Notes to Category Mistakes

1. Metaphysics VII.5, 1030b28–35. Other relevant discussions are Aristotle’s remarks on negation in Categories 10, 13b22–24, and his discussion of predication in Posterior Analytics 1.4.

2. Ryle (1938, 203). For a discussion of Husserl’s influence on Ryle here see Thomason (2002, §3).

3. Ryle (1949, 16). This seems to be the first time the concept of a category mistakes is referred to using this label.

4. See Smart (1953), Baker (1956), Sommers (1963), and for a more recent contribution, Westerhoff (2002). A main theme in this debate is whether, as Smart argues, Ryle’s criterion for category differences over-generates categories. Smart’s complaint is that since, for example , ‘The seat of the chair is hard’ is fine and ‘The seat of the table is hard’ is, he claims, “nonsense”, chairs and tables will turn out to belong to different ontological categories. While one might respond to Smart’s particular examples by maintaining that sentences such as ‘The seat of the table is hard’ are not strictly speaking category mistakes, his argument can generalize to other examples (e.g. using the examples in §3.1 one can show that grape and fig, or sock and shoe would belong to different ontological categories).

5. See e.g. Strawson (1952) and Pap (1960).

6. See Goddard (1966), Routley (1966), Lambert (1968), Routley (1969), Haack (1971), Brady & Routley (1973), and Haack (1975).

7. Goddard (1968) and Lappin (1981) argue for a three-valued approach, Martin (1975) for a four-valued approach, Thomason (1972) for a supervaluationist approach, and Bergmann (1977) for an approach the combines elements from the latter two but nevertheless maintains that category mistakes are truth-valued.

8. For a representative exchange between interpretative semanticists and generative semanticists in which category mistakes play a central role see Katz (1970), and the response in McCawley (1971). For an extensive history of this debate in linguistics more generally see Harris (1993).

9. These include the publication of a two further monographs, one devoted entirely to the topic (Magidor 2013) and one discussing it extensively (Asher 2011), as well as a number of papers containing significant discussion of the phenomenon including (at least) the following: Abrusán (2011), Abrusán (2016), Almotahari (2014), Camp (2004), Elbourne (2016), Kinoshita (2017), Libert (2016), Magidor (2009), Magidor (2016), Magidor (2017), Prandi (2016), Shaw (2015), and Shaw (2016).

10. Additional support for the syntactic approach appears in Ziff (1964), Katz (1964), and Strawson (1970).

11. Note that it is controversial that even the who/which distinction is syntactic. For views on which it is presuppositional rather than syntactic see e.g., Cooper (1983, ch. 7), and Heim & Kratzer (1998, 123–28 and 244–5).

12. Later in this entry, we will discuss other kinds of felicitous embeddings of category mistakes (e.g. in certain conditionals or conjunctions). Those cases also pose a problem for the syntactic approach.

13. For some other contemporary endorsements of the meaninglessness view see Fine (2003, 207–8), Stern (2006, 252), Asher (2011, 5), and Ludlow (2011, 65).

14. Though Camp (2004) argues that category mistakes do have significant conceptual roles.

15. This latter assumption is rejected by sentential approaches to the semantics of attitude reports (e.g., Davidson 2001).

16. Though see the discussion of direct compositionality in §4 for formulations of the principle which do have this consequence.

17. The connection between category mistakes and metaphor is particularly highlighted in the literature. For example, Turbayne (1962, 12) borrows one of Ryle’s definitions of a category mistake (“the presentation of the facts of one category in the idioms of another”, Ryle (1949, 8) and suggests that it can serve as definition of metaphor, and Ricœur (1978, 233) says that “it is tempting to say that a metaphor is a kind of planned category mistake”.

18. See Stern (2006, 250–251).

19. Interestingly Stern (2006, 252–3) supports the meaninglessness view, and argues that the fact that Gricean and Davidsonian views of metaphor are incompatible with the view are a reason to reject these accounts of metaphor. But if the above argument is correct, Stern’s view is also incompatible with the meaninglessness view.

20.This suggestion was raised in an unpublished commentary by Guy Longworth.

21. More precisely, the argument supports the claim that category mistakes are truth-valueless, a claim which is compatible any of the three semantic accounts, but we will consider it here in the context of the truthvaluelessness view

22. It is also worth mentioning another view which endorses the Tarskian schema, but refuses to assert either that category mistakes are truth-valued or that they are truth-valueless (the lack of commitment to the claim that category mistakes are truth-valueless allows the view to avoid Williamson’s argument). See Field (2003) for a development of this strategy in other contexts.

23. This consequence is avoided by Shaw (2015)’s proposal, on which the quantifier will be automatically restricted so as to range over only concrete objects. However, note that Shaw’s treatment will still deem (arguably felicitous) sentences such as ‘Something is either a prime number or a green chair’ truth-valueless, as no non-empty domain restriction would allow for truth-evaluability.

24. Note that this assumption isn’t uncontroversial. For example, if it is controversial whether category mistakes are false or true-valueless, then presumably they are not trivially false.

25. Detailed defences of a presuppositional approach to category mistakes appear in Asher (2011) and Magidor (2013). The idea that category mistakes are a presuppositional phenomenon is also mentioned in passing in a number of general discussions of presupposition (see e.g. Beaver 1997, 994).

26. A complication is the phenomenon of presupposition accommodation (see von Fintel 2008).

27. Note that this label depends on adopting one of several non-equivalent ways of using the term ‘pragmatic’. The account is pragmatic only in the sense that the question of presupposition failure does not directly interact with the truth-conditions of the sentence. This still leaves open the question of what accounts for why a particular sentence generates the presuppositions that it has (can this be deduced from general pragmatic principles, or is this lexically encoded in some way).

28.See the discussion in §4 below about the triggering problem.

29. For example, Williamson (2000, 66) applies the terms ‘prime’ and ‘composite’ for conditions in general. Of course, it may well be that Williamson is using the term in a different sense than the one which applies to numbers, but his usage is also not unrelated to the mathematical sense.

30. Libert (2016) suggests that the problem of distinguishing category mistakes from other kinds of presupposition failures is a reason to reject the presuppositional account altogether.

31. See Barker and Jacobson (2007) for a range of recent discussions.

32. See Abrusán (2011a) for a proposed solution to the triggering problem which includes a discussion of the presuppositions associated with category mistakes. Interestingly, in a later version of the paper (Abrusán 2011b), Abrusán excludes category mistakes from her discussion (n. 1), presumably because of challenges to the earlier account.

33. According to Nolan, the few cases of fictions involving mathematical contradictions are not sufficient to raise the issue as one can set them aside as unusual or limit cases, while fiction involving impossible category mistakes is extremely commonplace.

34. Indeed, a puzzling feature of Fine (2003)’s discussion is that he endorses this argument, at the same time as claiming that ‘The lump of clay is Romanesque’ is a meaningless category mistake (Fine 2003, 207). Fine himself does not discuss the force of the negation.

35. Almotahri himself envisages a different rejoinder on behalf of the pluralist, one based on the proposal that (43) is a meaningless category mistake. His suggestion is to interpret ‘incompatible’ in a way that a meaningful and meaningless claim cannot be semantically incompatible, and hence the pluralist can insist that (43) doesn’t involve meta-linguistic negation after all. But it is not clear why we should interpret incompatibility in this way, or indeed how a defender of the meaninglessness view can take (43) to involve an ordinary descriptive negation.

36. See Magidor (2011, 189–190) for a discussion of this proposal.

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Ofra Magidor <>

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