of benefit (maṣlaḥa) or even grace (luṭf) (ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 487–9 and Ibn al-Malāhimī al-Fāʾiq, 261–74). Thus, the Muʿtazilite theologians argued that the existence of suffering in the world is compatible with the goodness, generosity and justice of God.

The standards by which Muʿtazilite theologians evaluate what is good and just is the same for both God and humans. Their objective standard of goodness and justice had further implications about the presence of evil in our world. One notable implication is that God must do what is best (aṣlaḥ). Initially certain Muʿtazilites maintained that God must do what is best only in religious matters, namely, commands and prohibitions (Ibn Mattawayh al-Tadhkira, II, 332–3, 360). Ultimately, most Muʿtazilite theologians came to agree that since God is generous and good, he does what is best in all his actions, whether religious matters or creating and ordering the universe (Ibn al-Malāhimī al-Fāʾiq, 119 and ʿAbd al-Jabbār al-Aṣlaḥ: XIV, 53). Consequently, even if the Muʿtazilite theologians do not emphasize this implication, for them this world is the best possible world.

The Neoplatonic-inspired philosophers, like Fārābī and Ibn Sīnā, had yet another strategy to explain the presence of evil, which Ibn Sīnā exemplifies well (Fārābī al-Taʿlīqāt, §39 and Avicenna MetaH: 9.6, 339–47). Ibn Sīnā takes up the problem of evil within the context of divine providence (see above §3.2.1). The question is how can the existence of evil in the universe be explained, if the whole universe emanates from an absolutely good God? Following the Neoplatonist tradition, he associates goodness with existence or being and evil with non-being or the imperfection of being proper to a thing. Since evil is in a sense a non-thing, and the non-existent does not have a cause, it is a category mistake to ask what is the cause of evil absolutely speaking or to suggest that God causes. it.

Still, Ibn Sīnā recognizes that some apparent evils, most notably suffering, cannot simply be reduced to imperfections and the privation of a proper existence. There are events, or conditions, that actively can cause suffering. Ibn Sīnā argues that evil as suffering is applicable only to a small part of the whole universe, and yet is indispensable to that part, a ‘necessary evil’, if you will. This part of the universe consists of things that are subject to generation and corruption. The sphere of generation and corruption, according to Neoplatonic cosmology, is limited to the Earth, its inhabitants and the immediate atmosphere enveloping the Earth. Thus, in order for there to be absolutely no evil in the entire cosmos the sphere of generation and corruption either would have needed not to exist or to be deprived of the properties that make generable and corruptible things what they are. Divine providence precludes both options, Ibn Sīnā argues, for roughly the same reason in both cases, namely, the universe overall would be less good than it actually is, even given the presence of some evil. An example drawn from Ibn Sīnā clarifies his point. Certainly, a poor man who loses his family and possessions to a fire, suffers an evil. Yet the fact that fire is essentially hot, so as to cook flesh and to burn wood, is in itself good. Likewise, that wood and flesh are essentially such as to be cooked by fire are in themselves good. To eliminate fire’s power to burn and the powers by which wood and flesh are cooked is to eliminate those very things. Thus, to eliminate the possibility of this kind of suffering would be to eliminate an entire class of existents, namely, those subject to generation and corruption. Consequently, an entire class of objective good in the universe would be lost, and so make the world overall less good. For Ibn Sīnā, such a loss is simply incompatible with his conception of divine providence, God is ultimately the source of an order that is the most perfectly possible commensurate with the chain of all possible existents.

While both Ibn Sīnā’s and the Muʿtazilite explanations of the presence of evil imply that God has created the best possible world, neither explicitly make this claim in their works. It was Ghazālī, who explicitly argued that the actual world is the best of all possible worlds (see Ormsby 1984). “In the realm of the possible”, Ghazālī assures us,

there is nothing at all more wondrously beautiful than [this world] nor more complete nor more perfect (laysa fī-l-imkān abdaʿ aṣlan aḥsana minhu wa lā atamma wa lā akmala)

or as it was popularized in the rhyming couplet,

In the realm of all the possible, nothing than what is is more wonderful. (laysa fī-l-imkān abdaʿ mimmā kān) (Ghazālī FDU: 45–6 and Ghazālī Forty Principles, 259)

The imperfection that we see in the world is a result of the limits of our knowledge. The reason that this must be the best possible world is because if a better universe were possible and God did not create it, yet could have created it, he would have been miserly; however, God is omnibenevolent, and so this claim must be false. If God did not create this purportedly better possible world because he could not do so, then God would be impotent in some respect; however, God is omnipotent, and so this claim must be false. In short, none of these or similar options for explaining a less than optimal world are acceptable, for they all impugn God’s majesty. To be sure, Ghazālī is not claiming that there is no evil in the world; rather, for him, evil, as imperfection and suffering, is an essential ingredient of the perfection of the world. While we might not fully recognize how certain specific cases of evil contribute to the world’s overall perfection, nonetheless, those very imperfections can help one appreciate the contrasting good in the world. Thus the actual universe, with the evil included in it, is the best possible universe.

6. Religious/theological language

Theological language has a special status that presents a challenge for thinkers particularly within the Abrahamic traditions since God is considered to be completely different from creation, while our language applies mainly, if not solely, to creatures. Thus, to express what and how God is proves a difficult challenge. The follow section considers earlier Islamic approaches to understanding theological language and how to read the Qur’an’s claims about God. The next section (§6.2) considers how later Muslim philosophers and the various schools of Muslim theologians developed these approaches with an eye to their discussions of the divine attributes.

6.1 Early approaches to theological language

The earliest developments in Islamic theological language emphasized God’s absolute unity/simplicity (tawḥīd) and perhaps most importantly, since God is unlike creatures (mukhālafa li-l-ḥawādith), his transcendence (tanzīh). The proponents of divine transcendence, the eponymous Jahmiyya, named after the movement’s founder Jahm ibn Ṣafwān (696–745), denied that God has any attributes (see Schöck 2016: 55–77). Consequently, critics referred to these theologians as apophaticists (Muʿaṭṭila, literally, ‘those who void’) to indicate that this position voids religious texts of their literal meaning since God transcends anything that we can say or understand about him. In response to this emphasis on divine transcendence, there emerged those who stressed a hyper-literal reading of Qur’anic verses—such as Qur’an 48: 10 & 38, 71; 2: 115 and 11: 37 with their references to God’s hands, face and eyes respectively—and the prophetic traditions. Based on a literal reading, they made God similar to creatures and ascribed to him a physical body, and so were labeled anthropomorphists (mushabbiha, literally, ‘simulators’) and corporealists (mujassima) (see Van Ess 2000). A reaction to these two earlier positions was that of the traditionalist (salafī) who claimed to follow the example of the earliest generation (salaf) of Muslims, i.e., the companions of the Prophet and the followers of the companions. They attempted to provide a middle path between the apophatic and anthropomorphic understandings of God. They wanted neither to void the Qur’an of its literal meaning by emphasizing divine transcendence nor to make God similar to bodily creatures by taking the Qur’an out of its broader theological context. In general, they maintained that while one knows that God has the various anthropomorphic characters that the Qur’an attributes to him, one should not delve into how (kayf) God has those attributes, i.e., their mode of existence. All the major approaches developed later in the medieval Islamic world, such as those of the Muʿtazilites, Ashʿarites, Maturidites and philosophers, can be traced back to and are modifications of these three approaches (Winter 2008: 33–141; Rudolph 1996 [2015]: 23–121; and Watt 1973: 242–50, 279–318; 1992: 46–55, 64–97).

Underlying the apophatic, anthropomorphic and traditionalist positions about divine attributes is a common assumption, namely, when one talks about God and about creation, one must use univocal language. In other words, it was assumed that if language is to be literal and informative, properties predicated of God and of creatures must have exactly the same sense. Thus, if, as the Qur’an purports, God has hands, eyes and speaks, having hands, eyes and speaking must have one the same meaning when predicated of God and of creatures. For Muslim Apophatic theologians, since we cannot take attributes predicated of God univocally in the way they are predicated of creation, we must take them as negations about God. Conversely, granting the assumption of univocal predication, Muslim anthropomorphists maintained it is legitimate to draw the implications that God has bodily parts similar to those of creatures from the Qur’anic statements about God. Muslim Traditionalists, with the same assumption, affirmed the literal meaning of religious texts that predicate of God creaturely properties, but they understood them as governed by the principle that God is unlike creation, and so those properties that are found in creation and predicated of God may be acknowledged without additionally drawing their ordinary implications.

6.2 Theological language and the divine attributes

Issues associated with how God or the divine self (dhāt) is related to his properties or attributes (ṣifāt) drove further developments among medieval Islamic scholars. One common classification of the divine attributes was into (1) essential properties or attributes (ṣifāt bi-dhāt) and (2) properties of action (ṣifāt bi-fiʿl). Essential properties in turn are divided into negative (salbī) properties and ‘properties of maʿnī’, that is, properties with a positive (thubūtī) meaning, and so add some further sense to what it is to be God. Negative properties indicate God’s transcendence and include unity, eternity (qidam), permanence (baqāʾ), self-subsistence (qiyām bi nafsihi), dissimilarity to the creation (mukhālafa li-l-ḥawādith) and one may also include simplicity, although it is not usually included in the list. This list consists of ‘formal properties’ in the sense that they do not indicate any perfection per se but an absence of limitations on God, e.g., non-temporal, immutable and non-dependent (Burrell 1986: 46–50). In general, all of these negative properties express a dissimilarity to creation, since each one of them indicates how God is not like creation in a certain respect. The positive properties (properties of maʿānī) include power (qudra), will (irāda), knowledge (ʿilm), life (ḥayāt), speech (kalām), hearing (samʿ) and sight (baṣar). Properties of action include creation and the conservation of the universe, commanding, determining what happens (qadar) in the universe, etc. Positive properties and properties of action imply some similarity to creation. One may add as another sub-category of properties found in the Qur’an those that necessarily imply similarity with creaturely existence, like having a face, eyes, being seated, etc. In general later Muslim theologians and philosophers understood this last set of properties metaphorically. How to understand the sense and status of the divine essential properties with a positive meaning, however, remained an important problem for medieval Muslim scholars. The three most prominent and developed views were those of the Muʿtazilite theologians, the Ashʿarite and Maturidite theologians and the philosophers. Let us consider each school in turn.

6.2.1 The Muʿtazilites and theological language

Muʿtazilite theologians strongly emphasized both God’s dissimilarity to creation and his absolute oneness or simplicity. They ask one to consider the properties or perfections found in humans and also attributed to God, like, knowledge, power and will. As these properties exist in humans there is a distinction between the thing that possesses the perfections and the perfections themselves. Is the same true of God? The answer for the Muʿtazilites is a resounding ‘no!’ That is because if the divine attributes are distinct from the divine self, then there would be a multiplicity of divine, eternal entities, namely, the eternal and divine subject of attribution and the eternal and divine attributes. Consequently, they conclude, divine oneness and unity is lost and indeed one sinks into a form of polytheism far from the monotheism of Islam, a position that the Muʿtazilites found wholly untenable. For Muʿtazilites, the relation between God’s self and his attributes must be either one of negation (salb), namely, to deny that God is in any way limited in the way creatures are, or one of identity, namely, the divine attributes are not distinct from the divine self that bears those attributes.

In the case of interpreting divine attributes as negations, Muʿtazilites modified a version of the earlier Muslim apophaticists. For instance, to say that “God is knowing”, means that God is not ignorant”, or to say that “God is powerful” means that “God is not weak or not powerless”. The rest of the divine attributes are interpreted along the same lines (Ashʿarī MI: 155–77, 183–5 & 486 and ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 182–213). Such attributions are helpful in understanding and speaking about God in just they way that eliminating possible choices from a multiple-choice question is helpful. One with such negative knowledge is certainly in a better position than one who does not possesses it or is merely guessing or who wrongly believes that they know what is true. Moreover, informative, negative ascriptions do not require assigning to God a plurality of distinct positive properties, which in fact are more fitting of creatures. Thus, in the case of negative ascriptions, both God’s transcendence and simplicity are safeguarded.

As for identifying God’s self and attributes, Muʿtazilites began by acknowledging that human language cannot avoid distinguishing a subject and the properties predicated of that subject, and indeed the Qur’an addresses humans in human language. This feature is a limit of human language and our cognitive capacities but not of God. In the case of God, there is an identity of the subject and perfections predicated of the divine subject, even though human thinking and speaking cannot avoid distinguishing these as separate (Ashʿarī MI: 155–85 and ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 182–213). Unfortunately, identifying the divine properties of perfection with God Himself is not as simple as it might first appear. If divine properties are identical to God, then they must be identical to each other, and yet, for example, despite adages to the contrary, knowledge seems to be truly distinct from power. Additionally, if God is identical to his properties, God would be a property, which hardly seems like an object worthy of worship (Ghazālī Incoherence, discs. 5–6; cf. Plantinga 1980: 26–61 and McGinnis 2022).

One Muʿtazilite response to this objection was that of Abū Ḥāshim al-Jubbāʾī (d. 933). In order to explain, both why and how identifying positive properties with God does not lead to these absurdities, he argued that such properties are like states (aḥwāl) of an entity—e.g., sitting—which can differ depending upon how one considers them. Thus, if a state is taken on its own, it does not really exist out there—there is no ‘sitting’ that exists out there simply as sitting. Still, the fact that a state as some independent property does not exist out there does not mean that it is an absolutely non-existent; rather, it exists by virtue of the existence of the entity in that state. Thus, to say that “God is knowing” is to indicate a certain state of God and to say that “God is powerful” is to indicate another state of God, yet in neither case, does the state indicate what God himself is (ʿAbd al-Jabbār SUK: 128–9; also see Schmidtke 2016a: 162–4).

6.2.2 Ashʿarites/Maturidites and theological language

Ashʿarite and Maturidite theologians accused the Muʿtazilite theologians of all the problems following upon identifying the divine self and its attributes implies, such as the loss of distinction among the divine attributes and that ultimately God would be identical with a property. In opposition to the Muʿtazilites, the Ashʿarite and Maturidite theologians affirmed the distinction between the positive divine attributes, like knowledge, power and will, and God as the bearer of those attributes. Thus, the problem facing them was to explain how a multiplicity of divine things, and so a violation of divine oneness, does not ensue if God’s self and his distinct properties of perfection are all divine and eternal.

They adopted two main strategies to address this problem. One early strategy was to argue that properties predicated of God with some positive connotation—properties that are not simply negations—are neither different from nor identical to the divine self. One challenge to such a view is that it seems to violate the Law of Excluded Middle, for a divine attribute must either be identical to the divine self or not identical to it, in which case it would be different from the divine self. Two early Ashʿarite theologians, Bāqillānī and Juwaynī, apparently tried to adopt the Muʿtazilite theory of states to address this concern. Considered in themselves, the divine attributes are not identical to God, while considered relative to God’s possession of those attributes they are identical to God (Shahrastānī al-Milal, I 82 & Summa, 52–60; F. D. Rāzī Opinions, 61–4 and Taftāzānī Creed, 51–5).

Another way that Ashʿarites and Maturidites attempted to observe divine transcendence while upholding the meaningfulness of theological language was to emphasize that when an attribute is predicated of God, “God is not like others that have that attribute”. For example, al-Māturīdī, in his Kitāb al-Tawḥīd, begins by criticizing the anthropomorphic position by indicating certain shortcomings of conceiving God in a manner similar to creation (Māturīdī KT: 43–7; also see Rudolph 1996 [2015: 282–4]). He then explains how God is unlike creation. When properties predicated of creation are predicated of God, they are used in such a way that all the creaturely implications are stripped off; they are, as it were, a ‘winnowed concept’ (cf. Alston 1985). He also acknowledges that in order to know God, we must use the language that is used to talk about creatures. Accordingly, we predicate perfections of God, but take into account the principle that God is unlike creatures. For example, one may say “God knows but His knowledge is unlike, knowledge belonging to creatures”. This way of predicating attributes of God also found supporters among Muʿtazilite theologians, like ʿAbd al-Jabbar, who offers and defends the same strategy and formula. The strategy, however, has its challenges, for if one interprets ‘unlike’ in the strict sense, theological language seems to lose its informative function, while if it is not taken in a strict sense, it is not clear that divine transcendence is secured.

6.2.3 Philosophers and theological language

To varying degrees most, if not all, philosophers accepted some form of a negative theology when discussing the divine attributes (Kindī PWK: “On First Philosophy”, §§ XIX–XX; Fārābī Perfect State, ch. 1; and Avicenna MetaH: 8.4). For them, many, if not all, of the attributes ascribed to God are in fact merely descriptions of ways that God is unlimited or infinite in some respect or other. The philosophers’ general strategy is the same as the Muʿtazilites (see §6.2.1), where the basic idea, again, is that negative ascriptions, while informative, do not involve God’s necessarily possessing a plurality of positive attributes, which would jeopardize both divine simplicity and God’s transcendence.

Certain philosophers, like Ibn Sīnā and Ibn Rushd, likewise repeated the Muʿtazilite position that the divine self is identical with its essential attributes, like life, knowledge and power (Avicenna al-Najāt, 264 = MR07: 214 & MetaH: 1.7 & 8.4 and Ibn Rushd Tahafut, 299–301 [1954: 177–9]). Ibn Rushd notes that in a limited sense this identification of some entity with its essential attributes is true even of creatures. He provides the example of the definition of ‘man’ as a ‘rational animal’. Both rationality and animality are parts of the definition of ‘man’, but they are not distinct parts constituting the flesh-and-blood man in the world in the way that color and shape are. This analogy is not to suggest that one can have a definition of God, which Ibn Rushd flatly denies, but only to indicate that the way humans conceive an entity needs not perfectly reflect how that entity exists in the world. Indeed, Ibn Rushd goes further and provides a principled Aristotelian reason why no creature could ever form a definition of God or fully grasp the divinity (Ibn Rushd Tahafut, 345–6 [1954: 207]). He notes that according to Aristotelian principles to grasp what a thing is essentially, so as to be able to have a definition, requires that in some sense the intellect becomes the very thing grasped. Thus, since a finite human intellect can never grasp the infinite—indeed, to whatever extent it does grasp it, the very act of grasping it limits it so that it is finite in the human intellect—it can never form a definition of God nor fully grasp God’s essential existence. Thus, by necessity the human intellect conceives a plurality of attributes in its conception of God where in fact none exists. Admittedly, this discussion comes from one of Ibn Rushd’s popular works and not from one intended solely for the philosophers, and so whether it presents his considered view on the subject remains unclear. As for Ibn Sīnā, he is more forthcoming, arguing that all the various (positive) essential attributes said of God really are nothing more than alternative descriptions of a single reality, namely, necessary existence through itself (wājib al-wujūd bi-dhātihi), which is identical with and unique to God.

7. Ethics in Islam

In addition to the role of reason in justifying specific ethical judgments like what is morally right and wrong (al-ḥusn wa-l-qubḥ)—a discussion that mirrors those about reason and faith in Islam more generally (§1.2)—Muslim thinkers also were concerned with the ontological status of normative properties, like goodness and badness (see Emon 2010). With respect to this issue, one asks whether ethical facts exist independently of God or do they originate from and have their morally binding force as a result of a divine command. On the one hand, if the demands of morally good and bad actions are independent of God, then is God subject to those demands or not? If so, then does God observe them as a matter of necessity, in which case God’s power seems limited, or does he observe them as a matter of will or choice, in which case were he not to observe them would he be morally bad, since again these demands determine morally good and bad actions? On the other hand, if ethical dicta have their source and force in God’s commanding them, could God have commanded contrary to what he did and so invert right and wrong? For example, could God have commanded us to lie, in which case lying would have been obligatory and even morally good?

7.1 The Muʿtazilites on the morally right and wrong (al-ḥusn wa-l-qubḥ)

Muʿtazilite theologians defended the view that reason can acquire a knowledge of what is morally right and wrong, precisely because standards of right and wrong are purportedly objective and not arbitrary, and so are independent of God’s merely commanding them. Their views are laid out within the context of moral responsibility (see Hourani 1971 & 1985 and Vasalou 2008). For Muʿtazilite theologians, while perhaps reason cannot discover all of those actions for which one is religiously responsible in order to be a devout Muslim (such as praying five times daily or avoiding pork), one could come to know the more general ethical human responsibilities (such as avoiding lying and honoring one’s benefactor). This is because according to the Muʿtazilites, the properties that make an action good or bad, and for which one is morally responsible, are objective qualities relative to the action, to the consequence(s) of the action or to the agent of the action. These moral properties are objective precisely because we observe—whether through self-reflection or inference from the outward behavior of others—the benefit or the harm that an action causes. Thus, in a consequentialist vein, these Muʿtazilites relate the morally good with what is genuinely beneficial and the morally bad with what is harmful. Religion then confirms what reason knows about the moral status of an action and its consequence(s).

Since for these thinkers the ethical status of an action does not depend on a divine command, the question arises whether God is bound to behave ethically. ʿAbd al-Jabbār argued that ethical demands are binding and applicable not only to human agents but also to God and his action as well (ʿAbd al-Jabbār al-Taʿdīl: 52–70). Thus, he argues that if one denies that God is bound to do and to command the morally good, the commands and prohibitions given in scripture would be not only arbitrary but possibly even mutable and unreliable. For example, if one allowed that God could lie, then God or the prophets could be lying about what is required for salvation or what leads to damnation, in which case all the religious teaching would be under suspicion, a position which that ʿAbd al-Jabbār simply found unacceptable.

7.2 Responses to the Muʿtazilites

Most medieval Muslim thinkers, whether philosophers, theologians or Sufis, recognized some need for religion in order to possess a complete understanding of things ethical. Although they generally granted that humans have some intuitive recognition of virtues and what is morally good and bad, they emphasized that various human conditions limit our ability always to judge correctly about the ethical status of particular actions. One such limit is our inherent cognitive limits. Thus, the Sufi master Ibn ʿArabī complains that because the moral goodness or badness of actions may depend on certain conditions that human reason cannot comprehended, divine revelation is needed to inform us of the ethical status of our actions (Ibn al-ʿArabī al-Futūḥāt al-Makkiyya (b), I 459–60 & VII 326). For instance, what we ‘observe’ or judge to be a benefit may, all things considered, actually be harmful and similarly for our judgments about what is harmful. Only from a ‘God’s eye perspective’ can one be assured that in fact all things have been considered. In addition to our inherent cognitive limits, personal and social conditions affect the reliability of our ethical judgments. For example, the Sunni jurist, Ḥakīm al-Tirmidhī (d. ca. 869), noted that while reason has some share in making sound moral judgments, selfishness and the human desire for material benefits and pleasures hinders our ability always to reason correctly and objectively about what is ethically right and wrong (Tirmidhī Kitāb Ithbāt al-ʿilal, 67–78). Fārābī and Ibn Sīnā identify yet another human condition that requires religion to aid reason in determining right ethical rules. They maintained that ethical and political judgments are not a priori necessary truths, but well-known and commonly accepted specific rules (tafṣīlāt) acquired from attending to various practices over long periods of time. Thus, without knowing this socio-cultural history that religion preserves, one cannot know what is efficacious for living a good and virtuous life here on earth (Fārābī Perfect State, 77–8 and Avicenna MetaH: 10.2–4; also see Erlwein 2019).

Ashʿarite and Maturidite theologians in general vehemently criticized the Muʿtazilite position that reason alone can discover even general ethical demands incumbent upon humans and God alike. Their criticisms highlight the unacceptable theological implications of the Muʿtazilite position and the inherent limits of human reason. The most common criticism comes from the theological implication that God is compelled or obligated to do the good. Recall that the general Muʿtazilite position, as ʿAbd al-Jabbār articulated it, holds that good and bad are inherent properties of actions regardless of their agents, and so since God is good, God is morally compelled to do good. One obvious implication of this view is that if God cannot do bad actions, then God’s power is limited, and so God is not wholly omnipotent. From a theological point of view, Ashʿarite theologians found this implication unacceptable. Consequently, they denied that good and bad are inherent properties of actions and instead demanded that all ethical standards are dependent on what God himself commands.

As for criticisms against the Muʿtazilite position from the nature of human reason, Ashʿarite and Maturidites theologians availed themselves of all the argument we have already seen about the limits of our cognitive capacities and the constraints of our human condition. Thus, for example, Māturīdī presses the point that while humans may have some inkling of general ethical principles and what is morally good and bad, these judgments are always shaky given the frailty of our cognitive capacities. Consequently, religion is always needed to set our moral judgments on firm ground (Māturīdī KT: 346–51).

Ashʿarite and Maturidite scholars also added further arguments to the arsenal of criticisms against the Muʿtazilite ethical theory. For instance, in The Guide to Conclusive Proofs, Juwaynī puts forth an account of the good and bad, which in certain ways anticipates the moral theory of David Hume seven hundred years later (Juwaynī Proofs, 141–6). The Muʿtazilite position rests on two key elements: (1) that some actions are either inherently and rationally good or bad and (2) the implicit assumption that a rational agent must act in a rational way. Juwaynī simply denies that moral actions are inherently rational and that consequently there is anything irrational when one does a good or bad action. To be sure, actions can be obligatory and praiseworthy or prohibited and blameworthy, but not rational. Instead, continues Juwaynī, when through self-reflection or inference one recognizes that certain actions are seemingly beneficial and others harmful, one merely instinctually recognizes that those actions produce pleasure or pain. It is the human’s (and all animals’) natural instinct to seek pleasure and to avoid pain that motivates the action, not some inherent rational property of the object that reason grasps.

Ghazālī likewise rejected the Muʿtazilites’ position, which he claimed rested upon an ambiguity in the meanings of the terms ‘good’, ‘bad’ and ‘obligatory’ (wājib). For Ghazālī, when one says an action is ‘good’ or ‘bad’, those value judgments must be understood in terms of the intention or purpose relative to the agent or the one affected by the action. So understood, an action is good if it achieves the intended purpose and bad if it does not. While reason can direct and set one’s intentions, so can imagination and estimation (wahm) as well as our passions and appetites. These latter faculty, however, frequently fail to get at what is ultimately beneficial and harmful for us, and so they fail to get at what an agent would intend all things considered. Divine law provides precisely the ‘all-things-considered’ view.

As for human reason’s determining what is morally incumbent upon God, Ghazālī continues that since good and bad are related to the intentions of the agent, it is impossible for reason alone to determine whether God’s actions are good or bad since we simply do not know God’s intentions independent of revelation. Fakhr al-Dīn al-Rāzī developed a similar defense (F. D. Rāzī al-Maṭālib, 289–304; also see Shihadeh 2006 and 2021). Now instead of understanding good and bad relative to an agent’s intentions, Razi explains them in consequentialist terms: Actions are good when, relative to the agent or one affected by the action, they are beneficial or pleasurable and bad when they are harmful or painful. Since God is in no need of benefit and in no way can be pained, there is a sense in which his actions are simply beyond good and evil.

In light of their denial that there is any objective, God-independent standard of right and wrong to which God is beholden, Ashʿarites were accused of undermining God’s justice and making the goodness or badness of actions arbitrary. That is because if there were no limits to what God can morally command, then what God willed in the past to be good or bad, he could in the future will and so command to be contrariwise. Indeed, God may inflict pain on an innocent for no reason whatsoever, and yet that action would be good precisely because God commanded it. The Ashʿarites were not insensitive to this complaint. While both al-Juwaynī and Ghazālī insist on God’s absolute omnipotence and so God’s possibility to act arbitrarily, they also note that an action is only actually arbitrary if it is actually carried out, not if its occurrence is merely possible. Thus, a preferred Ashʿarite response to the arbitrariness complaint was that the possibility of the occurrence is not the occurrence of the possibility; God confirms via revelation that he gives reward for good actions and he may punish only those who do not fulfill what is decreed by revelation (Juwaynī Proofs, 157–64, 209–11 and Ghazālī Moderation, 172–88).


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