Supplement to Rudolf Carnap

F. Semantics

In 1931, Carnap had rejected certain philosophical uses of meaning as metaphysical and developed a quite different formal-syntactic account of linguistic symbols. In application to the meaning of logical symbols, his approach could be called, in contemporary terminology, a version of “proof-theoretic semantics” or “logical inferentialism”. This idea was expounded in the Logical Syntax (1934a): “In a strictly formally constructed system, the meaning of these symbols… arises out of the rules of transformation” (that is, the syntactic rules of inference). However, Carnap was not able to avoid talk of (what we would now call) semantic interpretation in favor of mere syntax in all of the Logical Syntax. Indeed, Tarski (1936 [2002]: §2) correctly characterizes Carnap’s definition of consequence for Carnap’s Language II in the Logical Syntax as semantic and considers his own model-theoretic definition of logical consequence to be essentially equivalent to Carnap’s (though more widely applicable than Carnap’s, which was designed for Language II). (See the supplement on the Logical Syntax of Language and the main entry (Section 5) for further details.)

Only a year after the publication of Logical Syntax, Carnap was persuaded by Alfred Tarski to accept something he once again called “meaning”—and also “reference” (when he emigrated to the US the following year, and began to write in English). This terminology was probably a strategic mistake for Carnap (cf. Woleński 1999 on the terminology and background), as it misled many of his readers, both erstwhile followers and staunch opponents, into thinking that Carnap was returning to some substantial account of meaning of the kind he had previously relied on in the Aufbau and other pre-1932 publications. But that was not the case: in particular, after 1935, Carnap remained an inferentialist about scientific theoretical terms (see supplement on Reconstruction of Scientific Theories). And he combined his acceptance of Tarski’s account of truth, meaning, and reference—adding semantics to his previously only “bi-partite” syntactic-logical and pragmatic conception of meta-science (Uebel 2012, 2013)—with a deflationary understanding of abstract semantic entities (see section 2 and 3 of the supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology). Some, however, were deeply puzzled by the apparent paradox that Carnap both accepted semantics and had no substantive account of the meaning relation (e.g., Russell 1940; see Pincock 2007).

Carnap first argued in favor of a Tarskian conception of truth, and a distinction between truth and confirmation, in his paper “Truth and Confirmation” (Carnap 1949a), whose German original appeared in 1935. The first expositions of the new conception of semantic truth were in Foundations of Logic and Mathematics (1939) and Introduction to Semantics (1942). The principle of tolerance in the Logical Syntax remained intact (see the supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Section 1)), but in the following refined form: the syntactic rules of formation can be chosen freely; if the syntactical rules of transformation (derivation, inference) are determined prior to the semantic rules, they may be determined freely as well, but the semantic rules have to be selected in such a way that the transformation rules are sound with respect to them. And vice versa, if the semantic rules are chosen prior to the transformation rules, they may be determined freely, in which case the transformation rules will need to match them by being sound with respect to them (see, e.g., Section 12 of Carnap 1939). Completely new questions arose, e.g., whether the rules of inference of classical propositional logic would determine the semantics of the standard logical connectives uniquely (given certain constraints): Carnap was fascinated with this novel type of categoricity question; this particular one was answered in the negative by Carnap (1943). (In recent years, this part of Carnap’s work has sparked a lively debate: see, e.g., Raatikainen 2008, Murzi & Hjortland 2009.) Semantics became just as important in Carnap’s work for the construction of formal languages as syntax had been in the Logical Syntax.

After this groundwork had been laid, Carnap extended Tarski’s extensional semantics by a new intensional semantics for, e.g., the sentential modal necessity operator ‘N’ (Carnap’s symbol). Carnap’s invention of what would become modern “possible worlds semantics” in the decades afterwards was important for modal logic and had a decisive influence on the development of intensional semantics in philosophy and theoretical linguistics.

On the logical side, possible worlds semantics as we now know it is rightly associated with Saul Kripke, whose seminal and ingenious formal and philosophical work from the late 1950s does justify usage of the term “Kripke semantics”. (Jaakko Hintikka, Stig Kanger, and Richard Montague did similar work at around the same time.) But as David Lewis (1973: 46) points out, the idea of reconstructing propositions (the intensions of sentences) as sets of possible worlds goes back at least to two sources: C.I. Lewis (1943), which is cited by Carnap (1947), and Carnap himself. C. I. Lewis (1943) presents the basic idea of possible worlds semantics but does not work out any formal semantics. (The introduction of C. I. Lewis and Langford 1932: 24, had already referred to the Wittgensteinian idea that “any law of logic is equivalent to some statement which exhausts the possibilities [our emphasis]”.) Carnap’s (1942) Introduction to Semantics, §18–19 already includes the evaluation of non-modal formulas at so-called state-descriptions, that is, at possible worlds (in Carnap’s terminology), and Carnap (1946, 1947) developed the formal semantics for both non-modal and modal formulas. That said, there are various significant differences between Carnap’s possible worlds semantics and modern Kripke semantics for modal logic, as we will explain in detail at the end of section 1 below: in particular, Carnap’s semantics does not invoke an accessibility relation between possible worlds and uses a fixed set of all logically possible worlds (the set of all so-called “state-descriptions”), which is why Carnap’s object-linguistic necessity operator N is bound to express logical truth (“L-truth”, in Carnap’s terms). This contrasts with Kripke semantics, which can be used for a wide variety of modal operators that do not necessarily express logical truth. However, there are also salient similarities: most importantly, Carnap’s semantics evaluates formulas at possible worlds (state-descriptions), and the semantic rule for N relies on universal quantification over worlds: \(N(A)\) holds in state-description s if and only if A holds in every state-description (see §41 of Meaning and Necessity, 1947). For that reason it is perhaps surprising that none of Kripke’s early papers on possible worlds semantics cite Carnap (1942, 1946), 1947 [1956b]), nor does Kripke’s Naming and Necessity (1980) do so later, despite its obvious allusion to Carnap’s title.

On the more linguistic side, Richard Montague’s intensional semantics for natural language built on Carnap’s semantics: “Montague unified Carnap’s work with Kripke and Kanger’s” (Partee 2011: 20). For instance, Montague (1969) cites both Carnap’s Meaning and Necessity and unpublished work by Carnap (who was Montague’s colleague at UCLA). And David Lewis (1970: 23) refers to Carnap as the source of modern intensional semantics:

The plan to construe intensions as extension-determining functions originated with Carnap… Accordingly, let us call such functions Carnapian intensions.

(See section 1 below for more on Carnapian intensions.)

The literature on Carnap’s semantics is so extensive that it would be impossible to give an adequate overview in a manageable space. We focus here (in section 1) on the intensional semantics of Meaning and Necessity as well as of Carnap’s technical article “Modalities and Quantification” (1946). (In his reply to Myhill in the Schilpp volume, Carnap suggested some improvements of his original semantics, which we will not cover here; see Myhill 1963, Carnap 1963b.) We conclude (in section 2) with a discussion of the question whether, or to what extent, his interest in intensional languages led Carnap to change his mind about the so-called “thesis of extensionality” he had maintained in the Aufbau, the Logical Syntax, and in other pre-semantic works.

1. Intensional Semantics

The goal of Carnap’s semantic project was to find a way to determine the meanings of expressions belonging to a formal object language, and to reconstruct linguistic expressions in natural or scientific language in such formal languages. Carnap took Tarski to have achieved this goal satisfyingly for extensional languages, by compositionally assigning extensions (in Carnap’s terminology) to singular terms, predicates, and sentences: an individual object to a singular term, a set of such objects or tuples of such objects to a predicate, and a truth value to a sentence. The languages to which Tarski’s semantics was applicable were extensional in the sense that all linguistic contextsA… in which an expression A may occur grammatically were extensional; if A is replaced in such a context by an expression B that has the same extension as A, then …A… has the same extension as the resulting …B… (see Meaning and Necessity, §11. In what follows, paragraphs refer to Meaning and Necessity).

Carnap’s semantics extends Tarski’s by assigning to each singular term, each predicate, and each sentence both an extension and an intension. The intension of a linguistic expression, which explicates what we understand when we understand the expression, is determined solely by the semantic rules of the language. The extension of a linguistic expression, in contrast, is determined by applying the semantic rules (or the expression’s intension) in combination with or in (§2, §41) the actual or true “state-description” (the actual possible world).

For instance, by the semantic rule for negation, a sentence of the form \(\neg A\) holds in a state-description s if and only if A does not hold in s. Or equivalently: \(\neg A\) has the truth value “true” in s just in case A does not have the truth value “true” in s (and hence has the truth value “false” in s). State-descriptions are sets X of sentences for which the following is the case: for each atomic sentence in the object language, either the sentence or its negation is a member of X, but not both; and X only includes atomic sentences or negations of atomic sentences. (In modern model-theoretic terminology, one would speak of the diagram of a model.) The expression “holds in” resembles, in modern terms, the semantic relationship of a sentence to a model, i.e., that a sentence is true in a model, as governed by the usual Tarskian recursive clauses. This said, it should be kept in mind that Carnapian state-descriptions are not quite Tarskian models: e.g., unlike models, state-descriptions do not include domains (universes of quantification). Carnap adapted this idea of a state-description from Wittgenstein’s Tractatus, and followed Wittgenstein’s setup whereby each individual object of one’s universe is denoted by “its” corresponding individual constant in the object language. As Carnap says in §2 of Meaning and Necessity, a state-description therefore yields a complete description of a possible state of the universe of these individual objects with respect to the properties and relations that are expressed by predicates of the semantic system; state-descriptions thus represent something like Leibniz’s possible worlds (§2). One of the state-descriptions describes the “actual state of the universe” (§2), a sentence is true (simpliciter) if and only if it holds in that actual or true state description (§2), and the extension of a sentence is its (actual) truth value (§6). It follows that a sentence \(\neg A\) is true, that is, holds in the true state-description, if and only if A does not hold in the true state description, that is, if and only if A is not true. The extensions of other kinds of linguistic expressions can be made precise in a similar Tarskian manner, though extensions are not themselves the subject matter of intensional semantics (§2), which is interested in the semantics of linguistic expressions throughout all possible worlds. Whereas the intension of a linguistic expression can be determined completely by applying the semantic rules, its actual extension may require not just semantic but also empirical investigation to be determined. In Carnap’s example (§4), whether Scott belongs to the extension of the predicate “human”, i.e. is a member of the class of human beings, must be investigated empirically. Carnap also uses the same semantics of state-descriptions in his later work on inductive logic (e.g., in Logical Foundations of Probability, Carnap 1950b), in which he studies logical or semantic probability measures; see the supplement on Inductive Logic for details. Against this background, the intension of a singular term is understood to be an individual concept (a kind of abstract complete description of an individual object), the intension of a predicate is a concept (a property or relation), and the intension of a sentence is the proposition expressed by it. Even an individual variable is assigned both an extension (an object) and an intension (an individual concept) at the same time. Carnap regards all of these intensions to be “objective”, that is, non-mental, and, when useful, they may be identified with logical constructions (sets or functions) on state-descriptions; e.g., the proposition expressed by a sentence may be identified with the so-called “range” of the sentence, that is, the set of state-descriptions in which the sentence holds (see Carnap 1947 [1956b: §40])—where that range captures the truth conditions of the sentence. The range of a sentence, taken together with what Carnap calls “rules of designation” (which paraphrase how predicates and individual constants are to be interpreted), yields an interpretation for that sentence (§2). But Carnap is explicit that propositions need not be identified with ranges: see §6. He had already suggested the same identification procedure, though not explicitly for propositions, in §56 of Logical Syntax, citing the “Spielräume” in Wittgenstein’s Tractatus as motivating this idea. He comes back to it as one possibility of explicating propositions in §19 of Introduction to Semantics (Carnap 1942), and in Meaning and Necessity, again with reference to the Tractatus.

Similarly, individual concepts may be reconstructed as functions taking state-descriptions to individual constants. (“we shall take any assignment of exactly one individual constant to each state-description… as representing an individual concept”, Meaning and Necessity §49). If intensions are reconstructed this way, they become logical constructions on syntactic objects, as state-descriptions themselves are nothing but sets of sentences. (When, furthermore, syntax itself is reconstructed arithmetically, intensions become purely mathematical entities.) But intensions are always semantic entities determined by compositional semantic rules. In any case, however intensions are identified, Carnap sets up his semantics in such a way that two sentences A and B are assigned the same intension if and only if the equivalence \(A\leftrightarrow B\) is L-true, where a sentence is defined as L-true (logically true) in Meaning and Necessity just in case it holds in every state-description. Carnap takes L-truth to be a semantic concept (p. 1 of Meaning and Necessity) that explicates the informal “convention” of calling a sentence logically true if and only if the sentence is true in virtue of the semantic rules alone without reference to facts that are “external to language” (§2). (In “Meaning Postulates” (Carnap 1952a) he suggests that meaning postulates could restrict the range of state-descriptions, in which case truth in all state-descriptions would correspond to analyticity rather than logical truth. In the different context of natural languages, variants of Carnapian meaning postulates were later put to use in intensional semantics for natural languages: see Partee 1975.)

While Carnap’s method of extension and intension is applicable to extensional languages, too, its real payoff becomes apparent only when applied to an intensional language, i.e., to a language supplying only extensional and intensional contexts but including at least one intensional context. A context …A… (i.e., in which A occurs) is called “intensional” just in case (a) it is not extensional (see above), and (b) if A is replaced an expression B that has the same intension as A, then the original …A… has the same intension as the resulting …B… (Compare §11 of Meaning and Necessity.) The paradigm case example of an intensional context is created by a sentential necessity operator N: \(N(A)\) (“it is necessary that A”) may differ in truth value (extension) from \(N(B)\) (“it is necessary that B”), even when A and B have the same truth value, which is why the linguistic context N(…) is not extensional. Indeed, N(…) is an intensional context, according to Carnap’s intensional semantics for languages with N, since, additionally, if A and B have the same intension—their material equivalence \(A\leftrightarrow B\) being L-true—then the same holds for \(N(A)\) and \(N(B)\). The reason is that if A is L-true, and hence B is L-true (by \(A\leftrightarrow B\) being L-true), then both \(N(A)\) and \(N(B)\) will hold in all state-descriptions. On the other hand, if A is not L-true, and hence B is not L-true (again by \(A\leftrightarrow B\) being L-true), then both \(N(A)\) and \(N(B)\) will not hold in any state-description. Carnap’s corresponding semantic rule for N is: \(N(A)\) holds in a state-description s if and only if A holds in every state-description (every possible world). (See Carnap 1947 [1956b, §41].) Since the set of state-descriptions corresponds to all logically possible (linguistic representations of) interpretations of the descriptive vocabulary of the language in question, and by instantiating ‘s’ with the actual state-description, this implies: \(N(A)\) is true if and only if A is logically true. Thus, N expresses within the object language the usual metalinguistic and model-theoretic concept of logical truth for sentences. (The corresponding possibility operator, for which Carnap employs the diamond symbol as we do now, is introduced in the standard manner as \(\neg N\neg\).)

In Meaning and Necessity, Carnap works out this intensional semantics in some formal and philosophical detail for three example languages: \(S_1\) is a first-order language and thus extensional, but it includes definite descriptions and lambda terms. (In §10 Carnap also discusses how \(S_1\) may be extended to a language with higher-order quantifiers.) \(S_2\) extends \(S_1\) by unrestricted applications of the sentential N operator: hence \(S_2\) is an intensional language. The first-order quantifiers of \(S_2\) are taken to range, extensionally, over (individual constants one-to-one correlated with) individuals, and intensionally, over all individual concepts. (Carnap 1946 had interpreted first-order quantifiers substitutionally.) Finally, \(S_3\) is a “coordinate language” (similar to those in the Logical Syntax; see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language) with singular terms that are assigned special “L-determined” (rigid) extensions that are the same in every state-description: coordinate positions in one-dimensional linear space. Carnap takes \(S_3\) to be particularly interesting as far as applications to (rational reconstructions of) physics are concerned. In all three languages, as in Carnap (1946), identity statements with syntactically distinct individual constants are counted as logical falsities. (He later uses the same convention in a probabilistic context: see the supplement on Inductive Logic.) In §43 he also gives some examples of higher-order quantification into intensional contexts, but that is not a central concern in Meaning and Necessity. By means of representative examples such as his three example languages, Carnap presents a scheme of how to set up his method of extension and intension for a broad class of semantic systems.

While Carnap did not develop the corresponding modal logics of \(S_2\) and \(S_3\) in full formal detail in Meaning and Necessity, Carnap’s (1946) “Modalities and Quantification” had already proven C.I. Lewis’ system S5 of modal propositional logic to be sound and complete with respect to his semantics if applied to a modal propositional language with the N operator. (S5 includes all instances of, e.g., \(N(A) \rightarrow A\) and \(\neg N(A)\rightarrow N(\neg N(A))\).) The completeness proof relies on a previous result by Wajsberg (1933). For this completeness theorem to hold it is important that Carnap defines a formula A to be L-true here just in case all of it its substitution instances have maximal range or hold in in every state-description (Carnap 1946: 40f). A substitution instance results from A by substituting arbitrary formulas for its atomic subformulas. (Occurrences of one and the same atomic subformula need to be replaced by occurrences of one and the same formula.) See Makinson (1966) and Schurz (2001) for more on this. In the same paper, Carnap had also given a sound axiomatization of the first-order version of the system (which, as mentioned before, differed from Meaning and Necessity in its substitutional interpretation of quantifiers); but he left the question of complete axiomatizability open. As he did show, e.g., both of what we now call the (universal quantifier versions of the) Barcan formula \(\forall xN(A)\rightarrow N \forall xA\) and the converse Barcan formula \(N\forall xA\rightarrow \forall xN(A)\) are L-true and provable in the system (Carnap 1946: 54), just as they are L-true in \(S_2\) in Meaning and Necessity. These formulas had been introduced by Ruth Barcan (1946) in the issue of the Journal of Symbolic Logic that came out immediately before the issue in which Carnap’s (1946) article appeared in the same journal. Later it was proven that the set of L-truths in Carnap’s first-order modal predicate semantics MFL (“modal functional logic”) is not recursively axiomatizable; Carnap’s (1946) axiomatic proof system MFC (“modal functional calculus”, later often referred to as system ‘C’) is therefore incomplete (see, e.g., Gheerbrant & Mostowski 2006). This is the case because Carnap defined L-truth for formulas in the language of modal predicate logic without considering their substitution instances (as he had done for modal propositional logic): A is L-true if and only if A holds in every state description (the same definition as in Meaning and Necessity). In modern terms, the reason his system is non-axiomatizable is that when A is a non-modal first-order formula, A is not logically true just in case \(\neg N(A)\) is L-true; hence, if L-truth were recursively axiomatizable, first-order logical truth would be decidable, which is not the case by Church’s theorem. Alternatively, one could diagnose the problem to be that Carnap’s definition of L-truth does not vary the underlying set of worlds, which is why the necessity operator behaves much like a second-order quantifier over an infinite domain in those cases in which the object language includes infinitely many individual constants and in which, therefore, the set of state-descriptions has infinitely many members.

In Chapter III of Meaning and Necessity (especially §30), Carnap argues that his method is an improvement over Frege’s theory of meaning (reference, denotation, nominatum) and sense (connotation). The meaning (reference) part of Frege’s theory Carnap subsumes under the term “method of the naming relation”: what a linguistic expression A denotes, according to Frege, depends on the context …A… in which A occurs; e.g., an atomic sentence A might denote the truth if taken by itself, while the same sentence A (qua sentence type) would denote the sense of (the original) A in the non-extensional (in Frege’s terminology, “ungerade”) context \(N(A)\). And that same sentence A would denote an even more complex entity in the context \(N(N(A))\), and so forth. Frege had accepted the principle that expressions that are co-extensional (in a context) may always be substituted for each other (in that context) without changing the extensions of sentences (that supply the context), that is, their truth values, but the price he had to pay for this was an infinite hierarchy of named entities and a strong sensitivity of the reference of names to the linguistic contexts in which they occur. In contrast, the method of extension and intension assigns the same extension and the same intension to A in whatever linguistic context A occurs; at the same time, Carnap restricts the exchangeability of co-extensional expressions to extensional contexts. (At the end of §28 of Meaning and Necessity, Carnap also makes a critical point Quine would later make better known—that Frege does not state any identity criteria for the propositions or thoughts that are expressed by sentences.)

The differences between Carnap’s intensional semantics and modern treatments of possible worlds semantics are the following: Carnap takes the set of worlds to be the set of all state-descriptions, which means that the non-modal formulas that hold in all these worlds are precisely the logically true ones, and there could not be two distinct worlds that evaluate all non-modal formulas equally, that is, in modern terminology, worlds are identified with (diagrams of) models. There is no (Kripkean) accessibility relation between worlds, which is why modal logic remains confined to the scope of the system S5; and since the set of worlds is assumed to be the set of all state-descriptions whatsoever, Carnap’s N operator is bound to express a logical or semantic version of necessity. In the definition of logical truth, as mentioned above, the set of worlds is not varied either. With respect to their intensions, first-order variables are interpreted as ranging over individual concepts rather than “objectually” as ranging over individuals (as we would now usually have it, after Kripke). One might want to summarize this last point by stating that Carnap’s semantics predates the new theory of reference: indeed, Føllesdal (1961) criticizes Carnap on precisely these grounds, and claims that if Carnap had not excluded the N operator from definite descriptions (as Carnap did in §41 of Meaning and Necessity), necessity in Carnap’s system would have collapsed into mere truth. However, Marti (1994) and Kremer (1997) have argued that this specific criticism is unfounded. Moreover, although individual variables are (using Kripkean terminology) non-rigid in Meaning and Necessity (and quantification is substitutional in Carnap 1946), individual constants are rigid both in Carnap (1946) and Meaning and Necessity. Finally, as Carnap (1947 [1956b]) argues in §41 and (against Quine) in §44, the singular terms of his system may still be understood as referring to objects rather than individual concepts in extensional contexts: that is because, e.g., the truth value of an atomic formula \(B(x)\) at a state-description s relative to a variable assignment only depends on the “local” value at s of the very individual concept assigned to the variable x. Other than such issues of reference and quantification, Carnap’s modal logic and intensional semantics are also restricted by not dealing with interpretations of the N operator other than in terms of the logical truth of sentences or the logical necessity of propositions. He neither draws the Kripkean distinction between analyticity and metaphysical necessity, nor does he interpret N in terms of knowledge or belief, as Jaakko Hintikka famously did later. (See Williamson 2013, Sections 2.4 and 5.3, for a recent discussion and criticism of Carnap’s modal logic from the prevailing viewpoint that prefers treating quantifiers as ranging over objects even in intensional contexts. See Horsten 2005 for an application of Carnap’s logic and semantics in the development of so-called canonical naming systems for mathematical objects.)

2. Carnap’s Extensionalism

The logical system of Carnap’s Aufbau (see supplement on Aufbau) had been simple type theory, in which one can quantify over individuals, properties and relations of individuals, properties and relations of such properties and relations, and so on. In addition, Carnap allows talk about classes of entities or extensions (see §§32–33 in the Aufbau). However, following Russell’s so-called “no-class” interpretation of type-theory, he thinks that quantification over classes can always be eliminated in favor of quantification over individuals (entities of the lowest type) or properties and relations (whether of individuals or higher-order). For that reason, he also speaks of classes or extensions as “quasi-objects” (§§32–34). The reverse is also true: Carnap’s Thesis of Extensionality in the Aufbau (§43, §45) maintains that a term that stands for a concept (property or relation) can always be replaced by a term for the extension of that concept without affecting the truth values of statements. Indeed, the languages of Aufbau-type constitution systems are purely extensional in the sense explained in the last section. Carnap even thinks that something stronger can be shown: “there are no intensional statements. All statements are extensional” (§45). (It is tempting to read this as having influenced Quine’s later extensionalism. In any case, Quine would add to this a restriction to first-order languages, which Carnap did not.)

So how and why did Carnap later admit intensional contexts and intensions in Meaning and Necessity? After his adoption of the principle of tolerance in Logical Syntax (see the supplement on Tolerance, Metaphysics, and Meta-Ontology (Section 1)), there were no longer any rational grounds for him to exclude intensional languages, and he came to see that intensional operators are practically convenient and useful in science. Also, systems of logic and semantics became available by which linguistic frameworks for intensions and intensional operators could be made formally precise. None of this meant that Carnap had to give up extensionality completely: the thesis of extensionality merely needed to be weakened. We will now comment briefly on this important transition in Carnap’s semantic work.

Both Language I and II of the Logical Syntax (see the supplement on Logical Syntax of Language) are extensional. Sections §65 and §66 attempt a definition of extensional contexts by means of the non-semantic resources of the Logical Syntax. (Intensional contexts are simply defined as non-extensional ones.) At the same time, Carnap weakens the extensionality claims of the Aufbau (see above) as follows:

We [Wittgenstein, Russell, Carnap] all overlooked the fact that there is a multiplicity of possible languages. Wittgenstein, especially, speaks continually of “the” language. From the point of view of general syntax, it is evident that the thesis [of extensionality] is incomplete, and must be completed by stating the languages to which it pertains. In any case it does not hold for all languages, as the well-known examples of intensional languages show. The reasons given by Wittgenstein, Russell, and myself… argue not for the necessity but merely for the possibility of an extensional language. For this reason we will now formulate the thesis of extensionality in a way which is at the same time more complete and less ambitious, namely: a universal language of science may be extensional; or, more exactly: for every given intensional language \(S_1\), an extensional language \(S_2\) may be constructed such that \(S_1\) can be translated into \(S_2\). [NB: ‘\(S_1\)’ and ‘\(S_2\)’ in this quotation should not be confused with the respective labels of semantic systems in Meaning and Necessity.] (Logical Syntax of Language: §67)

This reference to the mere possibility of an extensional language is, as in many other sections of Part IV of the Logical Syntax, an application of the principle of tolerance. (Compare the foreword of Logical Syntax: “the boundless ocean of unlimited possibilities” of language forms.)

Carnap’s method of translating sentences with intensional operators into purely extensional sentences in the Logical Syntax is itself syntactic: sentences, such as “\(A\lor\neg A\) is necessary” and “Because A, therefore B” are treated as so-called quasi-syntactical sentences (§63, §67, §69)—sentences which purport to ascribe properties and relations to objects in the “world” but which are really disguised syntactic sentences that ascribe syntactic properties and relations to syntactic objects. For the same reason, such sentences can be translated into equivalent or “equipollent” (§65) syntactic sentences. From Carnap’s point of view, they belong to the same kind as, e.g., “Prim(3) contains 3”, which really should have been formulated as: “The expression ‘3’ occurs in the expression ‘Prim(3)’ syntactically” (see §§67–68). Accordingly, Carnap translates “\(A\lor\neg A\) is necessary” into the syntactic “‘\(A\lor\neg A\)’ is analytic (in Language …)” and “Because A, therefore B” into “‘B’ is an L-consequence of ‘A’” (where L-consequence is logical consequence in a particular linguistic framework; see §69). To the extent to which the original sentences aimed to talk about the “world”—and thus were formulated “in the material mode of speech” (§64)—this amounts to a translation into the “formal mode of speech” of properly and transparently syntactic sentences. Since syntax itself can be formulated in an extensional language (e.g., via Gödelian coding, in an extensional language of arithmetic), intensional sentences such as the above can always be translated into extensional ones, without, Carnap thinks, any loss of inferential power. For example, “the term ‘3’ occurs in the formula ‘Prim(3)’” is indeed extensional, since it is of the form “\(R(a, b)\)”, where “a” and “b” are replaced by names of syntactic expressions, and “R” is a binary predicate that creates an extensional context.

On the other hand,

Since it is not known whether there are perhaps intensional sentences of a completely different kind from the familiar ones, we we also do not know whether the methods here discussed for translating all possible intensional sentences, or other methods, are applicable. So the thesis of extensionality (though it seems quite plausible to me) is presented here merely as a conjecture. (Logical Syntax of Language: §67)

While Carnap takes the use of modalities in the material mode of speech to risk

the danger of entanglement in obscurities and pseudo-problems that are avoided by the application of the formal mode, (Logical Syntax of Language: §69)

he does not regard the material mode of speech as altogether inadmissible in philosophy, and believes that the question of which kind of modal language to choose is a “question of expedience” (Logical Syntax of Language: §70):

We do not mean… that the material mode of speech should be entirely eliminated. Since it is in general use and often easier to understand, it may well be retained in its place. But it is a good thing to be conscious of its use. (Logical Syntax of Language: §75; see also §81)

(Later it was shown that the logical reconstruction of modalities by modal predicates of sentences, in the style of the Logical Syntax, allows for arbitrary nested applications of modalities, is more expressive than the standard reconstruction by modal sentential operators, and still allows for a kind of modern possible worlds semantics; on the other hand, the occurrence of semantic paradoxes needs to be avoided, which is not an issue for modal sentential operators: see, e.g., Halbach, Leitgeb, & Welch 2003.)

Carnap’s attitude towards extensional versus intensional languages does not seem to have changed much later: e.g., in Testability and Meaning, he opts for the exclusive use of extensional operators, but just for simplicity and because he believes intensional ones to be dispensable. In “The Methodological Character of Theoretical Concepts” (1956a: 42), he says that

signs for logical modalities (e.g., logical necessity and strict implication) and for causal modalities (e.g., causal necessity and causal implication) may be admitted if desired; but their inclusion would require a considerably more complicated set of rules of logical deduction (as syntactical or semantical rules).

“Meaning and Synonymy in Natural Languages” (1955b), which is a reply to Quine, formulates a different extensionality thesis for natural language, to which Carnap did not subscribe. (The thesis is: there is no fact of the matter about translation over and above matters of extension.)

Carnap’s invention of an intensional “possible worlds” semantics for intensional operators (see section 1) made intensional languages look if anything even more viable and respectable. But apart from that, what he says in §32 of Meaning and Necessity is just the updated version of his views from the Logical Syntax: he maintains that it is not known presently whether all of logic and science be expressed in extensional languages, and he repeats his thesis of extensionality in the form familiar from the Logical Syntax. Accordingly, he argues in §38 for the possibility of choosing an extensional metalanguage for semantics. Using Carnap’s term from §38 of Introduction to Semantics (1942), one might say that sentences of the form \(N(A)\) are quasi-logical in Meaning and Necessity; as mentioned in section 1 above, by the semantic rules of languages such as \(S_2\) and \(S_3\), it holds that \(N(A)\) is true just in case A is L-true. That is, the object-linguistic operator N may be taken to have a second metalinguistic reading according to which the semantic property of logical truth is ascribed to the sentence A. That is just the semantic version of the criterion for an expression to be quasi-syntactical, as described above. §32 of Meaning and Necessity also includes considerations similar to those in the Logical Syntax in other respects: Carnap thinks that non-extensional languages offer simpler expressions, though more complicated logical rules, which means that the question of “where the greater over-all simplicity and efficiency is to be found” remains unresolved. Non-extensional languages would have to be explored in greater detail before any answer could be given. As far as the metalanguage is concerned in which semantic studies such as Meaning and Necessity are carried out, Carnap remains tolerant as well; in Chapter IV he says that the metalanguage of his modal systems may be chosen to offer ways of talking about both intensions and extensions (metalanguage M, §33), or it may be neutral (metalanguage M’, §34, leaving open whether it concerns intensions or extensions), or it may be purely extensional (§38; §19 of Introduction to Semantics (Carnap 1942) had already dealt with “The Concept of L-range in an Extensional Metalanguage”). Hence, Carnap tentatively proposes that the metalanguage in which intensional semantics is to be developed may be purely extensional—just as modern Kripke semantics is usually formulated in the extensional first-order language of set-theory.

In an earlier part of Meaning and Necessity, Carnap even takes early steps towards what we would now call a hyperintensional semantics (compare Cresswell 1975, who cites Carnap 1947) by explaining synonymy not by L-equivalence but in terms of the stronger requirement of the existence of an intensional isomorphism (§15; a similar idea can be found in C.I. Lewis 1943). That might also have been his reason for not defining intensionality as non-extensionality (as he had done in the Logical Syntax), since otherwise intensional and (what we now call) hyperintensional contexts could no longer be distinguished. For instance, Carnap points out that belief contexts are neither extensional nor intensional and gives examples concerning the now familiar problem of logical omniscience (1947 [1956b: §13]). For instance, Cresswell’s (1985) later theory of structured meanings, which is meant to address the semantics of certain hyperintensional contexts, builds on Carnap’s notion of intensional isomorphism. (Further references relating to this notion are cited in the main entry (Section 6.3).) The scope of Carnap’s tolerance remains essentially as wide as in Part IV of the Logical Syntax, where none of his later semantic projects would have been excluded.

Copyright © 2020 by
Hannes Leitgeb <>
André Carus <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free