Supplement to Common Knowledge

Proof of Lemma 2.15

Lemma 2.15.
\(\omega' \in \mathcal{M}(\omega)\) iff \(\omega '\) is reachable from \(\omega\).

Pick an arbitrary world \(\omega \in \Omega\), and let

\[ \mathcal{R}(\omega) = \bigcup_{n=1}^{\infty} \bigcup_{i_1,i_2 ,\ldots ,i_n \in N} \mathcal{H}_{i_n}(\ldots(\mathcal{H}_{i_2}(\mathcal{H}_{i_1}(\omega))\ldots) \]

that is, \(\mathcal{R}(\omega)\) is the set of all worlds that are reachable from \(\omega\). Clearly, for each \(i \in N,\) \(\mathcal{H}_i (\omega) \subseteq \mathcal{R}(\omega)\), which shows that \(\mathcal{R}\) is a coarsening of the partitions \(\mathcal{H}_i,\) \(i \in N\). Hence \(\mathcal{M}(\omega) \subseteq \mathcal{R}(\omega)\), as \(\mathcal{M}\) is the finest common coarsening of the \(\mathcal{H}_i\)’s.

We need to show that \(\mathcal{R}(\omega) \subseteq \mathcal{M}(\omega)\) to complete the proof. To do this, it suffices to show that for any sequence \(i_1, i_2 , \ldots ,i_n \in N\)

\[\tag{1} \mathcal{H}_{i_n}(\ldots(\mathcal{H}_{i_2} (\mathcal{H}_{i_1}(\omega))\ldots) \]

We will prove (1) by induction on \(n\). By definition, \(\mathcal{H}_i (\omega) \subseteq \mathcal{M}(\omega)\) for each \(i \in N,\) proving (1) for \(n = 1\). Suppose now that (1) obtains for \(n = k\), and for a given \(i \in N\), let \(\omega^* \in \mathcal{H}_i(A)\) where \(A = \mathcal{H}_{i_k} (\ldots(\mathcal{H}_{i_2} (\mathcal{H}_{i_1}(\omega)))\). By induction hypothesis, \(A \subseteq \mathcal{M}(\omega)\). Since \(\mathcal{H}_i (A)\) states that \(i_1\) thinks that \(i_2\) thinks that \(\ldots i_k\) thinks that \(i\) thinks that \(\omega^*\) is possible, \(A\) and \(\mathcal{H}_i (\omega^*)\) must overlap, that is, \(\mathcal{H}_i (\omega^*) \cap A \ne \varnothing\). If \(\omega^* \not\in \mathcal{M}(\omega),\) then \(\mathcal{H}_i (\omega^*) \not\subseteq \mathcal{M}(\omega)\), which implies that \(\mathcal{M}\) is not a common coarsening of the \(\mathcal{H}_i\)’s, a contradiction. Hence \(\omega^* \in \mathcal{M}(\omega)\), and since \(i\) was chosen arbitrarily from \(N\), this shows that (1) obtains for \(n = k + 1.\) \(\Box\)

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