Notes to Bohr’s Correspondence Principle

1. Throughout, ‘BCW’ refers to Niels Bohr Collected Works, where most of Bohr’s papers can be readily found, followed by the relevant volume number.

2. This familiar way of expressing the quantum condition does not appear in Bohr (1913). For an excellent historical review of Bohr’s work on the old quantum theory, including a discussion of Bohr’s quantum conditions, see Darrigol (1992), Chapters V and VI.

3. A Fourier series, recall, is a way of representing a function \(F(x)\) in terms of a weighted sum of sinusoidal components (e.g., sines and cosines).

4. Regarding the statistical asymptotic agreement Bohr notes, “As far as the frequencies are concerned we see therefore that in the limit where \(n\) is large there exists a close relation between the ordinary theory of radiation and the theory of spectra based on [the quantum postulates]. It may be noticed, however, that, while on the first theory radiations of the different frequencies \(\tau \omega\) corresponding to different values of \(\tau\) are emitted or absorbed at the same time, these frequencies will on the present theory … be connected with entirely different processes … corresponding to the transition of the system from a given state to different neighbouring stationary states” (Bohr 1918, p.15; BCW 3, p. 81; emphasis added). And as Darrigol adds, “Considering this distinction there could be no agreement, even asymptotically between the spectrum of radiation emitted by a single atom and the one emitted by the corresponding classical system, since a single atom in a given state could emit only one line. But in the spirit of Einstein’s probabilistic treatment of radiation, one could still compare the spectrum of a statistical ensemble of such atoms with the classical spectrum” (Darrigol 1992, p. 126; emphasis original).

5. From Fedak and Prentis (2002, p. 337). Although Fedak and Prentis are not concerned with the historical question of what Bohr meant by “the correspondence princple”, their presentation of the physics behind the correspondence principle is pedagogically very useful.

6. One substitutes the Fourier series representation of the solution \(x(t)\) to Newton’s equation into the quantum condition to obtain a “quantized” Fourier series representation of the solution \(x(t,n)\) of the following form:

\[ x(t,n) = \sum_{k=1}^{\infty} C_k(n)\cos(k\omega(n)t) \]

7. A complete survey of all important reactions to Bohr’s correspondence principle is outside the scope of this encyclopedia entry. In the interest of space I have just focused on these three important commentators.

8. Both this and the preceeding Sommerfeld quotations are given in Darrigol (1992, p. 140).

9. For a discussion of how Heisenberg used the correspondence principle in constructing matrix mechanics see, for example, Bokulich 2008, pp. 90–93.

10. Although one of Beller’s central arguments here is that reduction to observables did not in fact play a role in Heisenberg’s discovery of matrix mechanics, this does not come across clearly in this particular quotation of hers; hence I have amended her quotation with “[inaccurately]” to reflect the point she is making in the surrounding passages. For a further argument that reduction to observables played no role in Heisenberg’s discovery see Bokulich 2008, pp. 90–92.

11. For a discussion of Heisenberg’s closed theories see, for example, Bokulich (2004; 2006).

12. Rynasiewicz (2015) identifies Kramers (1924) as the earliest publication that describes the correspondence principle as the constraint that quantum theory should match the classical account in the domain of large quantum numbers.

13. One of the chief motivations for the view that the general correspondence principle does not hold for quantum and classical mechanics is the measurement problem (see entry on Measurement in Quantum Theory)

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Peter Bokulich <>

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