Supplement to Aristotle’s Ethics

Alternate Readings of Aristotle on Akrasia

That, at any rate, is one way of interpreting Aristotle’s statements. But it must be admitted that his remarks are obscure and leave room for alternative readings. It is possible that when he denies that the akratic has knowledge in the strict sense, he is simply insisting on the point that no one should be classified as having practical knowledge unless he actually acts in accordance with it. A practical knower is not someone who merely has knowledge of general premises; he must also have knowledge of particulars, and he must actually draw the conclusion of the syllogism. Perhaps drawing such a conclusion consists in nothing less than performing the action called for by the major and minor premises. Since this is something the akratic does not do, he lacks knowledge; his ignorance is constituted by his error in action. On this reading, there is no basis for attributing to Aristotle the thesis that the kind of akrasia he calls weakness is caused by a diminution of intellectual acuity. His explanation of akrasia is simply that pathos is sometimes a stronger motivational force than full-fledged reason.

This is a difficult reading to defend, however, for Aristotle says that after someone experiences a bout of akrasia his ignorance is dissolved and he becomes a knower again (1147b6–7). In context, that appears to be a remark about the form of akrasia Aristotle calls weakness rather than impetuosity. If so, he is saying that when an akratic person is subject to two conflicting influences—full-fledged reason versus the minimal rationality of emotion—his state of knowledge is somehow temporarily undone but is later restored. Here, knowledge cannot be constituted by the performance of an act, because that is not the sort of thing that can be restored at a later time. What can be restored is one’s full recognition or affirmation of the fact that this act has a certain undesirable feature, or that it should not be performed. Aristotle’s analysis seems to be that both forms of akrasia—weakness and impetuosity—share a common structure: in each case, one’s full affirmation or grasp of what one should do comes too late. The difference is that in the case of weakness but not impetuosity, the akratic act is preceded by a full-fledged rational cognition of what one should do right now. That recognition is briefly and temporarily diminished by the onset of a less than fully rational affect.

There is one other way in which Aristotle’s treatment of akrasia is close to the Socratic thesis that what people call akrasia is really ignorance. Aristotle holds that if one is in the special mental condition that he calls practical wisdom, then one cannot be, nor will one ever become, an akratic person (1152a6–7). For practical wisdom is present only in those who also possess the ethical virtues, and these qualities require complete emotional mastery. Anger and appetite are fully in harmony with reason, if one is practically wise, and so this intellectual virtue is incompatible with the sort of inner conflict experienced by the akratic person. Furthermore, one is called practically wise not merely on the basis of what one believes or knows, but also on the basis of what one does. Therefore, the sort of knowledge that is lost and regained during a bout of akrasia cannot be called practical wisdom. It is knowledge only in a loose sense. The ordinary person’s low-level grasp of what to do is precisely the sort of thing that can lose its acuity and motivating power, because it was never much of an intellectual accomplishment to begin with. That is what Aristotle is getting at when he compares it with the utterances of actors, students, sleepers, drunks, and madmen.

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