The contemporary world is pervasively artifactual. Even our most mundane, biologically based activities, such as eating, sleeping, and sex, depend on engagement with artifacts. Moreover, many of the plants and animals we encounter on a daily basis qualify as biological artifacts (Sperber 2007). But unlike language—which also pervades human life from top to bottom—artifacts as such are not the subject matter of any well-defined area of philosophical research. This is as much the case today as it has been throughout the history of Western philosophy (Dipert 1993).
Philosophy of technology might have played this role, but historically it has not done so. Although its roots reach back to the 19th century, philosophy of technology became a widely recognized specialization only in the second half of the 20th century. This early phase was dominated by so-called “humanities philosophy of technology” (Mitcham 1994). Heavily influenced by Martin Heidegger’s (1954 ) seminal essay, “The Question Concerning Technology”, this strain of philosophy of technology focuses primarily on the cultural and social effects of industrial and post-industrial technologies. In the last few decades, a companion strain of philosophy of technology, variously denominated “analytic” (Franssen, Lokhorst, & van de Poel 2018) or “engineering” (Mitcham 1994) philosophy of technology has come to prominence. It is focused on the genesis of technologies in the practices of modern science and engineering. Thus the net effect has been to focus philosophy of technology almost exclusively on modern and emerging technologies, rather than on artifacts in general.
The aim of this article, then, is to bring together discussions of artifacts occurring in sometimes far-flung areas of philosophy, as well as related discussions in other disciplines. Section 1 concerns questions of definition. Section 2 focuses on the metaphysics of artifacts. Section 3 turns to epistemological issues. There are also important normative issues concerning artifacts, but these are covered in other articles in this Encyclopedia, listed in the Related Entries section below.
- 1. Definition
- 2. Metaphysics
- 2.1 Do Artifacts Exist?
- 2.2 Artifact Kinds
- 2.3 Artifact Functions
- 2.4 Abstract Artifacts
- 3. Epistemology
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
A standard philosophical definition of “artifact”—often assumed even when not explicitly stated—is that artifacts are objects made intentionally, in order to accomplish some purpose (Hilpinen 1992; 2011). This definition is rooted ultimately in Aristotle’s distinction between things that exist by nature and things that exist by craft (Metaphysics 1033a ff., Nicomachean Ethics 1140a ff., Physics 192b ff.). Those that exist by nature have their origin in themselves, whereas those that exist by craft have their origin in the craftsperson—specifically, in the form of the thing as it exists in the mind of the maker. Both Aristotle and his contemporary descendants are primarily concerned to distinguish artifacts from objects that occur naturally, without any human intervention.
On this standard definition, artifacts must satisfy three conditions. They must be intentionally produced, thus ruling out unintended by-products of intentional actions, such as the shavings that result from woodcarving, as well as all naturally occurring objects, such as salamanders and stars. They must involve modification of materials, thus ruling out naturally occurring objects even when used intentionally for a purpose, such as sticks thrown to amuse your dog. And they must be produced for a purpose. This rules out intentionally modified objects that are nevertheless not intended to accomplish any further goal, such as the scraps produced when you intentionally, but for no particular reason, tear up a piece of paper before throwing it away. Presumably, then, these three conditions are intended to be individually necessary and jointly sufficient to distinguish artifacts from naturally occurring objects.
Three remarks about this definition are in order. First, it does not rule out the possibility that at least some things made by non-human animals are artifacts. Spider webs do have a purpose, for instance, and are clearly made rather than naturally occurring. But we may hesitate to attribute intention to the spiders, given the instinctive nature of their web-weaving behavior. Beavers, on the other hand, might be thought to intentionally construct dams in order to create ponds. This implication of the standard definition fits well with the burgeoning evidence for sophisticated cognition among non-human animals in general, and their ability to manufacture and use tools and other structures in particular (Shumaker, Walkup, & Beck 2011; Gould & Gould 2007). This is an important area of research in ethology and comparative psychology. However, for the purposes of this article we will focus on human artifacts.
Second, many things we would not ordinarily label as artifacts in English might nevertheless count under this definition. We usually reserve the term “artifact” for tangible, durable objects such as an archaeologist might unearth. But objects made intentionally for a purpose include many that are ephemeral or abstract. Candidates include musical performances (Dipert 1993), belief systems (Hilpinen 1995), actions and languages (Evnine 2016), software (Irmak 2012), normativity (Frugé 2022), establishments such as restaurants (Korman 2020), and artifact types (Reicher 2022).
Finally, this definition is peculiar to philosophers (Hilpinen 2011; Dipert 2014). In other disciplines the concern is more to investigate cognition and behavior involving objects quite generally, without carving out a domain of artifacts having special ontological status. Psychologists, for instance, are interested in how children develop categorizations of things, including artifacts as opposed to non-artifacts. But there is some evidence that notions of intention or function enter into this development only at quite a late stage, and that young children make relevant distinctions more on the basis of perceptual features such as shape or movement patterns (Keil, Greif, & Kerner 2007). Thus the standard philosophical definition of “artifact” might well be more of a hindrance than a help in the context of such investigations. Archaeologists and anthropologists, on the other hand, are concerned with the roles objects play in cultural processes quite generally. From this point of view, a discarded flint chip is just as important as the hide scraper from which it was struck, because debitage analysis—the study of such chips and other production debris—is invaluable for reconstructing knapping techniques and other aspects of production processes, including their cognitive underpinnings (Shott 2015; Schick & Toth 1993). Similarly, a sharp-edged shell used without modification as a hide scraper is just as important as the purpose-made flint scraper for understanding the culture in question. In these disciplines “artifact” tends to be absorbed into “material culture”—a much broader category—and is usually understood to include anything made and/or used by humans (Preston 2013; Kipfer 2007). As the examples above demonstrate, the making need not be intentional and the use need not involve modification of the object used. And if any objects of cultural significance are devoid of purpose or function, that condition of the philosophical definition, too, would fall by the wayside. Consequently, as the anthropologist Daniel Miller notes:
There is little point in attempting to distinguish systematically between a natural world and an artefactual one, except when we are concerned with the ways in which terms such as “natural” may have particular consequences or entailments, as when a commodity in the shops is labelled “natural” simply because a single ingredient, such as a chemical dye, has been deleted, or when something as apparently natural as radiation is taken to be antithetical to true “nature”. (Miller 1994, 398)
From the perspective of other disciplines, then, the philosophical insistence on a strict definition of “artifact” aimed at a bright-line distinction between naturally occurring objects and artifacts may well appear parochial.
This extra-disciplinary observation points us directly to the central problem for the standard philosophical definition of “artifact”. Along all three definitional dimensions we encounter a continuum of cases (Koslicki 2018; Grandy 2007; Sperber 2007). Paths, for example, are often created unintentionally just in virtue of people repeatedly traveling along the same straight line between points A and B—your kitchen and your vegetable garden, say. But what is the point of saying that such a path is not an artifact, whereas an identical one that was created intentionally by exactly the same process is? Moreover, what would it take to make the erstwhile non-artifactual path into an artifact? Would it be enough to notice and approve it? Or would I have to intentionally maintain it, by sweeping it clean of leaves, for instance?
Similar difficulties arise with regard to modification, which is clearly a matter of degree. If I bring an attractive shell home from a walk on the beach and put it to use as a paperweight, does the transport count as modification? If not, would washing the shell before using it be enough? Or polishing it to bring out the color of its markings? A further complication is that many uses to which naturally occurring objects are put cause modifications. An unmodified stone used as a hammer soon acquires a spherical shape (Schick & Toth 1993, 130 ff.). At what point did it first count as modified, since even the first strike would break off some fragments? Or do these use-induced modifications not count for satisfying the definition at all? If not, why not? The stone is certainly being used intentionally for a purpose, so the rest of the definition is satisfied.
Finally, Dan Sperber (2007) argues that even function is continuous between nature and culture. He begins with the observation that what he calls biological artifacts—domesticated plants and animals, for the most part—have both biological and cultural functions. But they carry out their cultural functions in virtue of carrying out their biological functions, and vice versa. Take seedless grapes. Their seedlessness might seem to make them purely artifactual, since the reproductive function of the fruit appears to be lost along with the seeds. But in fact, Sperber argues, the fruit retains the biological function of attracting us to eat the fruit and then spread the plant—not by dispersing seeds, as with seeded grapes, but by propagating the grapevines vegetatively. This coincidence of biological and cultural functions in domesticates shows that far from being the locus of a divide between nature and culture, the realm of domestication is the locus of their imperceptible merger.
Sperber concludes that “artifact” as a theoretical term cannot be usefully defined, as any attempt to do so will be frustrated by the continua detailed above. We may call this the continuum problem. This concern is echoed by Kathrin Koslicki (2018), who notes that the common reliance on creators’ intentional activity to distinguish artifacts from naturally occurring objects inevitably leaves us with objects such as unintended by-products and naturally occurring objects pressed into service for human purposes which do not seem to fall readily into either category. She does not think that current approaches in metaphysics have the resources to deal with such puzzles about artifacts, and concludes that further development of these approaches is necessary. For Sperber—whose training is in anthropology—the lesson is that the social sciences simply do not need “artifact” as a term of art. But philosophers, and some other social scientists, have reacted to the continuum problem by doubling down on their classification efforts. Risto Hilpinen (2011), following the anthropologist Wendell Oswalt (1973; 1976), uses the term “naturefact” for naturally occurring objects used intentionally, but without modification, for some purpose. Naturefacts thus lie between naturally occurring objects and artifacts on the continuum. Hilpinen also suggests that what he calls “residue”—modified but unintended by-products of productive activity, such as sawdust—are a conceptually distinct category of objects also lying somewhere between artifacts and naturally occurring objects. (A terminological note: in archaeology, “naturefact” is more usually used to mean an object that is in fact the result of purely natural processes, but is difficult to distinguish from an intentionally modified object. This is a problem that bedevils paleoarchaeologists studying stone tools, in particular (Schnurrenberger & Bryan 1985). Archaeologists also sometimes distinguish artifacts from ecofacts—organic or inorganic remains of archaeological significance that have undergone no, or minimal, modification by humans, such as animal bones, stored grain, pollen, charcoal, and the like. Naturefacts and residues in Hilpinen’s sense are usually included in the ecofact category.)
Randall Dipert (1993) proposes a slightly different, triadic classification.
- Instruments—naturally occurring objects that have been intentionally used for a purpose, but not modified, such as stones used as hammers.
- Tools—intentionally modified instruments, such as stones shaped and polished for use as hammers.
- Artifacts—tools intended to be recognized as tools, such as claw hammers made from standard materials and with a standardized, easily recognizable shape.
This continuum problem for artifacts is really just a version of a well-known problem besetting classification schemes in the natural and social sciences. The traditional assumption was that classification is an exclusively ontological operation. What we are doing, it is often said, is carving the world at its joints. On this assumption, a continuum is a problem because it suggests that there are no joints to guide our carving efforts. A continuum is thus incompatible with classification schemes understood as grounded solely in objective features of the world, and with essentialist understandings of natural kinds. We can, of course, carve the continuum up any way we like, but this must be understood as in part a pragmatic operation, not a strictly ontological one reflecting only the fixed essences of things. This problem has loomed large in discussions of natural kinds in philosophy of science, as bothersome continua are increasingly identified in both natural and social sciences. Muhammad Khalidi (2013, Chapter 5) details cases in the chemical, biological, physiological and social sciences where widely accepted kinds are “fuzzy”, or have graded membership, for instance. In response, he advocates an account of natural kinds that incorporates the influence of human interests and epistemic concerns, while still insisting that these interests and concerns are constrained by objective features of the world identifiable by science. Khalidi’s account joins a growing list of non-essentialist accounts of natural kinds, according to which kinds are real, but their reality does not require that they be defined in total isolation from human beings, their activities, interests, epistemic projects, pragmatic concerns, and so on (Dupré 1993; Boyd 1999; Reydon 2014; Kendig 2016).
Understood in this way, classification schemes such as those proposed by Hilpinen and Dipert could, in principle, constitute a perfectly adequate response to the continuum problem. It would, of course, be nice to have a commonly accepted scheme in philosophy—or better yet, a scheme shared with the other disciplines that study artifacts and material culture. But even failing that, classification schemes grounded in clear methodological considerations would be helpful, even if the methodological considerations varied from scheme to scheme. Unfortunately, it appears that the main consideration driving the schemes proposed so far is merely the desire to shore up the traditional ontological distinction between artifacts and naturally occurring objects. This leaves the methodological challenge voiced by Sperber and Miller unanswered. What do we need this distinction for? Does it help us understand how objects function in human life and culture, or does it actually hinder this understanding? If the latter, would other distinctions serve us better? The continuum problem does not, pace Sperber, prove that there are no good methodological considerations in favor of maintaining the ontological divide between artifacts and naturally occurring objects. But in light of the “epistemological” (Reydon 2014) or “practice” (Kendig 2016) turn in the recent literature on natural kinds, it does show that we cannot assume that “artifact” itself is a pure, natural kind, identifiable on ontological grounds alone. In short, there is no guarantee that the standard definition of “artifact” with which we started this section expresses anything like a traditional essence. We are thus left with more questions than answers in the matter of definition.
Discussions of the metaphysics of artifacts have typically arisen only in broader investigative contexts in which they are not the primary focus of attention. In particular, the metaphysics of ordinary objects has generated a significant literature in recent years, and the puzzles about existence around which it revolves do apply to artifacts, but equally to the vast array of other ordinary objects, like stones, stars, trees, jellyfish and deer. Similarly, reflection on artifact kinds has been largely overshadowed by the vast literature on natural kinds, and discussions of artifact function exist on the periphery of the much more prominent discussions of biological function. Finally, questions about the existence of abstract artifacts have arisen in the context of investigations into the ontology of works of art. We will take up these topics in turn.
2.1 Do Artifacts Exist?
Skepticism about the existence of artifacts goes back at least to Aristotle. For him, the primary existents are substances—independent things on which all other things depend. Individual things, such as horses or houses, are compounds of matter and form, but it is not entirely clear whether the substance of the thing is the form, the matter, or the compound (Shields 2022). That said, Aristotle is clearly ambivalent as to whether artifacts have what it takes. In the Physics (192b8–39), for instance, he says that some things, such as chipmunks or geraniums, exist by nature and that each such thing is a substance. He follows this up in the Metaphysics (1043b15–25), saying that perhaps only such things as exist by nature are substances, thus implying that things made by art, such as pots or pincushions, are not. Exactly why Aristotle thinks artifacts are not substances is not entirely clear—he suggests different reasons in different places (Katayama 1999, 18–19). But it is clear that he doubts that they really exist in the full sense enjoyed by things that exist by nature.
Aristotle’s invidious ontological downgrading of artifacts fed straight into 20th century trends in metaphysics that tended to downgrade ordinary objects in general (Thomasson 2009). Even after the baleful anti-metaphysical influence of logical positivism waned, metaphysics took itself to be merely working out the details of what the dominant scientific theories, particularly in physics and biology, say exists. Since there is no science of artifacts, let alone of sticks and stones and rivers, such ordinary objects had to be eliminated from our ontologies. On the radical left fringe of the eliminativist spectrum is a startling long list of theorists who deny the existence of ordinary objects tout court, including even living organisms and persons (for the list, see Korman 2015, 19–23). In the moderate middle are theorists such as Trenton Merricks (2001), who denies the existence of artifacts and other inanimate macrophysical objects, as well as living organisms, with the exception of humans; Peter van Inwagen (1990), who denies the existence of artifacts and other inanimate macrophysical objects, but accepts the existence of living organisms, including humans; and Simon Evnine (2016), who denies the existence of inanimate natural objects, but accepts the existence of artifacts and living organisms.
The arguments for these varieties of eliminativism are themselves various, but they revolve around what Daniel Korman (2015, 4–7) calls debunking arguments. Why do we think that ordinary objects exist? Only because they correspond to our human needs and interests, as embodied in our biology and enshrined in our cultural practices. But there is no good reason to think that the objects we pick out in accordance with our needs and interests correspond to the objects that actually exist in reality. Debunking arguments go back to the very beginning of Western philosophy. Parmenides declared that what truly is—Being, or the One—cannot be multiple, changing and transient after the fashion of ordinary objects. Plato followed up with the doctrine of the eternal and unchanging Forms, which truly exist, and of which ordinary objects are at best ontologically deficient copies. Thus the idea that we have no good reason to think that ordinary objects exist is entrenched in our metaphysical tradition.
On the other hand, prima facie grounds for rehabilitating ordinary objects also have ancient roots in atomism, which holds that macrophysical objects are composed of particles which, while multiple, do meet the other criteria for true being laid down by Parmenides. On the assumption that composition follows regular principles, then, ordinary objects may be said to exist insofar as they are wholes composed of existing proper parts. This brings us face to face with what Peter van Inwagen (1990, 21 ff.) calls the Special Composition Question—under what conditions do unified wholes arise out of parts? Answering this question has turned out to be far from simple, and has latterly given rise to mereology, a special area of metaphysics devoted to investigating the principles of composition. Most of the other main arguments against the existence of artifacts and other ordinary objects reflect problems arising in the course of these investigations. For example, there is the material constitution problem. An artifact such as a cookie is made out of dough. So everywhere there is a cookie there is a coincident lump of (baked) dough, which shares all of its parts with the cookie. But this coincidence violates our intuitions about the identity of ordinary objects. Considerations of this sort have been used by van Inwagen (1990, 124 ff.) and others to argue that there are no artifacts. Cookie makers do not bring anything new into existence; they merely move pre-existing elementary things around. Thus, while debunking arguments show that we have no good reason to believe ordinary objects do exist, mereological problems show that we have good reasons to believe they do not.
A growing chorus of voices has been raised against this ontological downgrading of ordinary objects, several of whom have been especially concerned to rehabilitate artifacts. Lynne Rudder Baker’s Metaphysics of Everyday Life (2007) foregrounds artifacts as paradigmatic examples of existing ordinary objects. Baker subscribes to a constitution view, according to which material things are non-reductively made up of other material things.
The fundamental idea of constitution is this: when a thing of one primary kind is in certain circumstances, a thing of another primary kind—a new thing, with new causal powers—comes to exist. When an octagonal piece of metal is in circumstances of being painted red with white marks of the shape S-T-O-P, and is in an environment that has certain conventions and laws, a new thing—a traffic sign—comes into existence. (Baker 2007, 32)
Importantly, for Baker artifacts are intention-dependent (ID) objects—they cannot exist in the absence of beings with relevant intentional states. Thus the cosmic ray striking a sheet of scrap metal in the proverbial swamp and turning it red with white lettering has not created any artifact at all, let alone a stop sign. Baker builds the intentional states into the specification of the required circumstances in terms of a relationship between the construction materials and the intentions and knowledge of the constructor. For a stop sign to exist, for example, it must be constructed from metal and paint by someone who understands the function of stop signs, knows how to construct one, intends to construct one to fulfill this function, and is reasonably successful in executing her intentions (2007, 53–55). This view puts Baker at odds with Aristotle’s view that only things with an internal principle of movement truly exist, as well as with the common view that ID objects do not truly exist. Both of these views are aimed at first distinguishing natural from artificial objects and then downgrading the latter. Baker argues that the distinction itself is suspect, both in light of technologies such as genetic engineering and the natural status of the beings with intentional states who create artifacts (2007, 59–66). In short, the whole process of making artifacts is internal to nature and cannot be legitimately considered separate from it by those inclined to be judgmental in ontological matters.
Simon Evnine (2016) argues for a version of hylomorphism that is very similar to the constitution view espoused by Baker. Evnine abandons traditional notions of form and focuses instead on the intertwining of the causes that bring a thing into existence and make it the thing it is. Artifacts thus take pride of place in his metaphysics, because, he claims, they typically have a specifiable origin in the intentions of a maker who chooses material and works it up in accordance with an envisioned function and shape. Evnine’s account of organisms as existents rests on an analogy between this paradigmatic intentional making and organic development. But he does not try to account for non-living natural objects, whose existence he denies. On the other hand, Evnine deploys his account of artifacts in an interesting way to argue that actions are artifacts—artifactual events rather than artifactual objects. Higher-level actions such as turning on a light are governed by the agent’s intention and constructed ultimately out of the “matter” of basic, bodily actions.
Amie Thomasson (2007a; and for a succinct summary, 2009) takes a different tack, arguing that the existence of artifacts and other ordinary objects is established by the connection between our terms on the one hand, and facts about the world on the other. On her view, the meaning of our terms includes a specification of the conditions for their application. If we then determine empirically that the application conditions of a term are met, the thing to which it refers exists. For example, “spoon” refers to a utensil intentionally made by humans for the purposes of stirring, serving and eating food, consisting of a shallow bowl with a long handle. A quick check of any kitchen will assure you that these conditions are in fact satisfied, and that spoons therefore exist. On the other hand, “devil’s tuning fork” refers to an implement consisting of three cylindrical prongs on one end and two rectangular prongs on the other, intentionally made by devils for the purpose of tuning their instruments, one would suppose. Check the music studios and the concert halls as thoroughly as you like, you will not find these conditions satisfied. So devil’s tuning forks do not exist. Thomasson’s approach does not privilege artifacts as paradigmatic existents the way Baker’s and Evnine’s accounts do. But she makes the intention-dependent status of artifacts equally comprehensible, since the intentional states of makers figure prominently in the application conditions of concepts.
2.2 Artifact Kinds
If artifacts do not exist, then the kinds into which we classify them—pillow, book, painting, flowerpot—are not real kinds on a par with natural kinds, such as oak, owl or anole. But questions about the reality and nature of artifact kinds also arise for those who do take artifacts to exist. As we have seen, these theorists resist the objection that the mind-dependence of artifacts compromises their ontological status. But this objection resurfaces with regard to artifact kinds. The mind-dependence of artifacts implies, at a minimum, that an account of artifact kinds will be very different from an account of natural kinds. This implication is resisted by Crawford Elder (2004; 2007), who seeks to establish the existence of artifacts on the basis of a realist account of kinds. On Elder’s view, artifact kinds and many natural kinds are equally copied kinds, and equally mind-independent. A copied kind is defined by a set of properties that naturally cluster together—a distinctive shape or make-up, a proper function established by a mechanism that copies things of that shape on the basis of successful performance, and a historically proper placement. For example, cats’ whiskers are distinctively shaped organs that are copied from cat to cat by a biologically based reproductive mechanism because they help cats get around in the dark by performing successfully as touch receptors strategically located with respect to the cat’s other bodily parts. Similarly, floor lamps are distinctively shaped artifacts that are copied from household to household by a socially based reproductive mechanism because they help humans get around in the dark by performing successfully as light sources strategically located with respect to other household furniture. Human intentional states do, of course, figure in the copying process for artifacts. However, Elder argues:
[C]reation does not begin with the artisan’s intending what he does. Rather, the essential properties that his product will inherit stem from a history of function and of copying that began well before the artisan undertook his work. This history reaches forward through the artisan’s motions—it shapes his shaping. Its existence and its efficacy are independent, largely or even entirely, of the artisan’s will. (Elder 2004, 142–143)
All copied kinds are thus natural, mind-independent kinds whose clustered features we discover rather than invent.
One acknowledged problem with Elder’s account is that many erstwhile artifact kinds turn out not to be copied kinds. Neckties, for example, do not qualify because they do not appear to have a proper function (Elder 2004, 158–159). But his account does have the virtue of drawing out useful analogies between natural kinds and artifact kinds. A number of other accounts also focus on analogies between (at least some) natural kinds and (at least some) artifact kinds (Lowe 2014; Franssen & Kroes 2014). The underlying motive for pushing this analogy, clearly, is the fear that artifact kinds are not real if human intentional states and/or classificatory practices are constitutive of what kinds there are.
Amie Thomasson does not share this fear. In a series of important papers (2003; 2007b; 2014), she points out that realists about kinds are not, in fact, forced to choose between showing that artifact kinds can be understood on the mind-independent model of natural kinds, or denying that artifact kinds are real. There is a third option—denying that mind-independence is the touchstone of reality. Thomasson then builds human intentions and their historical connections into her account of artifact kinds.
Necessarily, for all x and all artifactual kinds K, x is a K only if x is the product of a largely successful intention that (Kx), where one intends (Kx) only if one has a substantive concept of the nature of Ks that largely matches that of some group of prior makers of Ks (if there are any) and intends to realize that concept by imposing K-relevant features on the object. (Thomasson 2003, 600)
Thus for Thomasson, human intentions and concepts are actually constitutive of artifact kinds. Thomasson (2014) also objects to the common assumption that concepts of artifact kinds revolve exclusively around intended function. While it is true that in English we often label artifact kinds in accordance with function—flashlight, bedspread, pincushion, frying pan, and so on—artifacts actually have an array of features that figure in their concepts. These include structural or perceptible features, for example, that are also often reflected in our terms—armchair, tripod, zebra crossing (definitely not a function designation!), fork, and so on. Most importantly for Thomasson, they also include normative features concerned with how that kind of artifact is to be treated or regarded. Although sponges and paper towels can both be used to wipe up spills, it is normal to dispose of the paper towel, but to clean the sponge and reuse it.
A distinct approach to artifact kinds is proposed by Thomas Reydon (2014). He points out that the nature of natural kinds is currently in play in philosophy of science. Their mind-independence is traditionally predicated on their having essences. But essentialism ran into trouble when Darwin showed that species—up to that point the very paradigm of natural kinds—are historically fluid and have no clear boundaries. Similar problems have now been recognized even in the kinds of chemistry and physics (Khalidi 2013). Nevertheless, grouping natural objects into kinds does license useful inferences and ground successful explanations. This has led to what Reydon calls an “epistemological turn”.
The principal criteria for being a natural kind used to be metaphysical: a kind is a natural kind if and only if it really exists in the world…independently of human consciousness, human interests, and human practices, and is associated with a particular kind essence…. On the alternative approach the principal criteria for being a natural kind no longer are metaphysical but epistemological: what counts is being useful in human epistemic practices, such as inference and explanation, by corresponding in some way (which is still to be explicated) to the state of affairs in nature. (Reydon 2014, 132)
Rather than assimilating artifact kinds to natural kinds by showing that artifacts are actually mind-independent in some way, as Elder and others have tried to do, the epistemological turn suggests that since natural kinds were never mind-independent to begin with, there is in principle no barrier to a unified account of artifact and natural kinds.
Finally, we should note that questions have been raised about the legitimacy of the kind—or perhaps more precisely, the category—“artifact” itself. We have already touched on this in Section 1 above, in the context of the definitional issues raised by the continuum problem. This discussion clearly reflects Reydon’s epistemological turn in that it foregrounds methodological considerations and lets the ontological chips fall where they may. We will discuss methodological issues in Section 3.
2.3 Artifact Functions
Function is a salient feature of artifacts. Clearly there would be no good reason to keep so many of them around unless they did something for us. Function is also a salient feature of biological traits. Accounts of biological function, which now comprise a large literature, have inspired many accounts of artifact function. But unlike organisms, artifacts are made to serve human purposes, so human intentional states must be considered. Accounts of artifact function can be usefully categorized in terms of the role they give to intentions in the establishment of functions (Preston 2009; Houkes & Vermaas 2010). At one end of the spectrum are accounts that revolve around human intentions, while at the other end are accounts that focus on non-intentional factors; in between are a variety of accounts that mix intentional and non-intentional factors in various proportions.
Karen Neander (1991) distinguishes artifact function sharply from biological function. Natural selection acting over the long course of evolutionary history establishes specific effects of biological traits as their functions, in virtue of the reproduction of those traits for those effects. For example, the wings of birds are the result of eons of selection for their effect as airfoils. In contrast, intentional human selection, acting with knowledge and foresight, establishes specific effects of artifacts as their functions immediately, without any reference to a history of reproduction for those effects.
It is enough, in the case of intentional selection, if the designer believes or hopes that the artifact will have the desired effect and selects it for that purpose. (Neander 1991, 462)
For example, an individual who designs a hammer, or who uses the heel of her shoe to pound in a nail, believing these items to have the capacity to deliver a hard blow and intending to use that effect for her purposes, endows them with the relevant function forthwith. John Searle (1995) calls such artifact functions “agentive” functions to distinguish them from the “non-agentive” functions of biological traits. Searle also distinguishes a special sub-category of agentive functions which he terms “status” functions. These are related in a relatively arbitrary way to the physical structure of the artifact. Money, for example, runs the gamut from gold ingots to bitcoin. Its functions—medium of exchange, measure of value, and so on—are imposed on these physical bearers by our collective acceptance of them as money. According to Searle, the intentional states constituting this collective acceptance create an “institutional fact” that would not exist without collective human agency. Status functions thus illustrate not only the creative capacity of human intentionality already foregrounded in Neander’s account, but also its typically collective nature in the case of artifact function. Searle supplies an account of collective intentionality to underwrite this feature. Other authors who subscribe to intentionalist theories of artifact function include Randall Dipert (1993), Peter McLaughlin (2001), Lynne Rudder Baker (2007), and Simon Evnine (2016).
Ruth Millikan (1984) offers a general theory of function that, in the case of artifacts, mixes intentional and non-intentional elements. Her main interest is in proper functions—what a biological trait or artifact is supposed to do, and is malfunctioning if it cannot do. On Millikan’s view, what she calls direct proper functions, whether biological or artifactual, are established by a history of selection and reproduction for the effect constituting the function. So what is essential for the establishment of an artifact’s function is whether or not its ancestors—artifacts of that kind—were reproduced for that effect. This is what the artifact is supposed to do, even if it is not able to do it because of damage or an unfavorable environment. Thus far Millikan’s account is non-intentional, for the role of human intentional states is merely one factor in the implementation of the reproduction process. However, the other half of Millikan’s account concerns what she calls derived proper functions. These are functions that are established by something that has the direct proper function of producing something else to accomplish a purpose. Millikan’s favored example of biological derived proper function is a novel shade of brown sported by a chameleon. It has no history of selection and reproduction for the effect of camouflaging the chameleon, and yet we want to say that that is its proper function. And we can say so, according to Millikan, because the color-alteration mechanism possessed by chameleons has the direct proper function of changing chameleons’ skin color to camouflage them by matching their surroundings. Thus this novel shade of brown does have the derived proper function of camouflaging the chameleon. Derived proper functions in the realm of artifacts bring intention back to the fore. On Millikan’s view, intentional states have evolutionarily established direct proper functions. The direct proper function of intentions is to produce something else to accomplish whatever purpose the intention incorporates. Thus, if you intend to produce a can opener, the execution of your intention brings into existence a device having the derived proper function of opening cans. Even if this device works in a completely novel way, and even if it is not capable of performing as envisioned, opening cans is still what it is supposed to do. Usually, the direct and derived proper functions of artifacts coincide—in the case of a standard can opener, for instance, we have both a history of selection and reproduction and a current intention to reproduce yet another can opener. But in the case of novel prototypes, especially, it is intention alone that establishes the (derived) proper function.
Wybo Houkes and Pieter Vermaas (Houkes & Vermaas 2004; 2010; Vermaas & Houkes 2003) also have a mixed theory, although intentionalist factors predominate, in contrast to Millikan’s focus on non-intentionalist history of reproduction. Their approach is to derive a theory of artifact function from a theory of artifact use and design.
On our theory, an artifact function is a capacity, supposed or actual, which has a preferential status in the context of certain actions and beliefs. It is therefore a highly relational property, which supervenes on both the actual physical makeup of an artifact and on the beliefs and actions of human agents, designers as well as users. (Houkes & Vermaas 2004, 67)
Houkes and Vermaas focus on the use plan formulated by designers as establishing the function of the artifact in the first instance. This is the predominant intentionalist element in their account. But on their view, this use plan must be supported by a justification that the plan will realize the function, and this requires knowledge of the causal roles of the physicochemical capacities of the artifact. Through this required justification the actual physical structure of the artifact constrains the intentions articulated in the use plan. This is a non-intentionalist element. In addition, they require a historical element in the form of the communication of the use plan from designer to user and subsequently from user to user. They refer to this element as “evolutionary”, in an apparent reference to cultural evolution, but clearly this element, too, is primarily intentional since the evolution is carried out in a series of intentional communications. Houkes and Vermaas refer to their theory as the ICE (Intention, Causal role, Evolution) theory of artifact function. Other mixed theories include those of Paul Griffiths (1993) and Philip Kitcher (1993).
At the lonelier, non-intentionalist end of the spectrum is Beth Preston’s (1998; 2013) account. Her initial concern is to advance a pluralist theory of artifact function according to which artifacts have both proper functions and what Preston calls system functions. For example, the proper function of plates is to hold food for serving or eating. But they function equally well as saucers for potted plants, or in a stack to weight down tofu or eggplant slices to extract the moisture. For proper function, Preston relies on Millikan’s account of direct proper function, but without the added element of derived proper function that brings intention back in. For system function, she relies on Robert Cummins’ (1975) theory of biological function, according to which function is established by the causal role a component plays in a system. Neither Millikan’s nor Cummins’ account is intrinsically intentionalist, since they are designed to fit both the biological and the artifactual cases. Preston resists reformulating them in intentionalist terms, while acknowledging that in the artifact case human intentions and other intentional states do play a role in implementing the history of selective reproduction and the system context, respectively. In support of this resolutely non-intentionalist stance, Preston argues that human intentions do not arise in a vacuum, but are reproduced in and through the process by which material culture, with its myriad of functional artifacts, is reproduced. Intentions to make plates are reproduced in plate cultures as surely as the plates themselves; and only in cultures with both potted plants and plates can intentions to use plates as pot saucers form.
The only viable view is one that sees human purposes and the proper functions of items of material culture indissolubly linked in patterns of use and reproduction. Thus, it no longer seems reasonable to ask which came first, the purpose or the proper function. Both are produced and reproduced through the self-same social process. (Preston 2013, 206)
Preston is joined here by Crawford Elder (2004), whose account of copied kinds, as we noted above, similarly characterizes human intentions as themselves dependent on the copying process rather than initiating and controlling it.
The theories discussed in this section encounter a number of important problems in accounting for function phenomena in the artifact realm. One such problematic phenomenon is the distinction between proper and non-proper functions. This does occur in the biological realm—pigeon beaks did not evolve to peck buttons for a food reward, for example—but it is relatively rare. In material culture, it is ubiquitous. Humans are just very good at adopting whatever artifact will accomplish their purposes, regardless of its proper function. Stop a random person in the street and ask—she will have a story. Intentionalist approaches have more difficulty making this distinction, because for these views human intentions are the only mechanism for establishing functions, and this elides the distinction unless some difference can be discerned in the intentions themselves. Authors who have discussed this issue recently include Wybo Houkes and Pieter Vermaas (2010), Beth Preston (2013) and Simon Evnine (2016). Another problem is accounting for malfunction. Just as any theory of representation must account for misrepresentation, any theory of function must say something about cases of failure to perform, and whether or not that failure is a malfunction or something else. Addressing this issue depends to some extent on the distinction between proper and non-proper functions, because malfunction only seems an appropriate designation in the case of failure to perform a proper function—failure to do what the artifact is supposed to do, in other words. This issue is especially important for the philosophy of technology and engineering side of the artifact debates, where understanding the epistemology of problem solving and innovation depends in part on understanding failure to function and how to learn from and deal with it. Authors who have covered this issue include Neander (1995), Baker (2007), Franssen (2006; 2009), Houkes and Vermaas (2010) and Kroes (2012).
A third problem is how to account for the functions—if any—of novel prototypes. Non-intentional accounts have more difficulty in this case, for a truly novel prototype has no history of selection and reproduction; and if it does not work, as many prototypes in fact do not, then function established in terms of systemic causal role or physicochemical capacities is not possible either. This problem is one of the main motivations for Millikan’s (1984) introduction of derived proper function, since designer intention seems to be the only way unsuccessful novel prototypes could acquire any kind of function at all. The non-intentionalist then is caught between biting the bullet—unsuccessful novel prototypes just do not have functions—or introducing an ad hoc intentionalist element. This issue has been canvassed by Preston (1998; 2003; 2013), Millikan (1999), Vermaas and Houkes (2003) and Kroes (2012). A related problem is how to account for so-called phantom functions (Preston 2013)—the functions of artifacts that are constitutionally incapable of ever fulfilling them. Talismans to ensure fertility, for example, are now widely believed in Western culture to have no efficacy, but it is difficult to escape the intuition that ensuring fertility is nevertheless their proper function. Here again, it is the non-intentionalist who is caught flatfooted. Although artifacts like fertility talismans are indeed reproduced for a purpose, the standard requirement for establishing proper function is that the artifact be selected for reproduction on the basis of successful performance. Similarly, function established by systemic causal role requires that the artifact actually perform the relevant causal role. Worse yet, the option of just biting the bullet and agreeing that such artifacts have no functions is nowhere near as plausible as in the case of unsuccessful novel prototypes because of the prevalence of talismans, amulets, religious artifacts, inefficacious medicines and supplements, and the like. Authors who have addressed this issue include Griffiths (1993), Preston (1998; 2013), Thomasson (2009), Parsons (2016) and Holm (2017).
2.4 Abstract Artifacts
Many works of art are typical artifacts, ontologically no more or less mysterious than hats or hacksaws. Vermeer’s Girl with a Pearl Earring has extraordinary aesthetic qualities, but otherwise it is just a concrete, spatiotemporal object, created by someone and straightforwardly subject to change and destruction. Not so with Amy Beach’s Gaelic Symphony, which we hesitate to identify with its performances, singly or collectively, and which therefore does not appear to be located in time and space. However, it does purport to have a creator, and may perhaps be destroyed if all traces of its performances and scores are wiped away. A symphony is a so-called repeatable work of art, that is, a work with multiple instances. Performance arts of all kinds fall into this category, but so do cast sculptures, limited edition prints, art photographs, films, and the like. So understanding the ontology of repeatable works is a central task for philosophy of art.
The initial difficulty is that such works do not fit neatly into the standard ontological bifurcation between concrete, spatiotemporal objects such as hats and hacksaws and abstract, eternal objects such as numbers and sets. Like concrete objects, but unlike abstract objects, repeatable works of art appear to be created and may change or be destroyed. Unlike concrete objects, but like abstract objects, they do not appear to be located in space and time. Amie Thomasson (1999; 2004; 2006) sought to resolve this difficulty by proposing an intermediate ontological category of abstract artifacts—abstract in that they are not located in space and time; artifactual in that they are intentionally created and can be destroyed. Thomasson originally proposed this new category as part of her theory of fictional characters, but she noted its usefulness to the analysis of the literary works those characters inhabit, repeatable works of art in general, and perhaps other social objects as well. (For application to repeatable works of art, see the essays in Art and Abstract Objects (Mag Uidhir 2012). Applications to other social objects include software (Irmak 2012), establishments (Korman 2020), and normativity (Frugé 2022).)
However, further difficulties beset the positing of abstract artifacts. It is commonly thought that abstract objects are not just non-spatiotemporal, but non-causal. Our causal commerce is with their instances, not with the abstract objects themselves. But this makes it hard to understand how abstract objects could possibly be created. Erik Satie could certainly create an instance of his Gymnopédies by playing it on his piano, but it is unclear in what sense he could be the author of this musical work as an abstract object separate from its instances. According to Jerrold Levinson (1980), the last decades of the 20th century saw a near consensus that musical works are abstract objects of a more familiar sort—structural types that exist eternally and without change, independent of their instances in the causally governed, spatiotemporal realm. A leading objection to this consensus is that composers cannot then bring their works into existence, contrary to common sense. So the music ontologist faces a dilemma—give up on the idea that musical works are abstract structural types, or explain how the composer can reasonably be said to create musical works even though the abstract structural types that comprise them are already in existence. This difficulty generalizes to other repeatable types of artworks that are held to be abstract objects. But most importantly, characterizing repeatable artworks as abstract artifacts does not allow the ontologist to escape this difficulty. Abstract artifacts do not belong to the causal realm of space and time any more than their eternal and changeless cousins do. So simply saying that they are artifacts, and therefore created and destroyed like all other artifacts, does not by itself explain how this creation and destruction is possible.
Responses run the gamut. Julian Dodd (2000) bites the bullet and argues that musical works are discovered, not created. Levinson (1980) famously proposes that composers create musical works by selecting among and indicating pre-existing abstract sound structures and preferred performance means. In western classical music, for example, these indications are embodied in the written score for the work, which guides the production of instances. However, abstract artifacts, by hypothesis, do not pre-exist the creative acts of authors, so they cannot be created by Levinson’s selection-and-indication process. A popular alternative involves the metaphysical relationship of existential dependence. On this view, repeatable works of art have a dependence base, typically consisting of an author’s mental and physical acts which bring an initial instance of the work into existence, subsequent copies of that instance that sustain the work, and an audience capable of appreciating and interpreting those instances. The work itself is an abstract artifact, dependent on, but existing separately from, these acts and instances. It begins when they begin and ends when they all cease or are destroyed. Nurbay Irmak (2021) argues that existential dependence allows for a non-causal type of creation. The artist engages in causal relations with concrete objects and by so doing non-causally creates the dependent abstract artifact. Lee Walters (2013), on the other hand, argues that some abstract objects can enter into causal relationships, so the process of creating an existentially dependent abstract artifact might conceivably qualify as ordinary causal creation.
These difficulties have prompted some philosophers to avoid the moves that generate them. An early such attempt is Guy Rohrbaugh’s (2003) view that works of art are not abstract objects at all, but rather historical individuals—non-physical entities ontologically dependent on a physical series of historically and causally linked physical objects. For example, a photograph is a non-physical entity dependent on its “embodiments” in a negative and subsequent prints. In a more recent proposal, Christy Mag Uidhir (2013) argues that works of art must have authors, but that neither discovery, nor indication of abstract structures, nor existential dependence satisfies the requirements for authorship. He concludes that repeatable works of art cannot be abstract objects of any kind, but must rather be ordinary concrete objects. Their apparent repeatability does not mean that they are instances of an abstract work, but only that they bear relevant similarity to one another. In a related vein, Allan Hazlett (2012) claims that there are no repeatable artworks. If there were, he says, they would have to be abstract objects. But abstract objects have all their intrinsic properties essentially, whereas artworks typically do not. For example, Alvin Ailey’s major work, Revelations, premiered as a 10 section work lasting an hour, but evolved into a half hour long piece in three sections. So, clearly, many of its original properties were not essential to it. Hazlett concludes that apparent repetitions are not instances of an abstract object. They are either separate, similar artworks, or copies of an original.
The discussion of abstract artifacts has been largely confined to the ontology of art. But as some of the participants have noted (e.g., Levinson 1980, 21–22), repeatable works are not confined to works of art. This is particularly clear for named artifacts such as Chanel No. 5, the Ford F-150, Campbell’s tomato soup, Earl Grey tea, the Hepplewhite chair, or the Washington quarter. It is possible to see each bottle of Chanel No. 5 or each quarter not as a distinctive artifact in its own right, but as an instance of an abstract artifact—Chanel No. 5 tout court, or the Washington quarter. Apart from marketing and branding concerns, what does the naming of such ordinary artifacts accomplish? It highlights their standardization, and often designates the entity responsible for maintaining it—Ford, in the case of the F-150, for instance. But standardization is a virtually universal feature of human artifacts, from the Acheulean handaxe to the Apple MacBook Air. There are vanishingly few artifacts that are unique in the way non-repeatable artworks like paintings are supposed to be. Failed prototypes that were never reproduced might be an example. This means that we are potentially swimming in abstract artifacts, with all the philosophical difficulties that would entail. This, in turn, highlights views opposed to the positing of abstract artifacts, which are more plausible in the case of everyday artifacts. We resist thinking of performances of Beach’s Gaelic Symphony as separate, relevantly similar artifacts because we are used to thinking of symphonies as unique, individual works. But the Washington quarter does not seem like a work in the same sense, and there is thus less reason to resist the idea that individual quarters are just relevantly similar artifacts produced by a copying process managed by the United States Mint. In this regard, we might consider that the notion of the work, functioning as a regulatory concept for the arts, is arguably neither universal nor of ancient lineage, even in the western tradition (Goehr 1993). In short, the time may be ripe for the discussion of abstract artifacts to be expanded to cover artifacts in general, perhaps with different outcomes than in its native context.
The metaphysics of artifacts is a fairly well delineated set of discussions, carried out by a fairly cohesive group of philosophers. In contrast, the epistemology of artifacts is more interdisciplinary in nature, ranging over anthropology, archaeology, cognitive science, and psychology, in addition to philosophy. Within philosophy it runs the gamut from environmental philosophy to philosophy of mind. Section 3.1 returns in more detail to the methodological considerations already broached in Section 2.2. Section 3.2 takes up issues concerning artifacts as objects of knowledge. Finally, Section 3.3 covers issues arising in studies of cognition in which artifacts are presented as playing significant and sometimes controversial roles in cognitive processes themselves.
Reydon’s identification of an epistemological turn in our understanding of kinds and categories leads to a new question about the category “artifact”. Rather than only asking whether it carves the world at a joint, we can also ask: Is it serving our epistemic purposes well? A number of authors have argued that “artifact” is methodologically counterproductive. Dan Sperber (2007, 136–137) claims that it is not a useful category for the purposes of a naturalistic social science.
I have tried to cast doubt on the idea that a theoretically useful notion of artifact can be built around its usual prototypes: bracelets, jars, hammers, and other inert objects, or that it can be defined in a more systematic way…. There is no good reason why a naturalistic social science should treat separately, or even give pride of place to, cultural productions that are both more clearly intended for a purpose and more thoroughly designed by humans, that is, to prototypical artifacts. (Sperber 2007, 137)
Sperber’s main argument for this conclusion, as we noted in Section 1, is based on the continuum problem. But Sperber also suggests that in focusing on paradigmatic artifacts as the basis for our categorization, we are allowing ourselves to be epistemologically disadvantaged by “a doubly obsolete industrial-age revival of a Paleolithic categorization” (2007, 136). In the Paleolithic, before there were any domesticates other than dogs, the (few) technologies people used in their daily lives were paradigmatic artifacts—stone tools, baskets, beads, and so on. So, Sperber speculates, we evolved a psychological disposition to classify things in accordance with the predominance of such artifacts. We then retained this disposition right through the Neolithic transition to agriculture 12,000 years ago, which made biological artifacts (as Sperber calls domesticates) proportionally the most common type of artifact in human experience until the Industrial transition of only a couple of centuries ago. This is the first sense in which our “artifact” category is obsolete. Second, Sperber argues, information technology has increasingly contributed to our environment artifacts that would have astonished Aristotle with their ability to act on their own, beyond any intention their creators may have. Simultaneously, biotechnology has made impressing our intentions on our biological artifacts increasingly effective. These countervailing trends further reduce the dominance of erstwhile paradigmatic artifacts in our lives. This is the second sense in which our “artifact” category is obsolete. In short, Sperber seems to suggest, if we cannot shake the Paleolithic urge to center the “artifact” category on the paradigmatic bracelets and jars, we should jettison the category altogether, for the sake of an epistemologically adequate social science.
Beth Preston (2013, 4–7) declines to use the term “artifact”, opting instead for the more open-ended “material culture”. The initial problem she identifies is that phenomena of interest from the point of view of human interaction with the environment do not divide naturally into interactions with artifacts and interactions with other sorts of things. We noted an example of this in Section 1—intentionally made paths, which do qualify as artifacts, are used in the same way as unintentionally made paths. It thus seems methodologically wrongheaded to rule the unintentionally made path out of consideration on a definitional technicality. Similarly, residues such as sawdust, whey, or fingerprints often enter into human practices in important ways, but a focus on artifacts as traditionally defined may leave these phenomena out of account as well. Preston also argues that it is precisely the central concepts in a field of investigation that should be left open-ended, on pain of epistemic distortion of the results. For example, defining “mind” very strictly might have ruled the extended mind debate out in advance.
Steven Vogel (2003; 2015) argues that no good sense can be made of the artifact-nature distinction, making it unfit for the purposes of environmental philosophy. His argument unrolls against the backdrop of a longstanding controversy in environmental philosophy about the value of ecological restoration—the practice of restoring areas damaged by mining, industrial waste and the like to something as close as possible to the condition they were in before the damage was done. The ontological status of such sites has been challenged on the grounds that such restoration does not actually restore nature but rather creates an artifact (Katz 1997). Worse yet, this artifact is passed off as nature, so it is a fake (Elliot 1997). This casts doubt on the ethical and political value of ecological restoration as an environmental practice. Vogel responds by questioning the unspoken assumption that environmental philosophy is about nature, and environmental activism about protecting nature from human activity. He argues that nature conceived as pristine and independent in this way does not exist—certainly not now that human activity is global in its effects, as Bill McKibben (1989) noted long ago, but in principle, since humans, like all other living things, change their environment simply by living in it. On Vogel’s view, environmental philosophy is about just that—the environment, both built and not-so-built, and what we should do to ensure that it is the environment we want and need, not only for ourselves but for other beings as well.
The important point for our purposes, though, is that Vogel’s post-nature environmental philosophy rests on a full-throated rejection of the nature-artifact categorization. He begins with the claim that our concepts of nature—already multiple, and not always carefully distinguished—are riddled with antinomy-generating ambiguities. The epistemological backwash leaves us mired in nostalgia, unable to see and address environmental problems as they actually exist. In particular, we are unable to see that ecological restoration does not produce artifacts by the traditional definition, since restored areas are designed precisely to escape our designs and outrun our intentions. They are thus “wild” in a perfectly straightforward sense. Furthermore, Vogel argues, all human productions, including artifacts, are wild in this sense. Rather than focusing on unintentional creations, as Preston and Sperber tend to do, Vogel emphasizes the ways in which artifacts outrun all our creative intentions.
Building an artifact requires black boxes all the way down: to design and build anything requires presupposing a whole set of processes that one does not design, and whose operation beyond one’s understanding and intention is necessary for building to take place. There is a gap, in the construction of every artifact, between the intention with which the builder acts and the consequences of her acts, a gap that is ineliminable and indeed constitutive of what it is to construct something, and in this gap resides something like what I earlier called wildness. (Vogel 2015, 113)
Thus the traditional definition of “artifact”—something intentionally made for a purpose—while true as far as it goes, merely skates over the surface, leaving us at an epistemological disadvantage with regard to the full range and depth of the phenomena.
3.2 Knowing Artifacts
Vogel’s position on environmental ethics resonates in an interesting way with a much earlier dispute about reference—specifically, about whether our capacity to refer to different kinds of artifacts is grounded in a definite description of what being a member of that kind requires, or rather in a historical connection to a “baptismal” event in which someone slapped a label on something and declared that label henceforth applicable to things of that sort. Hilary Putnam (1975) famously favors the baptismal account for both natural kinds and artifact kinds. Steven Schwartz (1978) challenges Putnam’s account in the case of artifacts. He agrees with Putnam that the “baptismal” account is correct for natural kinds, because they have hidden natures to which we are not necessarily privy. Thus if we are to refer to natural objects reliably at all, it cannot be by way of definite description. But artifacts, Schwartz says, have publicly accessible natures based on form and function, so reference to them is grounded in description rather than a baptismal event. Amie Thomasson (2003; 2007b) carves out a nuanced position based on her view that the intentions and concepts of human makers are constitutive of artifact kinds (Section 2.2 above). If so, then some makers are in an epistemically privileged position with regard to given artifacts, and so do refer to them in virtue of having a substantive concept of what being an artifact of that kind involves. Thomasson acknowledges that most speakers are not in this epistemically privileged position. Users are not, and even many who qualify as makers in the causal sense—workers on a production line, for instance—may not be. So Thomasson’s view, unlike Schwartz’s, is not a return to a purely descriptive theory of reference for artifact terms, but rather a hybrid theory. Hilary Kornblith (2007) argues against Thomasson that she has still not demonstrated any essential connection between makers’ substantive concepts of artifacts and reference. On the one hand, in cases where a type of artifact is no longer used for the purpose the maker intended, the users’ concept would seem decisive. On the other hand, having the concept is arguably the result of familiarity with the artifact rather than any special semantic capacity enjoyed by makers. Similarly, Kornblith (1980) argues against Schwartz that the function of artifacts is not necessarily accessible—a problem faced frequently by archaeologists, for instance—and thus that even in cases of objects where the form and function are familiar, it is not this familiarity that grounds the ability to refer. The baptismal account of reference therefore must apply to both artifacts and natural objects, just as Putnam said. Such semantic parity between artifacts and natural objects, which rejects any privilege for makers’ intentions, echoes Vogel’s view that artifacts and natural objects are equally “wild”, because artifacts outrun their makers’ intentions in practice, just as surely as natural objects outrun human intentions in principle.
Much of the epistemology of artifacts is, in the first instance, the province of cognitive psychology, not philosophy. Artifact kinds, for instance, can be approached from the side of psychology rather than metaphysics, yielding theories about the psychological mechanisms by means of which we group artifacts together, apart from any question of whether these groupings represent reality (Malt & Sloman 2007a). In an influential article, Paul Bloom (1996) argues that we cannot categorize artifacts based on form, use, or function. Form and use are both too variable to be reliable. Beanbag chairs do not look much like other chairs, and even if every flatiron in existence were currently being used as a doorstop, we would not want to categorize them as doorstops. Experiments show that even intended function is neither necessary nor sufficient for categorization (Malt & Johnson 1992). Vary the form of something sufficiently, and people will decline to categorize it as a chair even if it is made to be sat on. On the other hand, present them with something that looks like a chair but is made to be a plant stand, and they will still categorize it as a chair. In response, Bloom proposes an intentional-historical theory, according to which categorization of artifacts depends on our being able to infer that an artifact was successfully made with the intention that it belong to a particular category. Form and use are good grounds for such inferences, and this explains our intuition that these factors have something to do with how we categorize artifacts. So if something looks like a chair and we regularly observe people sitting on it, we reasonably infer it was made with the intention that it be a chair, and we categorize it accordingly. (Bloom’s view is clearly ancestral to Amie Thomasson’s account of artifact kinds (Section 2.2), but he is concerned only to explain how we group artifacts, and does not claim, as Thomasson does, that makers’ intentions and concepts are ontologically constitutive of artifact kinds.) Barbara Malt and Eric Johnson (1998) criticize Bloom for failing to make clear either why we would need to resort to creator’s intention to categorize artifacts, or exactly how we might assess that intention. More recently, Malt and Steven Sloman (2007a; 2007b) have argued that the kind of essentialist approach represented by Bloom’s theory is misguided, and have proposed an alternative, pragmatic approach. In a series of experiments, they show that artifact categorization is sensitive to communicative goals in specific situations. Creators’ intentions are important with regard to some goals and situations; unimportant with regard to others. If this approach is on the right track, artifact kinds are not psychologically stable or clearly demarcated groupings. Moreover, this raises the possibility that “categorization” itself is not a psychological natural kind. It may be that this label is used for what is actually a heterogeneous collection of processes.
Developmental issues with regard to our concepts of “artifact” and specific kinds of artifacts also loom large in cognitive psychology. As philosophers might anticipate, the underlying general issue is between empiricist and nativist approaches to concept acquisition. But the now vast experimental literature on child development means that theories in this area are both numerous and highly sophisticated. An empiricist-oriented theory that stands out is Jean Mandler’s (2004; 2007) comprehensive perceptual meaning analysis view, according to which children construct abstract image schemas on the basis of their perceptual experience, especially their experience of motion. Since artifacts and animals move in characteristically different ways, the first level of differentiation these image schemas provide is vague, global concepts of these two types of objects. Mandler holds that there is no good reason to think these concepts are innate, nor is there any good reason to think that the perceptual meaning analysis mechanisms that produce them are domain specific. All that is innate, on her view, is a domain-general mechanism that enables the child to analyze her perceptual input. Mandler’s work also indicates that artifacts may be first differentiated into indoor and outdoor, and only then into more specific kinds such as furniture and kitchen utensils, on the one hand, and vehicles and buildings, on the other. The nativist alternative to Mandler’s theory is best represented by Susan Carey’s equally comprehensive “core cognition” theory. Carey (2009, 194–196) has a characteristically nativist critique of Mandler. On the face of it, Mandler’s image schemas represent features of motion and the paths motions describe through space. However, Carey argues, there is no explanation of how the child gets from these representations to a representation of agency, for example. No matter how distinctive the motions of animals, they do not by themselves yield concepts of intention, attention, or goal-directedness. On Carey’s view, these concepts must be innate in the form of “core knowledge” (Spelke 2000), or “core cognition”, as Carey prefers to call it in her more recent work. Core cognition is characterized by innate, domain-specific mechanisms for the analysis of perceptual input, designed by natural selection to construct domain-specific representations of the world, such as intention in the agent domain, or causality in the object domain. Both of these domains of core cognition are essential for the development of artifact concepts, because on Carey’s view (Kelemen & Carey 2007) we conceptualize artifacts as objects that have been intentionally designed to carry out a specific function. The developmental issue, then, boils down to the question of whether we can construct artifact concepts with only a single, domain-general mechanism for analyzing perceptual input, or whether we need at least two domain-specific mechanisms with quite different output.
3.3 Thinking and Acting With Artifacts
Artifacts are not only objects of knowledge; they are also involved in cognition itself. No one disputes that humans use artifacts in their cognitive practices—we do our sums on paper or with electronic devices; and memory aids from individual grocery lists to monuments enshrining cultural memory are ubiquitous. But in recent years a loosely interconnected collection of approaches has characterized artifacts as much more intimately involved in these processes than mere use might suggest. Rather than trying to sort out the complex family resemblances among embodied, enactive, situated, distributed and extended approaches to cognition (Sutton 2006; Wilson & Clark 2009), we can more profitably focus on some representative studies of the way artifacts contribute to cognition in this family of views.
In a seminal paper, Andy Clark and David Chalmers (1998) propose the radical thesis that the mind extends beyond the brain and the body, right out into the environment. In their now famous illustration, two characters, Inga and Otto, hear about an interesting exhibition at the Museum of Modern Art. Inga is neurotypical. She recalls the address of the museum and travels there. Otto, on the other hand, has Alzheimer’s disease. Because he forgets things so easily, he maintains a notebook with the addresses of places he is wont to visit. He looks up the address of the museum and travels there. The moral of this illustration is the so-called Parity Principle.
If, as we confront some task, a part of the world functions as a process which, were it done in the head, we would have no hesitation in recognizing as part of the cognitive process, then that part of the world is (so we claim) part of the cognitive process. (Clark & Chalmers 1998, 8)
This claim is intended as a thesis in the metaphysics of mind, but it functions equally well as a thesis about the epistemic status of artifacts. In Otto’s case—and it is clear Clark and Chalmers intend it not as an exceptional case, but as a particularly striking instance of a commonplace one—the notebook is cognitive in its own right. It is an essential element of a widely individuated cognitive process, not a cognitively neutral tool used by an encapsulated cognizer. Critics of the extended mind thesis have been, if not legion, extremely persistent (Menary 2010). But they have focused mostly on the disconcerting metaphysical implications, rather than on the equally significant implications about cognition. John Sutton (2010) anticipates the metaphysical tendentiousness of the Parity Principle giving way to the important work of understanding the complementarity of inner and outer processes in cognition which is highlighted by the extended mind thesis. Individuating cognitive processes widely, so that the unit of investigation is not the mind/brain but cognitive systems comprising tightly coupled artifacts, people, built environments and natural environments, is a viable project in its own right, and one that was underway in many quarters before the extended mind thesis was proposed.
The locus classicus is Edwin Hutchins’ Cognition in the Wild (1995). Hutchins preserves the traditional understanding of cognition as computation—that is, the manipulation of representations. But he argues that this computation takes place not in individual heads, but distributed across systems of individuals, artifacts, and other environmental structures. Hutchins works out his theory of distributed cognition in the context of a magisterial study of navigation aboard a US Navy ship. He shows that the representations and transformations thereof required for navigation are propagated across a complex system of charts, logs, instruments and cooperating humans, no one of whom is either directing the process or in possession of all the knowledge the system uses or produces. Hutchins’ own studies typically involve cognition in technologically sophisticated workplaces. But other researchers in the distributed cognition vein apply the theory to more easily accessible everyday situations. David Kirsh (1995) argues that we use the placement of artifacts in the surrounding space to simplify our cognitive lives in various ways. For example, baggers in a grocery store will first group different types of items—large, heavy, fragile, and so on—on the checkout counter before starting to pack the bags. This simplifies the cognitive task of spotting the large heavy items you need for the bottom of the bag, or the medium sized boxed items you need to fill in spaces half way up. Similarly, someone preparing to bake a cake will often array all the ingredients on the kitchen counter first, thus minimizing the possibility that any will be left out in the heat of the moment. The general point, emphasized across the board by proponents of situated cognition, is that artifacts and other environmental structures “scaffold” cognition, changing the nature of cognitive tasks in important ways that typically make them more tractable (Lave 1988; Donald 1991; Clark 1997; Kirsh 2009; Michaelian & Sutton 2013).
Cognition is intimately bound up with action on any construal, but the situated cognition framework makes it even more difficult to tease them apart. On a more traditional view, the emphasis is on how cognition shapes action. But on the situated cognition family of views, the emphasis is on how bodily activity antecedently shapes cognition, and indeed the mind in general (Gallagher 2005). Since human action typically involves the making and manipulation of artifacts, they, too, contribute to this mind-shaping process (Malafouris 2013). But artifacts shape action and patterns of behavior in the first instance. Some writers have focused on this action-shaping aspect of artifacts rather than on the cognition-shaping aspect. The locus classicus in this case is Michel Foucault’s (1975 ) Discipline and Punish. On Foucault’s view, human action is substantially shaped by the very layout of the built environment and the specifics of the smaller artifacts that furnish it, not—as we naively tend to assume—primarily by the interpersonal relationships of the inhabitants. The most obvious examples seem innocuous. In chair cultures, for instance, people sit upright and off the floor to eat meals, while in non-chair cultures such as Japan they sit in various postures—depending on the social situation—on cushions on the floor. But Foucault focuses on less innocuous examples such as prisons, which shape action in ways that manifest the exercise of social power. He contrasts the dungeon model, in which behavior is temporarily shaped simply by sheer physical control over the prisoners’ freedom of movement, with the Panopticon model, in which the prisoners are kept under constant surveillance by invisible observers, prompting them to shape their own behavior in various habitual ways that survive the term of their imprisonment. This ensures a kind of continuing social control not available under the dungeon model. Foucault’s further point is that this “disciplinary” model is now pervasive in social institutions from education to workplace to health care to the “smart” home. Related themes surface in Bruno Latour’s (1994; 1999) technical mediation theory. On his view, agency is not a property of individual humans, but rather of collectives of “actants”—humans and nonhumans related to each other in specific, systematic ways. In contemporary western culture, the non-human actants are typically artifacts. Latour’s telling illustration starts with the well-known dispute between gun control advocates, who insist that “guns kill” and the National Rifle Association, which insists that “people kill”. Against both of these positions, Latour argues that the agent who kills is neither the gun nor the person, but a composite person-gun (or gun-person). Neither the person nor the gun remains the same in this relational context as they were before. Moreover, Latour argues, the relationship is symmetrical. Just as humans have intentions that enable them to enlist specific artifacts, artifacts have “scripts”—features of their design that enable them to enlist humans, facilitating certain behaviors and inhibiting others. Both Foucault and Latour tend to study the phenomena of human action in large-scale, institutional contexts—prisons and hospitals in the case of Foucault, scientific laboratories and transportation systems in the case of the actor-network theory pioneered by Latour and others. But there are also a number of writers who focus on the role of artifacts in small-scale, everyday contexts. Tim Ingold (2013), for example, focuses on skilled practice, particularly in the context of making things, from stone tools to baskets to paintings. His work shows that the generation of artifactual structure is as much due to the nature of the materials used as to any intention or plan on the part of the maker. Moreover, the nature of the materials and the tools used structure the activity of making itself. In a similar vein, Beth Preston (2013) argues that human action is more a matter of improvisation than planning, and that the continuously evolving structure of improvisatory action owes much to the opportunities artifacts afford. Furthermore, it is in interaction with artifacts in daily life that we develop the purposes and behavior patterns appropriate to them. Thus, having started with a traditional definition of “artifact” that emphasizes the dependence of artifacts on human intentions and purposes, the epistemology of artifacts brings us back around to a view that emphasizes instead the dependence of human cognition and action on artifacts.
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Other Internet Resources
- Hilpinen, Risto, “Artifact,” Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta (ed.), URL = <https://plato.stanford.edu/archives/sum2018/entries/artifact/>. [This was the previous entry on Artifact in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy — see the version history.]
- Philosophy of Technology, entry by Thomas A.C. Reydon, in Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.