Cognitive Disability and Moral Status
Why are cognitive disability and moral status thought to be sufficiently connected to warrant a separate entry? The reason is that individuals with cognitive disabilities have served as test cases in debates about the moral relevance of possessing such intellectual attributes as self-consciousness and practical rationality. If a significant portion of human beings lacks self-consciousness and practical rationality, then those attributes cannot by themselves distinguish the way we treat cognitively developed human beings from the way we treat non-human animals and human fetuses. If we cannot experiment on or kill human beings who lack those attributes, then the lack of those attributes alone cannot be what justifies animal experimentation or abortion.
For the most part, the philosophers who have considered these claims were not primarily concerned with the treatment or moral status of cognitively disabled human beings—they sought to challenge existing practices toward fetuses or animals, or the rationales for such practices. But those claims have significant practical implications for cognitively disabled human beings. If the justification for treating living beings in certain ways does rest to some extent on their possession or lack of intellectual attributes, then it may be acceptable to treat cognitively disabled human beings in ways that it would be unacceptable to treat cognitively nondisabled humans. This implication, a kind of philosophical blowback from the debates on animal rights and abortion, has become the subject of sustained controversy in applied ethics.
Philosophers who question the moral status of human beings with the most significant cognitive disabilities often compare them to animals claimed to have similar or greater cognitive abilities (McMahan 1996, 2002, 2009; Singer 1993, 2009; and Wilkinson 2008 in Other Internet Resources). Some critics find these comparisons unnecessary and offensive (e.g., Carlson 2009; Carlson and Kittay 2009). The philosophers who make such comparisons emphasize contrasts like the following: Vast numbers of chimpanzees and other “higher” primates are used in painful and often lethal research for the benefit of human beings. Although there are strong objections to specific primate research programs and research on specific primates, there is broad agreement that most primate research is acceptable if it has the potential to contribute significantly to human health, and if the harms and risks to the animal subjects are minimized. In contrast, cognitively disabled human beings cannot be enrolled in potentially harmful research unless they are likely to benefit, the risk of harm is negligible, and their legal representatives consent to their participation. They enjoy these protections even if they are no better able than non-human primates to understand the aims of the research or to consent to participation.
The debate over the moral status of individuals with the most severe cognitive disabilities also raises difficult methodological issues concerning the reliance on intuitions, convictions, and considered judgments in assessing moral arguments. Some philosophers would deny that any argument should persuade us to abandon our conviction that it would be terribly wrong to subject a human being cognitively incapable of consent to painful and dangerous experimentation of no possible benefit to him (e.g., Kittay 2008). Two philosophers have adapted G.E. Moore’s “proof” of the existence of the external world (see Entry on George Edward Moore) to claim that we are more confident of the truth of the proposition that all human beings are morally equal, and morally superior to other animals than of the validity of the arguments denying it (Curtis and Vehmas, 2016a, 2016b). Other philosophers reject the application of Moore’s argument to moral status (Lachlan, 2016; Roberts forthcoming); more broadly, they insist that even firm convictions about moral status cannot be immune from critical scrutiny, especially if they appear to conflict with other deeply held convictions (McMahan 2007). Still others deny such convictions any presumptive weight or authority (Singer 2005).
Finally, in addressing the moral status of cognitively disabled humans in a separate entry, rather than in a general entry on disability, we are not endorsing a controversial “exceptionalism” about cognitive disabilities—a view that regards them as fundamentally different from other kinds of impairment (see Related Entries below). Our reason for limiting ourselves to cognitive impairment is dialectical: there is currently no debate about the moral status of individuals with non-cognitive disabilities. We know of no serious philosopher who argues that people who cannot see, hear, or use their legs, or who experience frequent depression or hallucinations, have lower moral status than people without such disabilities. Admittedly, some philosophers claiming to regard humans with physical or psychiatric disabilities as having the same moral status as nondisabled humans also take positions that other philosophers see as inconsistent with a commitment to equal moral status. One notable example is Rawls’ (1971) exclusion of people with physical disabilities from the Original Position on the assumption that they are not fully cooperating members of society. Another example is the defense of “quality adjustment” in allocating scarce healthcare resources, which discounts the life-years of people with disabilities to reflect their supposedly lower quality of life (Williams 1987). But whether or not these positions are consistent with the recognition of full moral status, their proponents insist that they are; they do not attempt to argue against the equal moral status of people with physical or (most) psychiatric disabilities. By contrast, the moral status of human beings with cognitive disabilities has become a subject of intense debate among philosophers, applied ethicists, and disability scholars (for a recent discussion, see Carlson and Kittay 2009).
We will proceed as follows. We will first characterize the human beings who are the subject of the debate on moral status—those with what we will call “radical cognitive disabilities.” After discussing the ways in which humans are classified as cognitively disabled, we will describe the narrower category of humans whom the debate concerns. To be clear, this is a group of humans stipulated to exist rather than classified by empirical procedures. We will note the difficulty of separating claims about such stipulated individuals from claims that some actual individuals satisfy that stipulation. Next, we will characterize the concept of moral status, describing its structure and function. We will then outline the principal differences in how that concept is understood, particularly its “inclusion criteria”—the criteria for ascribing what we will call “full moral status,” the status attributed to cognitively nondisabled adult human beings. (In calling that moral status “full,” we do not intend to take sides in the debates over whether there can be any higher moral status.) We will identify one family of moral-status accounts—those basing possession on individual attributes—as the primary, though not the exclusive, source of the challenge addressed in this entry: the claim that some human beings lack full moral status. After outlining those accounts, we will review several ways of meeting the challenge: 1) basing full moral status on individual attributes shared by a greater proportion of human beings; 2) adopting secondary grounds for the possession of full moral status—by “courtesy” or by “proxy”; 3) rejecting individual attribute accounts in favor of accounts that base the full moral status of all human beings on their species membership or their humanity.
- 1. Whom is the Debate About?
- 2. What is Moral Status?
- 3. Individually-Based Accounts
- 4. Individually-Based Accounts and Radical Cognitive Disability: The Challenge of Exclusion
- 5. Group-Based Accounts of Moral Status
- 6. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. Whom is the Debate About?
There is, not surprisingly, disagreement about how to define cognitive or intellectual disability. (We will use these terms interchangeably, ignoring, unless specifically relevant, their apparent differences in breadth and emphasis.) There are competing psychometric and functional definitions, based respectively on standard deviations from the mean score on intelligence tests and on “significant limitations both in intellectual functioning and in adaptive behavior, which covers many everyday social and practical skills” (American Association of Intellectual and Developmental Disabilities, 2011). For this entry, we will consider individuals defined as cognitively disabled in functional terms, because our interest is in the moral relevance, if any, of the absence or substantial limitation of critical cognitive functions. These limitations are more likely to be captured by functional than psychometric tests, though as we discuss later, the former as well as the latter may fail to detect significant intellectual capacities. We will not assume that, or examine whether, individuals with psychometrically-defined “severe” or “profound” intellectual disabilities are functionally disabled in this way.
As noted, this entry will focus on human beings with “radical cognitive disabilities” — disabilities in intellectual function and capacity that limit or preclude the development of one or more attributes believed to confer full moral status. Among those attributes are the consciousness of oneself as a temporally-extended being; practical rationality—the capacity to govern one’s actions by reasoning about how to act; and the capacity to make and respond to moral demands. (We will often abbreviate the list to “self-consciousness or practical rationality” without making any assumptions about the centrality or relationship of the two attributes.) These attributes, as well as others held to be required for full moral status, may be possessed by different subsets of human beings, and the relationship among such attributes is a matter of considerable dispute. This dispute, however, is best deferred to a fuller treatment of the grounds of moral status; we will discuss them only to the extent that they bear on the moral status of human beings with significant cognitive disabilities.
The category of “radical cognitive disability” is stipulative. We do not start with the assumption that any specific human being falls into that category, or even that some human beings do. Eva Kittay (2005) has argued that there is no reason to assume that any human beings are radically cognitively disabled, in the sense we are using the term. Jeff McMahan (2009) has countered that the existence of such human beings is very likely: given the continuous nature of fetal and infant neurological development, it is very likely that some human beings are radically disabled because their development has ceased or been interrupted at points where they have not yet acquired morally relevant capacities. Even if McMahan’s “existence argument” for radical impairment is correct, however, it does not remove the daunting uncertainty of attributing radical cognitive impairment to any actual human being.
This uncertainty arises in part from a lack of clarity and consensus about what would count as adequate evidence of self- and other-awareness and practical rationality. To resolve that question, it is necessary to confront not only interpretive ambiguities in making inferences about the content of other minds, but conceptual issues about what it means to possess critical cognitive functions. Similar issues are raised in the debate about animal consciousness (see the Entry on animal consciousness), but there is also disagreement about whether the kinds of evidence adduced for and against the cognitive capacities of animals are equally relevant in assessing the cognitive capacities of human beings (Kittay 2005; McMahan 2002, 2005, 2008).
The primary reason for restricting the entry to radical cognitive disability, like the reason for restricting it to cognitive disability, is dialectical. Few contemporary philosophers would deny that human beings with mild or moderate cognitive disabilities have the attributes required for what we call “full moral status.” Philosophers who see self-consciousness and practical rationality as necessary for that status generally recognize that mildly and moderately disabled humans possess those attributes, and possess them to the extent necessary to reach the threshold set by their accounts of full moral status (see Sec. 2.1).
By stipulating a category of human beings with radical cognitive disabilities, we seek to avoid difficult empirical issues about the extent to which individuals classified as having serious cognitive disabilities actually lack the psychological functions held to confer moral status. Even the most direct assessments of these functions may fail to recognize atypical, especially nonverbal, forms of cognitive functioning. And with the possible exception of extreme cases like anencephaly, there are formidable difficulties in inferring a lack of cognitive capacity from a lack of specific behavior or brain activity. As recent work on intellectually conscious states has revealed (Wannez et al. 2017, Real et al. 2015), some psychological capacities are difficult to detect neurologically or behaviorally.
We recognize that there are objections to the use of stipulation to sidestep these difficult empirical issues. Disability scholars insist that philosophers must recognize that the terms they use will inevitably be taken to refer to actual human beings, so that they cannot stipulate away concerns about hurt and misinterpretation (Kittay 2005; Wong 2007). Moreover, the prevalence of individuals who actually satisfy their stipulations has relevance to morally significant policy issues, such as the costs and benefits of more inclusive educational practices. Nevertheless, we will rely on the stipulation that we have made about radical cognitive disability, in part because the assumption that some human beings are radically disabled is shared by many of those who argue for the full moral status of all human beings.
We will discuss only radical cognitive disabilities that are congenital or early-onset. The question of how moral status is affected by the loss of important cognitive functions is a distinct one, both for those who believe such functions confer moral status and those who do not. Concerning the former, the question is whether moral status can survive the loss of the functions on the basis of which it was conferred. For those who deny that moral status requires the possession of those functions, their loss may still raise important questions about personal identity, and about the first-person authority of the earlier, nondisabled self over the later, disabled self. The treatment of “once-competent” individuals in minimally conscious states, or with severe dementia, thus raises distinct issues about the impact of psychological discontinuity or loss of mental function on the relationship of human individuals to their past or future selves. There has been a protracted controversy, and a large literature, on these issues (Dresser 1995; Dworkin 1994; Stone 2007); they deserve separate discussion.
2. What is Moral Status?
2.1 The Concept of Moral Status
“Moral status” is not part of the shared vocabulary of all ethical theories. An act utilitarian, for example, has no more use for that concept than for “respect,” “rights,” or “inviolability.” For a theory that accorded weight to beings only in proportion to the utility they enjoyed or produced, the concept of moral status would be relevant only in the indirect sense that its use would affect aggregate utility in various ways. For example, the negative utility that might result from denying some human beings full moral status might support a policy of treating all human beings as if they had full moral status (see Sec. 4). On such a theory, the most salient moral property of an individual is her capacity to occupy states that can be characterized as “good” or “bad,” the most obvious being pleasure and pain. The possession of such a capacity gives an individual a morally considerable interest in occupying or avoiding such states. Moral considerability is: 1) continuous, in that the degree of moral considerability that a being possesses varies in proportion to the strength, character, and number of its interests; and 2) asymmetrical, in the sense that a being might have moral claims on others without others having moral claims on it.
When non-utilitarian philosophers discuss “moral status” of a type of being, they are generally using a more categorical notion than moral considerability. They generally understand moral status as a threshold concept and a range concept. Beings that fall below a minimum level—the threshold—of a status-conferring attribute like rationality lack a certain kind of moral status despite possessing the attribute to some degree. And all beings that fall within the “range”—that reach the threshold level of the attribute—have the same moral status regardless of how far they exceed that threshold. (The term “range concept” comes from Rawls; his example is of points within a circle, all of which are equally “inside” despite varying distances from the circumference.) More controversially, moral status is sometimes regarded as symmetrical: a being must be able to have moral claims made on it (and hence be capable of responsibility) as well as being able to make moral claims on others. A symmetry condition would exclude any human being lacking the capacity to have moral claims made on them—not only individuals with radical cognitive impairments, but infants and young children as well.
Not all writers on moral status treat it as both a threshold and range concept. Both features of the concept have been challenged, and the concept itself has been criticized as hierarchical and elitist (Birch 1993). Several philosophers have argued for treating moral status as a matter of degree, so that a being’s moral status varies proportionately with its morally-relevant attributes (Perring 1997; DeGrazia 2008). These proposals avoid uncomfortably sharp dichotomies, but they have a revisionary character. Even if commonsense morality recognizes some gradations in moral status, well-established social practices such as animal research assume discontinuities. Moreover, even if common sense could be reconciled to gradations below the threshold (which would thereby become less of a threshold), it would balk at recognizing gradations above it, thereby abandoning moral status as a range concept.
More comprehensively, Mary Ann Warren has proposed a multi-criterial account of moral status, in which it is neither a range nor a threshold concept. For Warren, the moral status of a being varies with the degree that it possesses the status-conferring attribute (Warren 1997). But Warren maintains that “full moral status” is both a threshold and a range concept; beings with moral agency enjoy the same, highest moral status regardless of the degree to which they possess the attributes needed for moral agency. As noted earlier, we will use the term “full moral status” to refer to the moral status that is generally accorded to cognitively nondisabled human adults, without assuming that there can be no higher status. “Full moral status” is thus roughly synonymous with “personhood” as that term is used in debates about whether fetuses, or higher primates, are persons.
The issue of moral status, and which beings have full moral status, has become important because of its bearing on the rights and treatment of those beings. “Moral status” and “full moral status” are not intended as honorifics; their ascription to a being entails that it enjoys rights that other beings, lacking that status, do not. The particular rights entailed by full moral status may, however, differ on different moral theories. Two theories with the same concept of moral status and the same criteria for assigning it (see Sec. 2.2) may associate full moral status with different rights or rights of different strength. One theory might, for example, hold that beings with full moral status may never be used as mere means, whereas another might hold that they may be so used in certain emergencies. There is, though, only partial independence between the formal character of and criteria for moral status, on the one hand, and the rights entailed by such status, on the other. For example, it would seem implausible for a theory to recognize a categorical notion of moral status while rejecting any notion of rights. An account of moral status need not deny all rights to beings falling below the threshold it sets; they will merely lack the same package of rights possessed by beings above that threshold.
Two philosophers (Sachs, 2011; Silvers, 2011) have questioned the utility of the concept of “moral status.” Sachs argues that claims about moral status are unnecessary and confusing, because the debate is really about the specific attributes needed to justify or ground specific rights. Silvers offers an even harsher critique. She charges that proponents of both psychologically and biologically based criteria (see Sec. 4, Sec. 5, below) neglect gradations in relevant characteristics and overlook the potential to display or develop those characteristics, resulting in unwarranted exclusion. As an alternative, Silvers proposes an account of justice that, avoiding prior assumptions about capacity, seeks to include as many beings as possible within a scheme of social cooperation.
Although moral status claims may well obscure more often than they enlighten, they do not, however, merely concern the grounding of specific rights in specific attributes. First, as noted above, theories that share the same criteria for full moral status may differ in the rights they associate with that status, and vice-versa. Moreover, even if Silvers is correct about the exclusionary tendencies of moral status notions, the prior question remains of whether their threshold and range features can be justified. How can the small differences in morally-relevant attributes that place a being above or below the threshold ground large differences in the package of rights and immunities that being possesses? How can all cognitively normal humans have the same package of rights and immunities despite differing greatly in the attributes that place them above the threshold? Those who defend the standard concept of moral status need a moral theory to underwrite its range and threshold features; those who attack it need to deny that any plausible theory could do so.
2.2 Criteria for Moral Status
The central question in the debate over the full moral status of human beings with radical cognitive disabilities concerns the type of attributes on which moral status is based. Most of those who deny or question the full moral status of all human beings insist that moral status must be based exclusively on attributes or properties of the individual; those attributes must be identifiable by a biological or psychological inventory of that individual, with no reference to the biological or social environment it inhabits. For example, it would be possible to assess an individual’s self-consciousness or practical rationality knowing nothing about its fellow creatures (although the assessment itself might have to be done by self-conscious and practically rational creatures). In contrast, we could not ascertain an individual’s species membership or social relationships without knowing a great deal about the world it inhabited. We will call accounts based solely on individual attributes “individually-based”; we will label “group-based” those accounts based on facts about the individual’s membership in a biological or social group, or her relationship with other members of that group. Those facts may concern the individual’s biological origins, the typical or average characteristics of a biological or social group to which she belongs, or her actual relationships with other individuals. Although some individually-based accounts concern an individual’s capacity or potential to form relationships of certain kinds with other individuals, it is that capacity or potential which confers moral status, not the existence of such relationships.
Those who insist that moral status must be based on an individual’s own attributes, that it cannot depend on the accidents of birth or the vagaries of biological classification, are also likely to insist that an individual’s claims on others cannot depend on whether those others happen to be members of the same species or communities. In this view, full moral status must not only be independent of external circumstances, but must be universally recognized. Although some group-based accounts may require that a being’s full moral status be universally recognized, others see full moral status as group-relative (see Sec. 5.1).
In comparing accounts of moral status, it is important to note two possible differences between such accounts. First, they may propose different conditions as sufficient for full moral status. Some accounts, for example, claim that membership in the human species is sufficient for that status. Second, they may offer different explanations of how the satisfaction of those conditions grounds or warrants full moral status. For example, even if being a Homo sapiens suffices for possessing full moral status, there may be different rationales for why it is sufficient: 1) because it is in the nature of Homo sapiens to be rational; 2) because the rational nature of the species requires respect for all of its members, rational or not; or 3) because members of the same species have a duty of partiality to each other, regardless of their individual attributes. Thus, the two accounts ground moral status in the same relational property—membership in the human species—and they make membership a sufficient condition for full moral status. But they use the fact of species membership differently in justifying moral status. They might also associate different rights with full moral status, in accordance with their different ways of grounding it. And, as discussed in Sec. 4, they may have different implications about who is required to recognize or respect an individual’s status.
3. Individually-Based Accounts
Individually-based accounts generally take cognitively normal adult human beings as their paradigm and pick out one or more of their attributes as sufficient for the moral status they enjoy. These accounts identify overlapping clusters of psychological and cognitive attributes—self-consciousness, awareness of and concern for oneself as a temporally-extended subject; practical rationality, rational agency, or autonomy; moral responsibility; a capacity to recognize other selves and to be motivated to justify one’s actions to them; the capacity to be held, and hold others, morally accountable. These attributes pick out different subsets of human beings. Some self-conscious humans, for example, may lack the capacity to be held morally accountable. But individually-based accounts may differ less in the range of beings to whom they accord full moral status than in the ways they regard those attributes as grounding that status.
One approach holds that psychological attributes confer moral status by virtue of the interests to which they give rise. This approach treats psychological attributes as the basis of interests that we have a prima facie obligation to advance, or at least not to thwart—an obligation whose strength varies with the strength and other features of those interests. The capacity to feel pain grounds an obligation to avoid its infliction; the capacity to anticipate and dread as well as feel pain may ground a stronger obligation. But if additional psychological capacities merely increased the strength of the interest, and the corresponding obligation to advance or not thwart it, an interest account would not provide a basis for a moral status threshold (McMahan 2002).
An account that accorded interests moral weight in proportion to their strength would not require a notion of moral status, even if beings of a particular type tended to have stronger interests. Thus, philosophers who account for our differing obligations to beings of different species in terms of their unequal interests tend to regard “moral status” as an unnecessary or inert notion (Harman, 2003, 187), or to conclude that all beings with interests (for which sentience is often thought necessary) have equal moral status (Rossi, 2010). This denial of different levels of moral status, however, licenses the unequal treatment of human beings with the most severe cognitive impairments if they are assumed to have weaker interests, especially in survival. Thus, it offers cold comfort to defenders of the moral equality of all human beings.
More categorical interest-based approaches ground moral status in the capacity to experience oneself as a temporally-extended being whose life can go better or worse (Singer 1993; Tooley 1983) or to value one’s own existence (Harris 1985; Newson 2007). Individuals having such capacities can care about and value their future lives in ways that individuals lacking those capacities cannot, giving them a qualitatively weightier interest in those lives (McMahan 2002). Whether or not such capacities can account for the threshold and range features of full moral status, their adoption as criteria appears to deny that status to human beings with the most significant cognitive impairments.
A second approach, derived from or inspired by Kant, sees moral status in terms of the respect demanded by the possession of one or more attributes, such as autonomy or moral responsibility (e.g., Korsgaard 1996). This approach regards the possession of an autonomous will as conferring dignity and demanding respect, so that a being with such a will must not be treated as a mere means, but as an end. This Kantian conception of full moral status is often regarded as a paradigm, in identifying an attribute that does not vary continuously, and whose possession appears to have clear moral implications. The threshold for moral status set by many Kantian accounts is a high one. If those accounts regard the capacity for autonomy as the threshold for full moral status, and if they understand that capacity as grounding moral status in moral responsibility, then since “there is nothing for which we would hold human infants or severely cognitively disabled adults morally responsible, it is argued, such humans must lack Kantian moral status” (Kain 2009, 66). Even if humans need not be held morally responsible to enjoy full moral status, many would still lack the capacity for autonomy that seems essential on any Kantian account.
A third approach, associated with contractualism, sees moral status in terms of the attributes needed for membership in a moral community, or for participation in relationships of mutual recognition and concern. It is the capacity for forming such relationships, not their actual formation, which grounds full moral status. A cognitively normal human being would have such status even if he were abandoned on a desert island. This approach, the most clearly symmetrical, treats certain attributes as necessary for moral status not because their mere possession generates moral obligations, but because they are requisites for the kind of relationships in terms of which the proponents of this approach understand moral obligations. This requirement may appear to give cognitive and psychological attributes a more instrumental role than they are assigned by the second approach. It’s not that their mere possession demands respect, but that they enable their possessors to form relationships of which mutual respect is an integral part.
Though relationship-based accounts differ conceptually from respect-based accounts, they differ little in practical terms. They will identify different human beings as having full moral status only if humans can have the cognitive or other psychological capacities necessary for respect while lacking the empathy or motivation necessary for membership in a moral community (or vice-versa). For example, a moral-relationship account might exclude psychopaths. But so might a respect-based account, if it denied psychopaths autonomy because they lacked the capacity to be motivated by a sense of duty, or more broadly, a capacity to recognize and act on moral reasons (see Shoemaker 2007). A respect-based account might also exclude psychopaths if it attributed their moral deficits to severe disabilities in practical rationality. Relationship-based accounts would, like Kantian ones, appear to set a very high threshold for full moral status. The greater the moral accountability demanded by the relationship, the more difficult it may be to claim that human beings with radical cognitive impairments are capable of participation.
One challenge for all of these accounts is to identify an attribute or attributes that can explain, or at least be reconciled with, the threshold and range features of the prevailing concept of moral status. The difficulty presented by a threshold is that it imposes moral discontinuity over psychologically continuous attributes. In contrast to the possession of a soul, for example, practical rationality, moral responsibility, and most other individual attributes claimed by contemporary accounts to ground moral status, appear to come in degrees. Looking at the development of an infant, the acquisition of these attributes appears to be gradual, even if its pace is uneven. And yet our judgment of moral status appears categorical—an individual either has full moral status or lacks it. The categorical character of moral status is also clear above the threshold. We do not think that the more highly intelligent, more deeply self-conscious, or more fully autonomous among us have a higher moral status than the rest, even those near the edge. The challenge of justifying this range feature of full moral status is closely related to the challenge of justifying the threshold—why should differences above the threshold be morally insignificant when the threshold itself is so significant?
4. Individually-Based Accounts and Radical Cognitive Disability: The Challenge of Exclusion
If full moral status is determined by the possession of any of the cognitive attributes discussed in the last section, then that status will be enjoyed by some non-human animals and—more problematically—almost certainly lacked by some humans. Most proponents of individually-based attribute accounts welcome the implication that we cannot justify existing disparities between our treatment of “higher” animals and cognitively disabled human beings, and many argue that those disparities are better reduced by raising our standards for non-human animals than by lowering them for cognitively disabled humans.
The optimal point of convergence … requires that traditional beliefs about animals be more extensively revised than traditional views about the severely retarded. (McMahan 2002, 230)
But full convergence, as McMahan recognizes, would have disturbing implications even if it were achieved entirely by upgrading the treatment of nonhuman animals:
[T]he preservation of the traditional view [that it is seriously wrong to kill an anencephalic infant] will commit us to the conclusion that it is seriously wrong to kill an animal that altogether lacks the capacity for consciousness. And this is unacceptable. (2002, 230)
Convergence at a significantly lower level would have equally unacceptable implications. For example, it would permit the use of radically impaired human beings in any research, however harmful, for which the use of animals with comparable cognitive capacities was permitted. Any view about moral status that aspires to reflective equilibrium with our deeply held moral convictions must confront the abhorrence with which most thoughtful people would regard the practical implications of treating humans with radical cognitive disabilities as having even slightly lower moral status than the rest of us.
A variety of approaches seek to address that abhorrence: by identifying criteria for full moral status that include a wider range of humanity (Sec. 4.1); by expanding the ways in which an individual can possess or achieve full moral status without denying the primacy of individual attributes (Sec. 4.2); and by rejecting individual attribute accounts of moral status (Sec. 5).
4.1 Identifying More Inclusive Attributes
Several accounts identify attributes, such as the capacity to value or care, that are shared by a greater proportion of human beings than self-consciousness, practical rationality, autonomy, or moral accountability. These accounts seek to recognize the full and equal moral status of all, or almost all, human beings, including children, and of adults with significant cognitive and psychological disabilities. Among the more inclusive criteria proposed are the capacities to communicate, or for minimal communication with other humans (respectively, Berube 1996; Francis and Norman 1978); to value or care (Jaworska 1999, 2007); and to give and receive love (Kittay 1999); to form relationships characterized by reciprocity of care (Mullin 2011). Jaworska and Tannenbaum (2016 a, 2016b offer perhaps the most detailed account that grounds moral status in the capacity to form morally significant relationships. They maintain that “a being merits higher moral status” if it has the capacity to achieve, through a rearing relationship, “incomplete realizations of activities characteristic of” humans with typical psychological attributes (whom they call “self-standing persons” (SSP)) (2016b, 1098). An actual rearing relationship is not necessary, but only beings who can model Characteristic SSP activities have the requisite capacity. This excludes humans “capable of rudimentary conscious activity who nonetheless are not yet capable of modeling SSP activities in any form” (2016b, 1101)—not only early fetuses but children and adults with the most significant cognitive impairments, who will never have that capacity.
These accounts are attractive in identifying attributes that may offer a more intuitively appealing basis for moral status than practical rationality or self-awareness, and in reducing, to varying extents, the proportion of humanity excluded from full moral status. But because they exclude some humans, and may include some non-human animals, they do not fully capture commonsense views about moral status and will be unacceptable to some philosophers. Moreover, these alternative attributes do not resolve, but merely relocate, the problem of accounting for the threshold and range features of full moral status.
One attribute—the potential for any other individual attribute held to suffice for full moral status—comes much closer to full inclusion (Kumar 2008). But it faces three formidable problems. As Joel Feinberg (1986) famously argued, the fact that someone has the mere potential for an attribute does not warrant treating him as if he actually possessed it. If potential has moral significance, it cannot be directly inferred from the moral significance of that which it actualizes. Further, some human beings never have the potential for any individual attribute held to suffice for full moral status, in any sense of “potential” that would distinguish them from many non-human animals (McMahan 2008, 91–92). As debates about the moral status of the fetus suggest, it is not at all clear when a being has the “potential” for an attribute. The claim that someone has potential is a counterfactual: in some other circumstances, perhaps a later life-stage of the individual, the person would have the attribute. This brings in difficult questions about the scope of such counterfactuals. On a broad enough construal, every living being has the potential to develop the relevant attributes in a sufficiently different possible world, and so has full moral status.
Matthew Liao has argued for “the genetic basis for moral agency” as a sufficient condition for full moral status that is more plausible and inclusive than a potentiality criterion (Liao 2010). It accords full moral status to humans who have lost the potential for agency, and to radically disabled humans who never had such potential, in any conventional sense of that term. But it includes these individuals at the cost of including almost all human embryos—a cost many would consider excessive. Moreover, Liao’s account requires a conceptually difficult, morally uncertain distinction between genomes that have and lack “the basis for moral agency” (e.g., Wasserman 2002; McMahan 2002, 2008). Potentiality accounts face similar line-drawing problems; the question is whether the shift from “potential” to “genetic basis” makes those problems any more tractable. The genetic basis account also shares what many would regard as a problem of “over inclusiveness”—they confer moral status on early embryos, which have the genetic basis for moral agency, at least as clearly as they have the potential for it. To justify abortion, proponents of either account must rely on a woman’s right to withdraw gestational aid.
These challenges are inherited by two accounts that seek to base moral status on the possession of a “modal property.” Shelley Kagan (2016) and Jonathan Surovell (forthcoming) argue that beings who had, or could have had, the psychological capacities of typical human beings are their moral equals. According to both accounts, human beings who lost, or never had, those capacities due to illness or impairment still have the modal property that they could have had them, and this property confers full moral status. That property is not possessed by members of most other species, who could only have acquired those capacities in quite distant possible worlds. As Surovell puts it, “[d]isability but not species membership is a matter of luck” (21).
These accounts face much the same challenge as Liao’s, of determining whether a given being “could have” developed the psychological capacities of human beings when their failure to do so results from genetic differences. They also face the challenge posed by members of other species capable of identity-preserving cognitive upgrades (DeGrazia, 2016; McMahan, 2016). But perhaps the strongest objection to grounding moral status in modal properties is raised by DeGrazia: even if human beings with profound cognitive impairments are aptly characterized as victims of bad luck, why does their victimhood confer moral status? Surely that status cannot be justified as a consolation prize for a near miss. While this objection does not directly apply to the genetic-basis account, that account faces the question of why the biological basis for morally significant attributes itself has moral significance.
4.2 Proxy, Derivative, and Presumptive Moral Status
A second general way of accommodating the powerful intuitions about the full moral status of all human beings is to recognize alternatives to the actual possession of the status-conferring attributes. One version of this approach treats human beings with radical cognitive disabilities as, in effect, capable of acquiring the necessary attributes by proxy, through their relationships with other human beings. Thomas Scanlon (1998), for example, affirms the full moral status of all human beings while basing full moral status (“the requirement of justifiability”) on the individual capacity for “judgment-sensitive” attitudes. Although he recognizes that radically-impaired humans lack those attributes, he suggests that they can acquire them vicariously, through trustees:
The tie of birth gives us good reason to want to treat [human beings lacking the capacity for judgment-sensitive attitudes] “as humans” despite their limited capacities. Because of these limitations, the idea of justifiability to them must be understood counterfactually, in terms of what they could reasonably reject if they were able to understand such a question. This makes the idea of trusteeship appropriate in their case, whether it is appropriate in the case of nonhuman animals or not. It also indicates a basis on which such a trustee could object to proposed principles. Severely disabled humans have reason to want those things that any human being has reason to want, insofar as those are things that they are capable of benefiting from. (185–186)
Scanlon himself may understand trusteeship merely as a way of realizing or respecting the full moral status of human beings with radical impairments, a status that is based on “the ties of birth.” Other philosophers, however, suggest that trusteeship can secure full moral status by helping to satisfy criteria that could not otherwise be met. Thus, Francis and Silvers (Francis 2009; Silvers and Francis 2009) argue that cognitively normal human beings can function as “mental prostheses” for radically impaired ones:
[A]s a prosthetic arm or leg executes some of the functions of a missing fleshly limb without being confused with or supplanting the usual fleshly limb, so, we propose, a trustee’s reasoning and communicating can execute part or all of a subject’s own thinking processes without substituting the trustee’s ideas as if it were the subject’s own. (485)
For example, trustees can help the subject fashion her own conception of the good by carefully eliciting and extrapolating her attitudes and preferences.
Francis and Silvers do not claim that the moral status of human beings with the most significant cognitive impairments could rest on such trusteeship, or on the potential for it. But it is useful to consider two challenges facing their proposal, which they acknowledge. The first is the question of authorship or authenticity: It is not clear how a trustee’s reasoning could be said to “execute” all, as opposed to part, of “a subject’s own thinking.” It is not clear how the thinking can be the subject’s if it was wholly executed by a trustee (Wasserman and McMahan, 2012). The second challenge, shared by the notion of mental prostheses and Scanlon’s notion of the vicarious expression of judgment-sensitive attitudes, is the possibility of providing such support for nonhuman animals—a possibility Scanlon leaves open in the above passage. If it could be extended to animals, the potential for such representation would ground the full moral status of vast numbers of primates and other mammals. To close the floodgates, it would seem necessary to argue that this support was less feasible for intelligent animals, even domesticated ones, than it was for radically impaired human beings. Clearly, an argument would be needed that, in Francis and Silvers’ terms, it would be far more difficult to fashion a mental prosthesis for the former.
A proxy approach also raises the difficult question of how the trustee can acquire the moral and epistemic authority to speak for an individual with radical cognitive disabilities. Legal systems assign trustees or guardians to represent the “best interests” of individuals too immature or impaired to make, or to have made, their own judgments. But it is not clear how someone gets “appointed” as a trustee for purposes of securing moral status. Moreover, even those closest and most committed to an individual with radical cognitive impairments may find it hard to discern his interests, and distinguish them from their own “judgment-sensitive” attitudes.
Another way of accommodating strong convictions about the full moral status of all human beings grounds that status in actual relationships between cognitively normal and radically-disabled human beings. Because of their duties of partiality, the close relatives of radically impaired individuals must treat them as if they had full moral status. This could be regarded as an agent-relative status: for close relatives and no one else, radically disabled humans actually have full moral status. But because of the full moral status of those close relatives, other human beings must respect their duty to regard their disabled kin as full moral equals. They do not, however, have to assume that duty themselves. Some proponents of individual-attribute accounts—McMahan, for example—appear to take this view. In contrast, some of the group-based accounts in the next section hold that the “tie of birth” requires all cognitively nondisabled human beings to accord full moral status to radically-impaired human beings, regardless of their relationship. A weaker version of this derivative or courtesy position does not claim that a human being with radical cognitive disabilities actually has full moral status even for close family members, merely that they must treat her as if she did. This reduces somewhat (but does not eliminate) the disparity between family members and third parties, but only by downgrading the moral status of radically-impaired humans even for their most significant others.
For some philosophers, either version of this view is unsatisfactory, for two related reasons. First, it is too narrow, since it does not offer radically impaired human beings complete moral equality. Only a small subset of other humans need to treat them as moral equals; the rest merely need to respect this special relationship. Second, it is too contingent—a human with radical cognitive impairments owes even his partial equality to the existence of close relationships. If his parents and other relatives abandon him or die, he has only a very tenuous claim to being treated by the rest of humanity any better than a non-human animal with similar attributes.
We would suggest yet another “evidentiary” approach to accommodating the conviction that every human being has full moral status, one that calls for the adoption of a strong, even “irrebuttable” presumption of full moral status for all human beings. This approach is based on the difficulty of assessing the cognitive potential of human beings, the powerful tendency to underestimate the capacity and potential of human beings with any degree of cognitive abnormality, and the terrible cost to individuals who warrant but are denied full moral status. This approach can be regarded as rule-consequentialist, in requiring that we sometimes disregard our case-specific judgment because of the high probability and substantial costs of error. But it may appeal to many who reject rule-consequentialism as a general approach. At the same time, this rationale for full moral status may seem uncomfortably grudging and contingent. It appears to imply that, with sufficiently accurate assessment tools and sufficiently reliable assessors, we could deny moral status to many human beings whom we now are constrained to treat as having it. Moreover, their exclusion would represent moral progress.
Such a presumption of full moral status for humans with radical cognitive disabilities could be given a more robust justification. That justification would treat biological differences, species norms, or “ties of birth” not as providing independent grounds for full moral status, but as providing very strong reasons for presuming it. Perhaps part of the reason we presume this is epistemic, because it is so difficult to conclude that individuals who look human really lack human capacities. But that is not the whole explanation. When cognitively nondisabled humans encounter another being with human appearance, they customarily respond to that being in ways they do not to non-human animals; they use distinctive gestures, facial expression, touch, speech, and other behavior. Such responses assume a capacity for reciprocal exchange that may not always be present. But even when it is not, those responses are not idle gestures. They may enable communication, and provoke cognitive and social development, that would otherwise not occur. Family members, friends, professionals, and scholars who work with people who have cognitive disabilities report that the more time they spend with individuals who initially seemed unable to communicate or respond meaningfully, the more they could discern about their interests, desires, and moods (Brown and Gothelf 1996; Goode 1994). Indeed, those people often display species-typical preferences in clothing, food, socializing, and other activities. In sustained interaction with nondisabled humans who treat them as members of the same moral community, cognitively disabled individuals develop socially and psychologically along the lines of other human beings. Treating people with cognitive disabilities as if they had potential for typically human feelings, desires and responses, then, can thus become self-fulfilling. This approach offers a pragmatic (and consequentialist) justification for presuming that all human beings have full moral status: not merely because of the terrible costs of mistakenly denying that status, but because treating fellow human beings as capable of joining our moral community makes it more likely that they will be able to do so.
This proposal does not claim that such treatment could never be effective if directed toward a dolphin or chimpanzee. But we have stronger reasons to treat our fellow human beings this way, however significant their cognitive disabilities. Our shared embodiment and genetic endowment facilitate our treating them as having the capacity or potential for typical human interaction and activity, and make it likely that they will be more responsive to our treatment than a non-human animal with similar cognitive abilities. Other intelligent beings, differently embodied than we are, would have the same reasons to treat their fellow beings this way. In recognizing such a limited partiality, we do not treat species as having a moral significance akin to that of families or even nations. Nor, clearly, do we assume that human beings in particular have special moral status.
Despite its resolute optimism, this proposal still excludes some human beings from full moral status. It assumes a minimum level of social responsiveness which is almost certainly lacking in human beings with anencephaly, and perhaps lacking in human beings with other radical cognitive impairments. Yet in its pragmatic justification of a limited partiality towards members of the same species, it sets the stage for views that give a more central role to species membership.
5. Group-Based Accounts of Moral Status
A number of philosophers have argued for the full moral status of all human beings, without seeking to identify any attribute possessed by all humans that would ground that status. These philosophers can be roughly divided into two groups. Those in the first group regard membership in the species Homo sapiens as sufficient for full moral status and ground that status in a species-based attribute (See Sec. 5.1). For some philosophers within this first group, all homo sapiens belong to a kind whose nature or norm it is to possess rationality or similar attributes (Sec. 5.1.1). For others, all homo sapiens are connected through “ties of birth” to other human beings (Sec. 5.1.2). For the former, any being of a kind whose nature it is to be rational, etc. has full moral status; for the latter, any human related by birth to other human beings has full moral status. Although the two approaches pick out the same individual human beings, the way in which they ground moral status gives them different implications for the status of human beings with radical cognitive impairments.
The former way of grounding moral status gives it a wider “writ,” because the individual’s moral status is not based on his relationship to specific others. Rather, it is based on the norm of a group to which she belongs. That norm demands recognition by anyone, whether a member of the group or not, capable of recognizing it. If human beings with radical cognitive impairments have full moral status by virtue of belonging to a group with the norm of rationality, a rational Martian, no less than a rational human, should recognize the full moral status of humans with those impairments. It might be possible to argue that the morally-relevant norms of a group are not binding on those outside the group, but we have not seen such an argument.
In contrast, ties of birth may not bind those lacking the same biological connection; members of other species need not recognize the full moral status of human beings with radical cognitive impairments. In that sense, the moral status of those human beings is not as “full” as that of other human beings, since it must be recognized only by other humans. If full moral status is based on duties of partiality toward members of the same group, it will be group-relative, not binding on members of other groups.
The second type of group-based account (Sec. 5.2) acknowledges the moral significance of the group-based attributes relied on by the first type of group-based accounts. But it denies that the full and equal moral status of human beings can be grounded in any specific attribute, even indirectly, that can be described in morally neutral terms. These accounts regard “human being” as a thick normative concept, grounded in language and social practice, that is not necessarily coextensive with the biological category of “Homo sapiens,” and that has moral content that cannot be derived from any descriptive attribute associated with it. The judgment that a being is human and therefore must be treated respectfully does not consist of a value-neutral biological classification and an argument that establishes the moral status of beings so classified. The requirement for certain kinds of treatment, and the prohibition of others, is part of the meaning of “human being” and implicit in the recognition that a given individual is a human being. Proponents of these accounts thus reject the very attempt to identify a criterial attribute possessed by all beings with the moral status of cognitively normal human adults (Diamond 1978; Edwards 1997; Byrne 2000). These philosophers reject the treatment of cognitively nondisabled adults as a paradigm for full moral status, and of infants, young children, and radically cognitively disabled adults as “marginal cases” whose moral status needs to be justified by extension.
For both types of group-based accounts, the categorical nature of full moral status is explained by the way in which that status is grounded. Membership in the human species, a sufficient condition of that status for accounts of both types, is a categorical rather than a continuous “variable” (although there may be some vagueness or ambiguity due to imprecise or conflicting membership criteria). And for both types of account, the grounding of full moral status is the same for all human beings, regardless of their individual attributes.
5.1 Species-Based Accounts
5.1.1 Species Norms
On the first relational approach, some of the properties identified by intrinsic-attribute accounts as sufficient for full moral status can also play a distinct role in attaining it. Although, on this view, self-consciousness and practical rationality are not necessary for full moral status, they are the norm for human beings. This norm cannot be understood statistically; it would not change if most or all humans ceased to be self-conscious or practically rational. Rather, the norm captures what is characteristic of the species. A normal attribute is not, however, an essence that each member must possess. Rather, it is a relational property: each individual has moral status as the member of a group for which that attribute is the norm. Scanlon, for example, claims that the class of those to whom we must justify our actions “includes at least those beings who are of a kind that is normally capable of judgment-sensitive attitudes” (1998, 186).
Species-norm accounts focus on the human species, but they are not limited to humans. Presumably, if we discovered that dolphins or Martians were a species with a similar cognitive norm, members of that species would possess full moral status whether or not they satisfied that norm. We would be bound to recognize (if they could) the full moral status of all dolphins or Martians, and they would be bound to recognize the full moral status of all humans.
There may appear to be a tension in grounding full and equal moral status in norms to which some but not all members conform. Even if the norm of practical rationality gives all group members equal moral status, it might seem that those members actually possessing that attribute would be “more equal” than those lacking it. The response to this concern, which we discuss in Sec. 5.2, is that those possessing the attribute have better fortune but no greater moral status.
Not surprisingly, proponents of intrinsic attribute accounts, such as McMahan, are unsympathetic with the claim that “facts about the nature of some individuals could determine how other individuals that lack that nature ought to be treated” (McMahan 2008, 85). Like other critics, McMahan sees this claim as requiring a kind of “moral alchemy” that transmutes factual claims about some individuals into moral demands concerning others. But for those who regard humanity as a “thick” concept (5.2), no alchemy is required. The concept of a human being is a normative one, conferring rights on all those who fall under it and imposing moral demands on those who understand and apply it.
5.1.2 (Co-)Humanity as a Special Relationship
A second kind of species-relationship claimed to confer moral status is not between the individual human and the species norm, but between the individual human and other human beings, in particular, those who are cognitively normal. The claim is that human beings have a reason, based on co-membership in the species, to regard each other as moral equals. As Scanlon (1998) asserts,
[T]he mere fact that a being is ‘of human born’ provides a strong reason for according it the same status as other humans. This has sometimes been characterized as prejudice, called speciesism. But it is not prejudice to hold that our own relation to these beings gives us reason to accept the requirement that our actions be justifiable to them. (185)
This position grounds full moral status in the kinship of all human beings—what used to be called “the family of man.” Although this kinship currently depends on birth to a human mother, it is shared by all human beings and does not vary with degree of consanguinity.
This approach avoids the questionable notion of a species norm as a source of moral status. But unlike a species-norm account, it requires no one but human beings to recognize the full moral status of all humans. On the species norm account, McMahan (2002) observes,
[I]ntelligent and morally sensitive Martians would be required to treat severely retarded human beings in the same way they would be required to treat us. … But if the reason we have to accord the severely retarded the same moral status as other human beings is that we are related to them through the ‘tie of birth,’ then Martians would not have this reason. (217)
This is a practically insignificant limitation at present, but an expressively significant one for those who insist that moral status be universally recognized.
A defender of a human kinship approach might readily accept this limitation, especially since we and the Martians would still be constrained by the attachments of the cognitively normal members of the other species to their radically impaired relations (as discussed in Sec. 4.2 above). But she would still have to defend the claim that co-membership in the species established the sort of kinship that required even this species-relative full moral status. McMahan (2002) argues that even if membership in some groups, like nations, could confer full and equal status on its members, membership in the same species could not:
Unlike membership in a nation, membership in a species is not a focus of collective identity. Being human does not significantly differentiate us from anything else; it therefore fails to engage our pride or enhance our sense of identity. Just as no one’s sense of identity is enlarged by the recognition that one is an animal rather than a plant, so no one’s sense of identity is importantly shaped by an awareness of being human rather than being, for example, a rabbit. (221)
The defender of a “ties of birth” account could respond in two ways. First, she might deny that species identity and pride were necessary to ground the full moral status of species members. Rather, that status was grounded in similarities among human beings, even radically disabled ones, that arose from their distinctive embodiment and that created a strong sense of fellowship (among those self-conscious enough to feel fellowship) overshadowing even vast differences in mental capacity. These similarities include ways of feeling, communicating, moving, and reacting to and interacting with other members of the species. These affinities are refracted by culture, members of other species share some of them, and not all members of the species—even cognitively normal ones—share all of them. Nevertheless, they may be a distinctive enough ensemble to provide a basis for partiality. Or a defender might argue, as Bernard Williams (2006) does (see Sec. 5.2), that species-identity and pride could play a role in human fellowship now obscured by the lack of a suitable comparison class. Although, as Robert Nozick (1974) observed, no contemporary human boasts about having an opposable thumb or speaking a language, our sense of species pride and identity might crystallize in the presence of another advanced species, which would highlight our distinctive shared history and achievements.
Standing alone, however, both responses seem vulnerable to the claim that similarities associated with species membership may explain, but cannot justify, the treatment of all other human beings as moral equals. Why should a sense of fellowship, however strong, be a source of moral status? If our sense of fellowship reflected what mattered morally, why wouldn’t we feel greater fellowship with McMahan’s intelligent, morally sensitive Martian than with a human infant whose developmental disabilities make him apparently unresponsive to other humans?
One response is that what justifies intra-species partiality is not the capacity to share but the capacity to benefit. Thus, Gunnarson (2008) suggests that members of our own species have a capacity to derive unique, intrinsic benefits from their relationship to other human beings. Reliance on such a capacity may provide an intuitively more appealing basis for full moral status than biologically-based similarities. But it might still deny full moral status to some humans—not only anencephalic infants but others lacking the capacity to benefit from relations with other humans. Moreover, some non-human animals, especially domesticated ones, may derive immense benefits that are intrinsic and unique to their relationship to humans (Townley 2010). And the members of other cognitively advanced species might well benefit in highly specific, possibly unique ways, from interaction with human beings.
5.2 Humanity as the Ground of Full Moral Status
To explain the moral significance of species co-membership, some philosophers embrace a strongly anthropocentric view, which denies that we can step outside of our humanity to assess the moral status of the world’s inhabitants. On this view, the concept of a human being is prior to, and inseparable from, that of a person. As Stephen Mulhall (2002) argues:
[O]ur concept of a person is an outgrowth or aspect of our concept of a human being; and that concept is not merely biological but rather a crystallisation of everything we have made of our distinctive species nature. To see another as a human being is to see her as a fellow-creature—another being whose embodiment embeds her in a distinctive form of common life with language and culture, and whose existence constitutes a particular kind of claim on us. (7)
This view, which, following Williams (2006), we will call “humanist,” has two variants. The first, per Mulhall, is linguistic or conceptual, influenced by Wittgenstein (1958). We come to understand notions like thinking, deciding, and feeling in terms of the behavior of other human beings, and, although we can attribute some of these capacities or states to other beings, it is only by extension or analogy (Hanfling 2001). We also learn the appropriate ways of acting toward fellow human beings in learning the very concept: for example, human beings are to be named, and not eaten even when they are dead. We do not conclude that human beings must be treated this way; the recognition that they must is already part of the meaning of the concept (Diamond 1978; Gleeson 2008). This “thick” concept of human being is not a biological one, and need not have the same extension as the class of Homo sapiens. For some humanists of this type, a newly-created embryo is not a human being, and it is not part of the meaning of human being that the life of a newly-fertilized embryo must be protected to the same extent as the life of a newborn human infant (Crary 2007). But the very fact that other humanists do regard early embryos as human beings suggests the need for an account of how such a deeply-embedded concept can be so vague or debatable at the margins.
Because of the role of our language and concepts in our moral understanding, the justification and criticism of our moral practices can only be internal to them, on humanist accounts. As Byrne maintains,
reason operates in ethics properly when it functions immanently. Offering a sound moral argument in criticism of any one of our moral practices would be a matter of drawing upon insight from some other part of our moral life. (2000, 70–71)
The case against eating animals, for example, cannot be made by citing attributes they share with us, but only by exposing tensions or contradictions with our other practices (Diamond 1978). Presumably, similar but more acute tensions would confront any view of humanity that excluded some biological human beings or denied some of them full moral status, making racism and sexism untenable without placing any pressure on the concept of humanity itself.
The second variant denies the possibility of an impartial basis for assessing moral status. To attempt to grade or evaluate the world’s inhabitants in absolute terms is to treat the universe as having a point of view—the perspective of a deity or a utilitarian Ideal Observer (Williams 2006). Without such a vantage point, human beings can judge the rest of the world only in terms of their own concerns, values and civilization. Indeed, it is only in those terms that we value those characteristics, like rationality and self-consciousness, regarded by individual-attribute theorists as criteria for full moral status (Grau, 2016). Our humanity thus gives us an indispensable frame of reference for evaluating the rest of the world. It also grounds a defensible partiality toward each other that has little in common with racism or sexism. Not only do almost all of us accept naked appeals to the humanity of another being, as opposed to her sex or race, as the basis for action or restraint, we appeal to humanity in rejecting racism and sexism. Naked appeals to race or sex, unsupported by claims about morally relevant attributes, are rarely made by the most unapologetic racist or sexist. The “human prejudice” is more akin to the affinity and loyalty of participants in a shared culture. If it is difficult to see “the human prejudice” this way, it may be because “[h]uman beings do not have to deal with any other creature that, in terms of argument, principle, worldview, or whatever, can answer back” (Williams 2006, 148). A distinctively human “culture” is both pervasive and barely visible in a world that offers no rivals. Williams does not claim that our commitment to that culture would necessarily trump an appeal to participate in a more advanced universal community and relinquish cherished but parochial aspects of our own culture. Nevertheless, that commitment would give us a morally defensible reason, not just a prejudice, against such assimilation.
Humanist accounts recognize that species norms have moral significance, but they do not assign them the criterial role they play in accounts that ground moral status in relational attributes. In the passage from which we quoted earlier, Mulhall regards radically disabled humans as suffering a grave misfortune in lacking characteristically human capacities:
We do not strive (when we do strive) to treat human infants and children, the senile and the severely disabled as fully human because we mistakenly attribute capacities to them that they lack, or because we are blind to the merely biological significance of a species boundary. We do it (when we do) because they are fellow human beings, embodied creatures who will come to share, or have already shared, in our common life, or whose inability to do so is a result of the shocks and ills to which all human flesh and blood is heir—because there but for the grace of God go I. (Mulhall 2002, 7)
For a humanist like Mulhall, the capacity to participate in distinctively human forms of life is neither necessary nor sufficient for full moral status (as McMahan (2005) appears to assume). That status is established merely by our recognition of an individual as a human being, heir to the same “shocks and ills” as we are. Human beings with radical cognitive disabilities suffer “grave misfortune,” not reduced status if they are unable to share in the distinctive forms of our common life in which their embodiment has “embedded” them. Non-human animals with similar attributes have lower moral status but suffer no comparable estrangement or loss. Their participation in their own species’ distinctive forms of life—if there are any—does not depend upon, and might well be impaired by, their possession of the cognitive attributes of normal adult humans.
A critic might concede that we in fact hold these divergent attitudes toward humans and non-human animals but would question their moral significance: why should we regard the congenital absence of certain capacities as a tragedy for the individual lacking them if and only if that individual is human (McMahan 1996)? A humanist would respond that the question itself reveals that the critic simply is not clear on the concept of “human being”—a concept that includes the notion of a common life, based on shared embodiment, from which radically impaired humans are excluded.
Humanists are wary of grounding the full moral status of radically-impaired humans in their relationship to a species-norm like rationality. Thus, Byrne (2000) argues that appeal to the rational nature of human beings as the basis for respect is too reliant on external justification and too narrow. It is too reliant on claims about the respect owed to beings that are rational-by-nature, which Byrne doubts are any more self-evident or plausible than claims about the respect owed human beings. It is too narrow because it ignores other aspects of humanity that make the concept of “human being” so rich and powerful.
The position of humanists on the species-relativity of moral status is uncertain. Given the critical role they assign to “the distinctive form of common life” of human beings for moral recognition and obligation, it is not obvious that Mulhall or Diamond would require an intelligent Martian to recognize and respect the moral status of cognitively normal human beings, let alone of human beings with radical cognitive impairments. Indeed, it is not clear how humans could confidently impute intelligence to Martians if their embodiment was sufficiently different from ours, let alone whether we could regard them as subject to moral obligations of any kind. Similarly, it is not clear whether Mulhall and Diamond would hold that humans were required to treat Martians as moral equals, even if they could attribute intelligence and moral sensitivity to them. The role they assign to distinctively human forms of life raises doubts about the possibility of mutual comprehension, recognition, and respect.
In contrast, Williams’ account, and others less wedded to a Wittgenstinian view of language and concepts, can more readily address the prospect of close encounters with other intelligent beings. Williams himself considers such encounters, and acknowledges the possibility of mutual recognition, though he thinks it might be reasonably qualified by partiality towards the members of one’s own species and its culture.
These two humanist accounts leave critical questions about the boundaries of the thick concept of “human being.” Does that concept encompass early embryos, or human-like beings produced by a future synthetic biology? Can we answer such questions in terms of the “fit” of a proposed boundary with the other beliefs and practices associated with the concept, or are such questions decided less self-consciously by gradual shifts in our actual practices? Without a better sense of how boundary questions can be resolved, it is not clear how humanist accounts will meet the challenges of exclusion.
There seems to be little prospect for consensus on the moral status of people with the most severe cognitive disabilities. There are sharp disagreements about how, or even whether, the moral status of humans can be grounded, and about the weight to be given our strongest and most considered, moral convictions. Accounts that ground full moral status in an individual’s possession of psychological attributes inevitably exclude some portion of humanity, and appear to have implications for the treatment of the excluded human beings that few of us are willing to accept. Those implications are avoided by accounts that ground full moral status in our species membership—in the nature of the species or in our biological relationships to other members. Those implications are also avoided by accounts that deny the need to ground the moral status of human beings in any attribute we or our group possesses. But these ways of avoiding exclusion have significant costs. They require a strong partiality toward those with shared biological features, physical appearances, or origins, a partiality that conflicts with equally strong, if more abstract convictions about the justification for our conduct towards others. And they leave deep uncertainty about the moral constraints on our treatment of other living beings and about the boundaries of humanity itself.
Despite the serious challenges facing both approaches, and the formidable obstacles to reaching any sort of consensus, the discussion about the moral status of human beings with radical cognitive disabilities is a central one for applied ethics. It needs to continue.
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- Wilkinson, D., 2008. Answering the challenge: moral philosophy and the cognitively disabled, online manuscript, accessed Novemer 22, 2011.
We have received invaluable editorial assistance from Dorit Barlevy, Ari Schick, and William Chin.