Bradley’s Moral Philosophy

First published Wed Mar 6, 2024

[Editor’s Note: The following entry replaces and includes material from the former entry titled Bradley’ Moral and Political Philosophy.]

F.H. Bradley’s moral philosophy remains a source for debates among the historians of philosophy; its rich—and under-researched—material has much to offer not only to the history of philosophy but also to contemporary normative ethics and meta-ethics (especially moral psychology). Luckily, after a period of neglect, there is a revival of interest in Bradley’s ethics. New attempts are made to reconstruct and reinterpret his ideas, giving them a well-deserved place within the current debates.

As a moral philosopher, Bradley is mostly interested in the question about good personality. The problem of the right action does not have a central role in his works (even though it is possible to reconstruct a theory of moral action based on his writings). He asks What sort of person am I to become? rather than What should I do? The type of answer that Bradley gives to this question with his theory of self-realization indicates that he is developing a version of non-instrumental ethical idealism, according to which the goal of moral life is the realization of the moral ideal for its own sake. Ethical Studies is mainly concerned with coming to understand moral agency and personhood, and this, among other things, entails laying bare the structure of volitional choice.

The best source on Bradley’s ethics is Ethical Studies, the philosopher’s first major book. The book was first published in 1876, followed by a second edition with Bradley’s comments for revision in 1927. (All references in this article are to the 1962 paperback edition with R. Wollheim’s introduction). Here, he discusses a wide range of topics relevant to moral philosophy (including, the freedom of will, justification of morality, moral duties, obligation). But by far the major contribution of this book is in moral psychology with its discussion of moral selfhood (cf. Keene 1970), moral ideals, and moral motivation. The book is also valuable for its critical analysis of the key claims of consequentialism, hedonism, Kantianism, and Hegelianism. Many classic arguments against these theories originate from Ethical Studies.

Bradley’s minor works in psychology offer additional insights into his approach to ethics. As D. Crossley (1989b: 59) notes, these articles explore in detail concepts and ideas which are only briefly introduced in the book. Most interesting for ethicists is the reprint of Bradley’s articles titled Collected Essays (1935) and especially the articles: “On Pleasure, Pain, Desire, and Volition” (1888); “The Definition of Will (I–III)” (1902–04, relevant to the discussion of motivation, desire, conation, wish, needs, pleasure, and pain); “Some Remarks on Conation” (1901, desire and conation); “Can a Man Sin against Knowledge” (1884, the nature of moral judgment); “On the Treatment of Sexual Detail in Literature” (desire); “On Mental Conflict and Imputation” (1902, desire and personal identity). The Collected Works of F.H. Bradley (1999) is a treasure trove of previously unpublished works by Bradley, including moral psychology and normative ethics: “Notes towards Ethical Studies [c. 1874–1875]” (Vol. I); “On Morality [1877 or 1878]” (Vol. I); “MS BK Z: Chiefly on Psychological Topics [c. 1893–1902]” (Vol. II); “MS BK W: The Final Commonplace Book [1915–1924]” (Vol. III). Another source is “XXV. Goodness” of “Appearance and Reality” and it is of primary interest to those who study the evolution of Bradley’s views as well as the way the ethics of later Bradley fits in the context of his metaphysics.

1. Background and Influences

The writings of the Oxford Idealists, F. H. Bradley and his teacher T. H. Green, reflect the influence of Kant and Hegel on English moral philosophy in the latter part of the nineteenth century. To the extent that either draws on other sources it is to Aristotle that they turn rather than to British moral philosophers such as Butler, Hume or Reid. Despite the undeniable influence of Aristotle on Bradley’s thought in general, the extent to which Aristotle’s ethics has influenced Bradley’s moral philosophy is open for debate. For example, virtue never became for him a central topic. We won’t find in his Ethical Studies an account of virtue or a theory explaining which specific character traits count as virtue. Aristotle’s influence is apparent, however, from the fact that Bradley, alongside Green (1883), offers a type of perfectionist account of morality that is articulated in terms of the concept of self-realization (Stern 2017; Hurka 1993; Crossley 1977). One evidence of that is Bradley’s claim that all moral duties are self-regarding duties; another is his tendency to connect moral progress with the realization of the truth of human nature. Given this, Bradley’s approach falls under the category of what T. Hurka (1993), calls perfectionism in the narrow sense which sees perfection as excellence defined by human nature.

Bradley’s philosophy is commonly categorized as idealism. However, even though it is often clear what this term refers to in metaphysics (most often, either to an ontological claim that reality is mind-dependent or an epistemological claim that our knowledge of the world is determined by the structure of the mind itself), it is less clear what the term idealism refers to in ethics. If idealism is used in the sense of the idealist ethics (Mander 2016, 2013)—as a means to describe a set of views commonly shared by philosophers who consider themselves metaphysical idealists—then, despite the fact that Bradley certainly is a metaphysical idealist (it is less certain, however, which of the two above-mentioned metaphysical claims he accepts), to say that he develops an idealist ethics raises more questions than answers, since his moral views diverge greatly from those of other metaphysical idealists.

Metaphysical idealists are preoccupied with the nature of ideas, i.e., cognitive constructs that are either the representations of the world or the internal structures of the mind itself that precede and precondition any experience and knowledge of the world. Bradley’s idealism, on the other hand, is focused on a different concept altogether: ideals, i.e., normative concepts that express standards of perfection. Given the central role of ideals in Bradley’s ethics, it makes sense to tag his moral theory as ethical idealism. Long after Bradley, one version of ethical idealism was developed by N. Rescher (1987) who proposed a kind of instrumental ethical idealism. Its central thesis is that ideals, despite being unrealistic and unachievable, have the instrumental value of motivating agents to strive for higher, more ambitious goals and achieve more than they otherwise would. In contrast to Rescher, for Bradley, the moral ideal is the goal in itself. Hence, we can tag his version of ethical idealism as non-instrumental ethical idealism.

Much of Bradley’s attention in Ethical Studies was taken up with critical analyses of utilitarianism—the dominant ethical theory of the day—and the hedonism to which it was wedded, whether that view advanced the primacy of pleasure either in the form of a psychological account of motivation or as the felt state that right actions aim at maximizing. Indeed, Bradley not only had to dispense with the claims of the older utilitarians, such as Bentham and Mill (cf., e.g., Crossley 2000; MacNiven 1984), but also had to face the new defense of utilitarianism advanced by Henry Sidgwick, who published his The Methods of Ethics (1874) virtually simultaneously with Bradley’s Ethical Studies (1876). For a greater part of the twentieth century Bradley’s critical attacks on hedonism and utilitarianism were considered to be the main subject of his book. Despite the central role of Bradley’s arguments in the debate against utilitarianism and hedonism, over-emphasizing their role in the structure of the book led many to overlook the main topic of Ethical Studies, i.e., moral self-realization and an entire set of relevant topics, such as the moral self and moral action (incl., moral responsibility and motivation).

In his opposition to utilitarianism, Bradley is often seen as a neo-Hegelian. Even though it is true to a certain extent that Bradley was inspired by Hegel, it is less obvious to what extent he had been influenced by Hegel’s ethics or his dialectic method. It is worth noting, however, that Bradley himself denied being a Hegelian or employing Hegelian methodology in any systematic way. The assumption that Bradley uses Hegelian dialectic as the main argumentative method in Ethical Studies most likely originates from R. Wollheim’s introduction to the second edition of the book and has persisted ever since. Wollheim himself does not prove his claim, and as a result it is difficult to know with certainty what he had in mind. The reason behind this interpretation of Bradley’s method is the desire to clear Bradley from the accusation of traditionalism and show that Ethical Studies must be read beyond Essay V “My Station and Its Duties”. The identification of Bradley’s ethics with the theory of my station and its duties became a commonplace after Sidgwick’s review (1876) and R. Ross’ edition of Ethical Studies, which omitted Essays I, VI, and VII (Bradley 1951). The good that Wollheim’s claim does is that it motivates the reader not to stop at Essay V, and to expect that there is more to Bradley’s ethics than the discussion of “my station and its duties”. The downside of Wollheim’s claim, however, is that it is too far-fetched and it blinds the reader to the main topics of Ethical Studies, its key message, and keeps her confused as to the relation of its various arguments as well as to the role of the final chapter, “Ideal Morality”. As a result, there is a risk for the reader to overemphasize the role of social morality (cf., e.g., Keene 2009) in Bradley’s ethics and misattribute some of his central arguments.

2. “My Station and Its Duties”

Since Wollheim wrote his introduction to Ethical Studies, scholars such as Candlish (1978) and Nicholson (1990) argued extensively against a popular (but poorly substantiated) view (e.g., Krook 1959, Stebbing 1948, Santayana 1933, Sabine 1915, Rashdall 1907) that Bradley’s moral philosophy is reducible to a theory of “my station and its duties”. As a result, the reductionist view is no longer accepted, and Bradley is no longer associated with conservativism and communitarianism. However, the perception of Bradley’s ethics is not fully free from the Hegelian spell, and there is still a lot of confusion concerning Bradley’s view on the moral significance of compliance with social demands, justified by custom and tradition—when this is understood as an element of “my station and its duties” theory. This confusion is deeply rooted in the way the structure of Ethical Studies is interpreted, what role Essay VI “The Ideal Morality” is given in the overall flow of the book’s argument and how it is positioned relative to Essay V “My Station and its Duties”.

Until recently, the predominant view among historians of philosophy was that

[t]he concept of “My Station and its Duties” is the core of Bradley’s moral theory. The last two essays … are devoted to further elaboration of this notion…. (Warnock 1960: 12)

This results in something that can be referred to an “add-on” view, according to which the “my station and its duties” theory, after acknowledgment of its limitations, is mostly accepted by Bradley with some corrections or additions that are described in Essay VI (cf., e.g., Wollheim 1969: 246–47; Candlish 1978: 163–4; Nicholson 1990: 33–5; Mander 2011: 190–1). As a result, the concepts of the ideal morality and the moral ideal are given lesser role in the overall structure of the book, seen as a supplement to social requirements or as something to fall back onto, if the social norms turn out to be corrupt. This interpretation of Bradley is being challenged. For example, Babushkina (2019) argues that this “add-on” view of Bradley’s theory of Ideal Morality, is problematic, as it largely underplays the seriousness of the objections that Bradley puts forth against the Hegelian “theory of my station and its duties” in Essays V and VI. But even putting this aside, were we to accept the “add-on” interpretation, it is still unclear how a supplementation of this sort can make the theory of “my station and its duties” plausible as a moral theory. It is not surprising then, that when accepting such reading of Ethical Studies, some scholars discard Bradley’s moral theory altogether (Brink 2003; Banchetti 1992; Bell 1984; Norman 1983; Daly 1963).

One reason for the confusion around the concept of “my station and its duties” is the multiplicity of the meanings attached to this expression in Ethical Studies and the obscurity of Bradley’s style of writing. As Babushkina (2019) point out, the popular “add-on” interpretation fails to take into account the distinction between “my station and its duties” as

  1. a Hegel’s normative thesis (connected to the concept of Sittlichkeit) described and criticized in Essay V;
  2. a related concept of positional duties or social commands (cf. Stern 2013), i.e., tasks that we have due to occupying a certain position/role;
  3. the revised “my station and its duties” thesis that Bradley accepts, according to which our moral obligations may coincide with (but are not reducible to) our positional duties, where the obligation is constituted by what others have a reason to expect from us from an ideal point of view (Essay VI).

Bradley does not explicitly define these three meanings of “my station and its duties”, but the difference is clear from the context and flow of the argument throughout Ethical Studies. Acknowledging the difference between the concept of “my station and its duties” in Essay V and VI reveals that far from accepting (with some corrections and supplements) the Hegelian theory of Sittlichkeit, Bradley rejects the reduction of moral properties to social, leading to the conclusion that what is socially required from us constitutes our moral obligation only when this social requirement is justified from the ideal point of view (given, of course, Bradley’s understanding of the nature the ideal).

An alternative to the popular “add-on” view, shifts the interpretative focus from Essay V and the theory of “my station and its duties” with its reductionist view of morality towards Essay VI and the identification of the moral with the ideal (James Bradley 1996; MacNiven 1996). For example, D. Ilodigwe writes that Bradley introduces the moral ideal as a concept

in terms of which the legitimate demands of these varied regions of the self [empirical, transcendental, and social] are realised

and denies that

the realisation of the social self necessarily [is] the realisation of the ideal self, except the social self is in conformity with its ideal self. (2004: 68)

From this standpoint, the Ideal Morality chapter is the central part of the argument of the book, which culminates debate about the nature of the moral self.

3. Moral Self as a Precondition for Moral Responsibility

The central role of the concept self-hood for Ethical Studies becomes apparent already in the first essay of the book, where the solution to the deadlock in the debate about the nature of moral responsibility is suggested by Bradley through a revision of the standard philosophical views on the moral self. This fact has been frequently overlooked in the secondary literature that tends to focus on social and political implications of Bradley’s Ethical Studies (cf., Brink 2003; MacIntyre 1966 [1998]; Bell 1984; Wright 1984; Hudson 1980; Copleston 1966; Milne 1962; Sidgwick 1954; Muirhead 1932). However, in the recent years, the centrality of this concept for moral theory has been more and more acknowledged by Bradley scholars (notably, Mander 2016; Irwin 2009; Wilson 1999; Sprigge 1993; MacNiven 1987; Keene 1970), even though it is still frequent that commentators (cf. Wilson 1999; Stanley 1996; Nicholson 1990; Sprigge 1984; Vander Veer 1970; Keene 1970; Wollheim 1969; Lewis 1969) tend to not draw sufficient distinction between the moral and metaphysical accounts of the self. The lack of conceptual clarity in this respect may cause problems for the interpretation of Ethical Studies. According to Bradley’s metaphysics—developed much later than Ethical Studies—the self is an appearance (which does not imply that it does not exist; for more on Bradley’s metaphysical account of the self see Pugmire 1996; De Witt 1984; Vander Veer 1970). Despite that, in Ethical Studies the self is treated as if it was real. The overall message of the book is that, even though the self is just a mental construct, without it, ethics and moral life are impossible. One should not merely superimpose the metaphysical views of later Bradley on his earlier moral philosophy; an elaborate analysis that would make justice to the original idea of Ethical Studies as well as to Bradley’s complex ontology and epistemology of Appearance and Reality is required. One of the first to draw attention to the apparent disagreement between Ethical Studies and Appearance and Reality on the topic of the self was Wollheim (1969), who noted that if there is any context in Bradley’s philosophy where we have to admit the existence of the self, it is his moral philosophy. Wollheim, however, explains the apparent inconsistency between earlier and later Bradley not with reference to the conceptual difference between the normative domain of ethics and descriptive domain of metaphysics, but to the inherent contradiction in the metaphysical account of the self, thus, in the end, denying the uniqueness of ethics as a philosophical field of inquiry. This is common also to those researchers who ague for a naturalistic account of the moral self in Ethical Studies, either tracing it to Hume and Hobbes (Basile 2003; Wilson 1999) or reducing it to a set of habits—both of which interpretations find their disproof in some place in Ethical Studies.

In Ethical Studies, Bradley begins his discussion of morality and the moral agent with an analysis of the ordinary person’s understanding of moral responsibility. The reason for this starting-point is revealed much later, when he argues that a moral agent begins with the development of self-consciousness. This, he says, makes possible “imputation and responsibility, and here begins the proper moral life of the self” (Ethical Studies, Essay VII [1962: 299]). If an action has any moral significance whatsoever then the person responsible (in the causal sense) can be held accountable (responsible in the normative sense). One could feel accountable, and with this goes a sense of liability to censure or punishment. Being justifiably considered guilty and thereby deserving of censure or punishment requires the satisfaction of three conditions: (a) the person held accountable must be the same person as the one who did the act, (b) the act must have been that person’s, and (c) she must have had some understanding of the moral quality of the act. While not in a position to provide a philosophical opinion on questions concerning personal identity or what constitutes an action, the ordinary person nevertheless recognizes cases in which an accused person was “not himself” or “did not mean to do it” or acted under duress, and sees these as mitigating circumstances. In sum, the ordinary person’s view, as Bradley presents it, is Aristotelian: for the purposes of determining moral responsibility an act has to be the agent’s in that its origin (arche) lies with or in the agent in some sense—and the agent must not be acting under coercion or in a state of non-culpable ignorance. These last conditions reflect the common view that one cannot, in justice, hold someone accountable unless she had a measure of control over the situation and thereby could be viewed as acting on her own free will.

If we turn to philosophical theories, we find differing opinions about whether we enjoy this sort of freedom from external influences, and Bradley is interested in how—what he calls—the theories of Determinism and Indeterminism differ from the views of the ordinary people; not because he thinks the ordinary people will always be correct about such matters—indeed, they likely have not thought much about such things—but because examining what the ordinary people say about moral matters reveals the deep structures of a society’s moral thinking as that is embedded in its language and social institutions (or, in more modern terms, our moral intuitions).

Concerning the free will debate, our moral intuition is at odds with both theories. Contrary to determinism, our intuition tells us that we can and often do initiate actions—and on this point Bradley portrays the ordinary person as accepting the thesis now called “agent causality”. What is omitted by the determinists are explanations of behavior which appeal to the reasons of the agent, thereby ignoring Aristotle’s notion of final causality, or purposely reducing it to efficient causality. Thus, denying the ability of the agent to act upon reasons, the determinist is denying the autonomous nature of the moral self. The problem with indeterminism, on the other hand, is its claim that nothing at all determines our actions. This conflicts with our belief that it often is possible (and sometimes even morally required to be able) to predict what someone will do, because she has formed a certain moral character and can be counted on to act a certain way when faced with moral questions. In the end, Bradley shows that both theories cannot make sense of responsibility and moral life because—even though for different reasons—they fail to account for the concepts of the moral self. This sets up the stage for the rest of the book which will be occupied predominantly with the task of accounting for this concept. The most important ethical question, from this point of view, is about the kind of self that one should realize in her moral life; it is this question that allows Bradley to introduce his most crucial concept—that of moral life as self-realization, based on the idea of the moral self as a creative, goal-oriented self-assertive process.

Self-realization is a complex term which, in the boarder sense, can be seen as an attempt to translate the Kantian universalizability principle into the concrete reality of a person’s life. The universalizability principle says that if a moral obligation applies to me as a moral agent, then it applies to any other moral agent in the same manner, or as Bradley puts it:

That does not mean that everybody does or has to do what I do, but it means that, if they were I, they must do as I have to do, or else be immoral. (Ethical Studies, Essay VI [1962: 230])

As a principle guiding actions, it presupposes the distinction between the moral self and my moral self: when the agent reflects upon her beliefs, desires, commitments, and actions from the moral point of view, she is reflecting upon her moral self. It is the object and subject of moral evaluation; the bearer of responsibility and object of blame and praise. My moral self is subject to change: with time, I may become a better or worse person than I am now. My moral self is not the same as your moral self, because the specific details of our lives and circumstances, in which we make decisions and act, are different. However, the reasons for which my moral self and your moral self can be both seen as moral selves are the same. The moral self is the other side of the universalizability principle—that “me” to which any moral obligation applies to, regardless of any specific circumstances of one’s life. In Bradley’s own words:

I call my act the realization of the universal will because another man in my case … must have acted as I did and would have been commanded to do so. (“Miscellaneous Notes [c. 1874–5]”, Bradley 1999: Vol. 1, p. 244)

And further:

The moral consciousness thus assumes its identity in all men. […] The superior will … commands individual acts which are ends without distinction of person if “person” means the private self. (“Miscellaneous Notes [c. 1874–5]”, Bradley 1999: Vol.1, p. 245).

As such, the moral self is void of content. It is an abstract principle. Bradley’s concept of self-realization is, in a sense, a response to the question of how this abstract principle gets specified and becomes a moral life of a concrete individual: how it is possible for anyone to actually have a moral (as opposed to empirical) self. The answer lies in the link between our actions and what we are: as moral agents we cannot separate ourselves from how we act. As MacNiven says: “in acting … we create ourselves” (MacNiven 1987: 50). Bradley pays a lot of attention to the psychological machinery of moral action (including desires, volition, conation, beliefs) with the goal of explaining this link, and thus explaining how we create ourselves as moral agents through actions. Sprigge interprets self-realization through another complex and controversial term of a concrete-universal:

In his Ethical Studies Bradley takes his departure from the presumed fact that every individual is struggling for some kind of self realization, and that this is the basic driving force of the attempt to live a morally good life. Such a life is not a means to self realization, but one main form of self-realization. By self realization Bradley seems to mean the giving some sort of overall coherent pattern or structure to your life in which you can find satisfaction, and such that all the details of your life are enjoyed as particular elements in that total pattern. One could perhaps say that it is life in the light of an accurate self image with which one can be satisfied. (Sprigge 1988: 117)

Representing moral self as a concrete-universal is conveying the idea of goal-orientedness and structuring of internal states throughout one’s life. This idea is encapsulated by the term personal projects, which seems to be better situated for the interpretation of Bradley’s idea of moral life as self-realization, also because it allows translating the idealist concept of a concrete-universal into the language of present day debates in moral philosophy. Projects are major pursuits that have key role in organizing and structuring an agent’s conduct over a long period of time: projects “give shape and content”, “guide our lives” (Betzler 2013), and essentially contribute to its meaningfulness. Careers, hobbies, personal relationships—all such endeavors that are devoted to a significant cause and require a body of actions to pursue it, are examples of personal projects. Bradley’s description of moral life is well-suited for such account of personal projects: my moral self is essentially a life-long endeavor that has two dimensions. The one is reflective and normative dimension, where the agent forms an idea of her ultimate moral end; the causes she is to realize and what is required to achieve them. This is a continuous process of reflection upon her beliefs, desires, and actions, as well as her social roles and connections to others—the process that never stops throughout one’s life. Though this process, the agent is constantly updating and concretizing the ideal view of herself, or—in Bradley’s terms—her ideal self. The other dimension is the practical one, i.e., the dimension of action. Identifying with her ideal self, the moral agent, is able to adjust her psychological states (beliefs and desires), as well as to align her commitments, decisions, and actions. When the agent acts in accordance with her view of what she ought to be, from the ideal point of view, she is realizing herself and becoming her true self.

4. Moral Relevance of Desires

For Bradley, what drives self-realization are our desires, and through them, our volition. The central role of desire and other emotive states for self-realization has been acknowledged by such Bradley scholars as MacNiven (1987), Crossley (1989b), and Mander (2016, 2011). MacNiven shows that Bradley conceptualizes desire as a separate state of mind, distinct from pain and pleasure. Crossley discusses desire mostly in the context of the concepts of feeling and immediacy; while Mander connects Bradley’s account to a more general idealist views on desire. Bradley’s concept of will is, however, less discussed in the secondary literature, but it is important to note that Bradley understands will not as a special faculty but as an idea that is being actualized. In Bradley’s own words, it is “the self-realization of an idea with which the self is identified” (1902b [CE II.476]) or, to put plainly, will is what you are ready to do. This account of will, places special importance on desire and emotive states through which ideas find their ways into an agent’s decisions and actions.

Well before E. Anscombe (1957), Bradley described the difference between desire and belief via the metaphor of the “direction of fit” (Mander 2016; Brink 2003). In theoretical pursuit, Bradley says, our goal is to understand the object; we want neither to remove nor alter the world of sensuous fact, but we want to get at the truth of it. The whole of science takes it for granted that the “not-ourself” is really intelligible; it stands and falls with this assumption. So long as our theory strikes on the mind as strange and alien, so long do we say we have not found truth; we feel the impulse to go beyond, we alter and alter our views, till we see them as a consistent whole. But when it comes to action, our aim is not, leaving the given as it is, to find the truth of it; but “in practice … we want to force the sensuous fact to correspond to the truth of ourselves” (Ethical Studies, Essay II [1962: 73])

This presents two very different kinds of intentional mental states. In the case of empirical knowledge, we have a subject in the psychological state of believing that something is true of the world; her belief has a propositional object as its content as Bradley would call it. Since the goal is to correctly understand the world, the subject is committed to altering her belief set until it accurately represents the external physical world. By contrast, when I desire to become a better person I must first have represented the self or person I wish to be under some description. This sort of mental state also has a propositional object; e.g., in the statement, “I wish that I were a more patient person” the italicized proposition following the “that” is the object of the mental state we call wishing. What we have here, in Bradley’s terminology is an ideal object which is the content of the wish. This is ideal because it is a mental representation of a state of affairs that does not exist at the point the wish is made.

An ideal object can represent a possible different state of the person contemplating it, which presupposes, in addition to the ability to represent possible future states, a degree of self-awareness. An example of this sort of self-consciousness is found in the addict who may be very aware of how his desires are ruining his life. Once this sort of self-reflective awareness is achieved it is then possible to think of changing things. In Bradley’s language this addict has pictured a better self that he might be, and if he comes to identify his satisfaction with realizing this better self there is a possibility of change. This situation sets up a conflict between the actual person the addict now is and the represented better person he wishes to be and this generates disharmony or what Bradley often calls a “felt contradiction”. The pain of this conflict moves the individual toward resolving it. It is important to note that the addict cannot move forward without having a determinate ideal object, a definite conception of the ideal self being represented. Without this, identifying his satisfaction with realizing that state would be impossible. Bradley writes:

The essence of desire for an object would thus be the feeling of our affirmation in the idea of something not ourself, felt against the feeling of ourself as, without the object, void and negated ; and it is the tension of this relation which produces motion. (Ethical Studies, Essay II [1962: 68]; compare to Bradley 1888: 17–18)

The introduction of the psychological tension into the explanation of desire could give the impression that Bradley is subscribing to the dispositional account of desire (cf., e.g., MacNiven 1987), according to which desire is a disposition to action, i.e., “trying to get” something or a “movement towards a thing” (Anscombe 1957). What is more likely, however, is that the reference to the feeling of tension is a way to describe the emotive component in the motivation by ideas. This fits well Bradley seemingly paradoxical claim that “nothing is desired except that which is identified with ourselves, and we can aim at nothing, except so far as we aim at ourselves in it” (Ethical Studies, Essay II [1962: 68]). This quote should not be understood as a trivial narcissism or an egoistic claim that I only desire the state of affair which is in my interests. Neither should this quote should be understood as a claim that the object of desire is always a belief. Bradley rejects such view because it can be applied to the mental states that are not, in fact, objects of desire—thus this view fails account for desires as distinct mental states: “All my ends are my thoughts, but all my thoughts are not my ends” (Ethical Studies, Essay II [1962: 67]). As Bradley notes, the fact that I can see a locomotive starting to move off the station does not imply that I desire the train to move.

What seems to be a most likely explanation of what Bradley had in mind when claiming that self is the only object of desire is expressed by another idealist, J. H. Muirhead. He wrote that the propositional content of desire contains a predicate of the desired self:

[I]t is indifferent whether we say […] I desire that object, or I desire myself to be in possession of that object. (Muirhead 1892: 52)

In the same manner, Bradley aims to say that desire is always a desire for a certain (future) state of myself; more broadly, the agent’s desires represent her ideal of her self. The claim that the self is the only thing she is able to desire, suggests that all desires are somehow connected to her personal aspirations and commitments. It is worth noting that such interpretation does not exclude other-regarding desires, i.e., desires for the well-being of other people. Other-regarding desires can also be a part of personal commitments, as long as one can explicate a connection between the object of desire and the future state of the agent’s self. If Sally desires for her children’s well being, this may mean, for example, that she aspires to be a happy parent whose children are well off in life.

Another helpful concept is J. S. Mackenzie’s idea of desire as the expression of one’s “point of view”, representative of a person’s character (Mackenzie 1901). Mackenzie’s “point of view” resembles Bradley’s concept of the “whole of ends” (Ethical Studies, Essay II [1962: 70]) which Mander (2016) interprets in terms of “ideal desire-sets”—the unity of life goals that personal projects provide. This implies a strong connection between the object of desire and the desirer’s life projects—or, as W. Mander puts it: when desiring an object

our very identity becomes bound up with it […] making its realization a realization of our own self. Our identity lies in the realization of our goals. (Mander 2011: 185)

To put it otherwise, desires are the driving force behind self-realization: the only thing we aim at in acting is to realize ourselves—or, better, the structure of practical reasoning and the facts of moral psychology make it impossible that we could aim at anything else. This means that our choices and actions constitute what we are, and they do so by revealing what we identify with. You cannot escape self-realization, but you can choose and control what person you will become as a result.

With this Bradley puts forward an interesting alternative to the dispositional account of desire, namely, a view that desire is the identification of the self with the object. One aspect of this identification can be explained with the help of a narrative view of desire, according to which desire is essentially a story that the agent tells herself about the attractive properties of the object and as such, it reveals what an agent considers to be valuable (Airaksinen 2012). Bradley calls the realized desire is an “utterance” of the self, or further says that the self feels “asserted” and “affirmed” in the object of desire (Ethical Studies, Essays I & II [1962: 33, 35, 68]). In other words, desires that have led to actions reflect the agent’s value preferences and as such can be seen as narratives about the characteristics that the agents finds attractive. The psychological tension, which Bradley describes as a part of desire, is then the agent’s feeling of contradiction between her idea of her own future state, where she is has already become qualified in this attractive way, and the her idea that her current state is not thus qualified. In a sense, the object of desire stands for the idea of something that agents considers to be valuable, making the desire itself stand for acceptance of such value for the agent.

5. Integrity

Volitional choice therefore has a built-in normative feature in the form of an idea of a better state or self. But self-realization means more than this for ethical theory, for it purportedly represents the over-arching, ultimate goal of moral action, which entails some idea of a perfect, ideal self that is being aimed at. But here is a problem: how can anyone ensure that one is true to one’s ideal?

Answering this is crucial for Bradley’s ethical theory not to fall victim to a criticism he made of Mill’s thesis about the qualities of pleasures (Utilitarianism, Chapter 2). Bradley leveled a barrage of criticisms against any theory, utilitarian or otherwise, that imply that the moral moral self is the most satisfied self and that satisfaction is the sign of being true to the moral ideal. The central objection was that since pleasures are a “perishing series”, with each one passing away once it has been experienced, it is not possible to accumulate a sum of pleasures, and since there are always more pleasures available than anyone has experienced, Mill’s moral goal of maximizing pleasant states was meaningless. But introducing the idea of qualitatively different kinds of pleasures that can be ranked suggests that perhaps the hedonist can, after all, successfully articulate the self we should be aiming at. Perhaps the best self—the ideal moral self—is the one that pursues the highest type of pleasure.

In evaluating this Bradley stresses the relative, comparative nature of terms such as “higher” and “lower”. The opposite terms such as “superior” and “inferior” invite us to ask, “in respect of what is A higher than, or superior to, B?” Bradley insists that if I say Sally is superior to Joan I must first be comparing them in terms of some characteristic they share—for example, both are beautiful—and, second, I am positioning them on a scale, which is conceived in terms of two determinate termini. We can perhaps see the point here by imagining what happens when, having said Sally is superior to Joan, we are next asked to rank Mary. If Mary is judged superior (in beauty) to both, then she is being placed between Sally and someone who is right at the top of the scale. Mill’s account of superior pleasures fails because he never explains what the scale is that is being used and so never explains what the “highest” kind of pleasure is. Whether this criticism survives scrutiny does not matter all that much as far as the fate of hedonism is concerned, for Bradley’s attack on qualitative hedonism is nothing short of thorough and he thinks there is no convincing case Mill can make in support of it. For example, Mill’s competent judges cannot say that this ranking just “feels” right, for that is to confess that the talk of ranking is meaningless since one could have just as well “ranked” them differently. And the ranking cannot be made in terms of Mary’s beauty, because that is the quality that makes Mary a candidate for placement on the scale in the first place; which leads Bradley to hold, as did most of Mill’s critics, that unless the whole business really is nonsense, there must some criterion other than pleasure being used and so Mill has given up hedonism. These, and some other arguments are independent of the issue about knowing the upper limit end of the scale of pleasures. That issue is important, however, because it marks a problem Bradley’s theory of self-realization should also have to face: namely, that talk of a “superior” or “better” or “more perfect” moral person would require an explication of the upper limit of the scale these evaluations are employing. This seems a reasonable demand, for even apart from the question of whether judging something to be better than something else entails knowing what is best, Bradley’s thesis is not just that we try to become better with each choice and action, but that we want to be the best possible, to be perfect moral agents.

Fortunately, Bradley has an answer. In Ethical Studies Bradley tells us that as moral agents we should avoid “the life of an oyster” and that we should look to produce a self that is a concrete-universal whole in which all is related so as to render it a system rather than a mere collection of random acts and characteristics. In other words, this means two things. First, self-realization is the matter of a meaningful life, that is directed to a cause/s. Second, such causes—which for simplicity’s sake can be understood as commitments—should, in the end, form a non-contradictory narrative about ourselves. Aligning our desires and actions with these commitments is a matter of integrity. A life of a morally good person is that a perfect unity of “homogeneity” and “specification” (Ethical Studies, Essay II [1962: 74])—homogeneity in the sense of each desire should be directed to something in some way fulfills a commitment; specification in the sense of the commitment taking the shape of an action in the world.

In a sense, in most cases there is such a unifying narrative in a life of a person. To the extent that people consider the consequences of their actions they demonstrate that they do not see their actions as disconnected from other things they have done and might do, and they subordinate some ends to wider goals. That is, ordinary people not only display a degree of prudence in making choices but also recognize that the value of some actions is that they are means to more important goals. In fact, Bradley claims that most people act with some “ideal of life”, or some idea of what would make them perfectly happy, however vaguely expressed, and this orders their lives, governing their choices and actions. In a word, normal lives of mature adults are at least relatively systematic. Moreover, if a person has become habituated to act in certain ways (i.e., has developed a disposition to act thus and so), then her actions will tend to be relatively consistent. In such cases, says Bradley, we are dealing with a “standing will” and it explains why those who know someone well can predict what this person will do with a considerable degree of certainty and why that person feels pleased that others know she can be counted on to act appropriately. Standing desires are opposed to occurring desires (Ethical Studies, Essay VII [1962: 283]). The latter is an appetite, and it is a temporary identification of the self with an object, which appears only in the presence of the object. The former is a “relatively permanent” identification with the object which is present regardless the presence of the object. Standing desire can take form of an interest proper, if what the self permanently identifies with is the object itself, or it can become lust, where the self is identified with the pleasure from acquiring the object. Standing desires play essential role in the realization of the personal project, allowing for certain values motivate us for a long period of time. Standing desires are not the only ones that bring unity into one’s self-realization process. Habitual desires are a very powerful mechanism. These are acquired through the repetitive identification of oneself with a certain object (Babushkina 2022). Developing habits of desire is a part of the habituation of the self (Ethical Studies Essay I [1962: 53–55], Essay VII [1962: 295–296]) which, according to Bradley, is at the core of a person’s upbringing.

The problem with habitual desires, is that the self develops good habits through the same process that it develops bad ones: through repetition and choice patterns. Similarly, one can develop interest in (or standing desires for) something that is morally good and for something that is morally bad. That is to say that if the goal is merely to achieve some unity of one’s self, there is no quarantine that what one achieves is moral self-realization. So, the challenge for Bradley’s account of self-realization as a moral project is to explain how the agent achieves the right kind of unity. Instead of giving an account of character traits that would be good in themselves to pursue, Bradley appeals to the concept of the Moral Ideal to tackle this challenge: the moral self-realization is achieved through the identification of the self with the Moral Ideal.

6. Moral Ideal

The Moral Ideal is a difficult term to explain in Bradley’s ethics, but not impossible if we take into account that, from the metaphysical point of view, the moral ideal is a concrete-universal. This implies that we are dealing not with an abstract concept existing independently from real things, but with a concept, embedded in things it represents. Concrete-universal is always an instantiated concept; it cannot be described apart from the instances that express it. This, in turn, means that the moral ideal is not a phantasy or a plan in the head of a person, but an instantiated unity of different elements of person’s life (incl. her desires, beliefs, commitments, actions). This also means that there is not much to say about the moral ideal apart from my moral ideal or the ideal of my personhood, that is constructed based on the elements of my life. The fact that moral ideal is a concrete-universal, explains how a moral agent is able to achieve the unity of her personally through moral self-realization.

The closest Bradley comes to the explanation of the Moral Ideal is when giving a description of what he calls “the content of the ideal self” (Ethical Studies, Essay V [1962: 219]). Under this general expression, Bradley lists three categories of commitments that are worth having, from the moral point of view (Babushkina 2016). One category consists of commitments to other people. These constitute moral obligations that we have due to various relationships we are in and different types of social roles we play. These commitments are referred to by Bradley as “my station and its duties”. Another category of commitments that are worth having are those that we have to humanity as such; commitments to treating others in ways they deserve as human beings. Here we move beyond mere social relationships between people, and to the obligation to treat all humans is a certain way. The third and last group of worthy commitments are those to truth (e.g., scientific inquiry) and beauty (artistic endeavors)—these Bradley tags as a non-social aspect of the ideal self. Each of these categories, in themselves, are rather abstract; these are a result of an attempt to classify all things that are worth striving for, and any aspiration can be a part of the moral ideal as long as it is universalizable. And it is only thorough my taking certain commitments upon myself (i.e., identifying with the moral ideal), that I bring any concrete content into it.

Another important aspect of the moral ideal is its normative force. As my moral ideal, it sets the standard of perfection. As such, it does not prescribe the moral agent any specific actions, but it tells her what she should be. Understanding which commitments are morally worth, the person is able then to apply those to her unique life situation, depending what relationships she is in, what social roles she has, and what aspirations and interests drive her. These helps to form a personalized moral ideal that will push forward her self-realization project.

7. Moral Development

Of interest to developmental psychology (cf. MacNiven 1996) of morality is Bradley’s account of the development of the moral consciousness, that is based on the assumption that social context provides the script for our desires and that children internalize these scripts while playing them out. At an early stage of mental life, the child will experience pleasure from some object—say an apple—and transfers the pleasant sensation to the object, so that it becomes part of the content of the apple, a part of what that object means to the child, or, better, a part of what the child sees in that object. The child generates an appetite for objects of this sort and in the presence of an apple the child will have a mixed reaction: a pleasant feeling because the object is seen as pleasant, but a painful feeling because she is not in possession of, or enjoying, the apple. This produces a felt tension—“felt” because it is occurring at a pre-cognitive level, before the child has beliefs about the object is or able to make inferences about the object based on past experience. This felt tension is desire and it moves the child to action, to try to take physical possession of it. Bradley’s psychological account differs from the hedonist’s in that whereas hedonism holds that a particular pleasure is willed, Bradley claims that the ideal object willed is a particular thing which has had a pleasant quality transferred to it and thereby attributed to the thing itself. Moreover, on Bradley’s account the will—once we get to the stage of having a fully developed self capable of having a will—is actually seeking the object willed because it represents the satisfaction of the self following the process of identification. However, at this stage we have at best a very primitive precursor of the self and it can only be said to affirm itself. That is, it lacks the developed consciousness necessary to representing ideal objects. Moreover, the child at this stage lacks the higher-order consciousness needed to see itself as realizing itself by attaining an ideal object with which it has identified its satisfaction. At this early stage we are only talking about appetite since the child desires the object only when it is present; at a later stage the child will gain a sense of these things as independent external objects that persist, ceteris paribus, and so can be desired in their absence.

The child also experiences other people and is eventually going to recognize them as individuals with independent wills—i.e., as others who have their own plans and projects and as selves attempting to realize themselves through their actions, and who, because of these facts, may oppose or confirm its own desires, oppose its will. Since initially these others are going to be family members or care-givers there will be a pre-conscious bond of affection between them and the child. When the child acts in accord with the will of another, pleasure results from the affirmation from that other person, while opposition is experienced as painful because it negates the bond of affection. This produces the felt tension similar to that which occurs in the case of an inaccessible desired object: a tension between the pleasure associated with the presence of the care-giver and the pain of being without the approval of that person. The main point here is that the child will tend to be good (i.e., fit in with the norms and expectations of the caregivers) solely because not doing so is painful, not because the child has, at this stage, any goal it is trying to achieve by being good, nor even the ability to articulate why it acts as it does. As Bradley says,

The child is taught to will a content which is universal and good, and he learns to identify his will with it, so that he feels pleasure when he feels himself in accord with it, uneasiness or pain when his will is contrary thereto, and he feels that it is contrary. This is the beginning of personal morality. (Ethical Studies, Essay V [1962: 178])

As the child develops it learns the language of morality and thereby the moral perspective embedded in it. In this process the child learns the meaning of normative concepts and in doing so learns what they mean to others in the shared linguistic community. In this way the social community imparts a moral perspective. In fact, the community introduces the child to two levels of moral reflection: it imparts specific moral values and norms through its institutions and practices, and; it provides the moral concepts that are necessary to the task of conceiving of ways to improve society, in this way making possible the move to the more comprehensive level of Ideal Morality.

The above rehearsal glosses over several identifiable stages of moral development set out in Bradley’s moral psychology. These details can be ignored here, for the important point to note is that Bradley attempts to supple a psychological account of moral development that fills in the final part of his exposition of the theory of self-realization by explaining how one comes to identify one’s satisfaction with the achieving or realizing of particular moral ends. It is also important to note the roles he assigns to pleasure and pain. That these have a place in his moral theory indicates that the ethical hedonists were not totally wrong about their importance, their mistake being to think that promoting pleasure and diminishing pain marks the ultimate goal of moral activity. By contrast, Bradley argues that in acting morally we choose and will and act in terms of the idea of a state of affairs which represents a superior self to be realized. We feel pleasure at the thought of that self with which we have identified because we feel affirmed by the thought of its realization. We feel pain at the felt contradiction between this and our actual self and pain at the thought of not being the superior self we desire.

Bradley’s excursion into moral psychology represents an effort to explain the process whereby one identifies one’s satisfaction with a particular ideal object, which is an essential element in the structure of volitional action. He traces the transitions from early states of mental life through to the sort of consciousness exhibited by a mature moral agent. From primitive appetites which involve a precursor self that affirms itself through its desires we arrive at a variety of types of actions and of objects of volition and different relations between the self and the objects. Children move from the simple desire to possess the object to the pleasure taken in the approval of others, to self-conscious moral action. These stages also reveal the development of feelings and emotions and an increasing range of types of object that one might take pleasure in. In other words, there is not only the fixation of desire on certain objects, but also an extension of the individual’s range of interests and these move out beyond desired objects to an interest in other people and future events and so on.

An important feature of this developmental process is gaining knowledge of good and bad and the capacity to will both. The need for this arises, first, at the formal level of the structure of volitional action, which entails the dualism of inferior and superior selves (or conceptions of these). To get beyond formal necessary conditions to an account of specific actions this formal structure has to be filled in with some determinate content which explains what the nature of these two selves is. At the level of social morality this may involve no more than knowledge of what society demands of me—which I will identify as the superior, good self I should be—alongside my tendencies to go my own way which marks the bad self that opposes the social norms. But there must be more than mere knowledge, for it is also necessary, psychologically, that we actually feel the tension produced by the conflicting tendencies to be both good and bad. It is not simply that one fails to comprehend fully the nature of moral action without this, but that we also cannot feel the contradictions that will move us to action, and without action there is no morality. Hence, the common notion that moral agents are often viewed as having to expend a great deal of effort on the internal struggle between the desire to be good and a propensity to do things known to be bad is correct. In Bradley’s theory the ultimate moral end of self-realization presents two pictures of the self, labels one of these “superior” and sets the moral task as realizing that superior self in the face of the actual, inferior self. In this way moral conflicts are always internal struggles. In acting morally I aim at realizing my good self, which I see as my true self. Yet I cannot in good faith say that my bad self is not myself, with the result that, as Bradley rather picturesquely puts it, “when I enter the lists against it, it is at my own breast that I lay my lance in rest” (Ethical Studies, Essay VII [1962: 277]). The battle against bad tendencies never ends, making the process of self-systematization a never-ending process. We can never fully realize our moral ideal and become the perfect self we are striving to be. But we can proximate it. As a result, self-realization is never complete; it is as long and diverse as the life we live.

8. The Limits of Morality

It is not uncommon for secondary sources to assume that Bradley equates moral, social, political, and religious domains; this assumption leads to a lot of confusion concerning Bradley’s beliefs. In most cases, such assumptions can be traced to exaggerated presuppositions about Hegel’s influence on Bradley. Such presuppositions apart, careful reading of Ethical Studies reveals that Bradley makes a clear distinction between moral consciousness and religion, on the one hand, and between moral, social and political spheres, on the other.

Here are a few examples. Bradley finishes Ethical Studies with a brief consideration of religious consciousness, saying that “[m]orality issues in religion” (Ethical Studies, Concluding Remarks [1962: 314]). It is not difficult to notice certain Hegelian overtones in this claim, which may lead one to believe that Bradley sees religion as a sort of “upgraded” morality. However, one must note that by itself the statement that “morality issues in religion” is not enough to point to Bradley’s adoption of the dialectical move from the final part of The Phenomenology of Spirit (Hegel 1807): the structure of Ethical Studies does not follow Hegelian dialectics in any consistent manner. What is more likely is that Bradley tries to delineate the sphere of moral practice (i.e., actions and their motivation) and show its difference from the sphere of religious practice. Bradley only discusses religion in the chapter called “Concluding Remarks”, placing it outside the main body of the book. This shows that the discussion of religion lies beyond the discussion of morality as such. And indeed, Bradley explains his choice by saying: “[a]nd here we should close these Essays, since here we go beyond morality” (Ethical Studies, Concluding Remarks [1962: 313]).

Bradley further elaborates this distinction: thinking in moral terms presupposes a belief in the fundamental gap between reality and the desirable/ideal. Once this gap is bridged there is no more need for morality (in this Bradley comes close to Kant). To the extent that people have both a “good” and a “bad” self, they are a “self-contradiction”, and if these are necessary to morality as Bradley’s suggests they are then the ultimate moral end of action—self-realization as an infinite whole—cannot be achieved. As he puts it,

we are a self-contradiction: we never are what we feel we really are; we really are what we know we are not; and if we became what we are, we should scarcely be ourselves. (Ethical Studies, Essay VI [1962: 234])

Morality really seeks its own demise for were the ideal self realized there would be nothing that remains to be actualized, at which point morality is at an end. “Morality aims at the cessation of that which makes it possible” (Ethical Studies, Essay VI [1962: 234]). In the moral sphere, the opposition between what is real and what is ideal can never be overcome. Once they merge, it is no longer the sphere of morality. Moral actions aim to change reality to meet the ideal; while moral evaluations (in terms of right/wrong, good/bad) estimate how well we manage to change the word to become ideal. An agent is motivated morally as long as she believes that the ideal world does not yet exist (and hence the need to bring it about through actions); if the agent believes that the ideal world is already real in some way (e.g., through God), she is no longer motivated morally but religiously. The sphere of religious practice, for Bradley, is characterized by this belief that what ought to be already exists in the Absolute.

The tendency to read the identification of social/political and moral into Ethical Studies can also be traced to the conviction that Bradley’s ethical theory is an updated version of Hegel’s social morality, and from the persisting belief that Bradley identifies the moral self with one’s station, and moral obligation with social requirements. This approach, however, overlooks most of Bradley’s arguments against Hegelian-style bottom-up identification of the real and the ideal, put forth in Essay V (Babushkina 2019). In contrast to Hegel, Bradley believes that moral personhood cannot be reduced to the social:

the moral man can to a certain extent distinguish his moral essence from his particular function … the content of the ideal self does not fall wholly within any community, is in short not merely the ideal of a perfect social being. (Ethical Studies, Essay V [1962: 205])

The core of Bradley’s argument is the claim that we cannot conclude anything about the moral character of the person solely from the diligence with which she performs what the society expects from her: it is an open question whether the one who fulfills her positional duties well is also morally good. We need an independent reason to determine whether her following social orders in that specific situation was a morally right thing to do; in the end, the state may be in “a confused or rotten condition, so that right and might do not always go together” (Ethical Studies, Essay V [1962: 204]). We are not justified to reduce moral norms to custom and law: “[a] man can not take his morality simply from the moral world he is in” (Ethical Studies, Essay V [1962: 204]). Moral goodness is “goodness not of any particular time and country” (Ethical Studies, Essay V [1962: 205]) and it is incompatible with apparent cultural relativism of what people happen to value.


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  • –––, 2013, “British Idealist Ethics”, in The Oxford Handbook of the History of Ethics, Roger Crisp (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 564–580 (ch. 27). doi:10.1093/oxfordhb/9780199545971.001.0001
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  • Manser, Anthony Richards and Guy Stock (eds), 1984, The Philosophy of F.H. Bradley, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Mill, John Stuart, 1863 [2001], Utilitarianism, London: Parker, Son & Bourn. Reprinted in 2001, with his 1868 speech on Capital Punishment, Indianapolis: Hackett Pub.
  • Milne, A. J. M., 1962, The Social Philosophy of English Idealism, London: Allen & Unwin.
  • Muirhead, J.H., 1892, The Elements of Ethics: An Introduction to Moral Philosophy, London: John Murray.
  • –––, 1932, “Francis Herbert Bradley”, in The Great Victorians, H.J. Massingham and Hugh Massingham (eds), London: Nicholson and Watson, 33–46.
  • Nicholson, Peter P., 1990, The Political Philosophy of the British Idealists: Selected Studies, Cambridge, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Norman, Richard, 1983, The Moral Philosophers: An Introduction to Ethics, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Pugmire, David, 1996, “Some Self: F.H.Bradley on the Self as ‘Mere’ Feeling”, Bradley Studies, 2(1): 24–32. doi:10.5840/bradley19962111
  • Rashdall, Hastings, 1907, The Theory of Good and Evil: A Treatise on Moral Philosophy, Oxford: The Clarendon Press.
  • Rescher, Nicholas, 1987, Ethical Idealism: An Inquiry into the Nature and Function of Ideals, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Sabine, George H., 1915, “The Social Origin of Absolute Idealism”, The Journal of Philosophy, Psychology and Scientific Methods, 12(7): 169–177. doi:10.2307/2013244
  • Santayana George, 1933, Some Turns of Thought in Modern Philosophy, London: Cambridge University Press.
  • Sidgwick, Henry, 1874, The Methods of Ethics, London: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1876, “Review of Ethical Studies, by F. H. Bradley,” Mind (original series), 1(4): 545–549. doi:10.1093/mind/os-1.4.545
  • –––, 1954, Outlines of the History of Ethics, London: Macmillan; first edition, 1886.
  • Sprigge, T.L.S., 1984, “The Self and its World in Bradley and Husserl”, in Manser and Stock 1984: 285–302.
  • –––, 1988, The Rational Foundations of Ethics, (The Problems of Philosophy), London/New York: Routledge & Kegan Paul. doi:10.4324/9781003049333
  • –––, 1993, James and Bradley: American Truth and British Reality, La Salle, IL: Open Court.
  • Stanley, Maurice, 1996, “The Paradox of the Individual”, Bradley Studies, 2(1): 51–63. doi:10.5840/bradley1996217
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  • –––, 2015, “Does Hegelian Ethics Rest on a Mistake?”, in his Kantian Ethics: Value, Agency, and Obligation, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 157–170 (ch. 9). Reprinted in “I That Is We, We That Is I.” Perspectives on Contemporary Hegel, Italo Testa and Luigi Ruggiu (eds), Leiden: Brill, 2016, 107–126 (ch. 6). doi:10.1163/9789004322967_007
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Bibliographical Material

  • Ingardia, Richard, 1991, Bradley: A Research Bibliography, (Bibliographies of Famous Philosophers), Bowling Green, OH: Philosophy Documentation Center, Bowling Green State University. Please note the volume contains occasional typos and mistakes in the references, but to this date this is the most comprehensive catalogue of literature on F.H. Bradley before 1991.

Other Internet Resources

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