Supplement to Common Knowledge

Proof of Proposition 2.17

Proposition 2.17 (Aumann 1976)
Let \(\mathcal{M}\) be the meet of the agents’ partitions \(\mathcal{H}_i\) for each \(i \in N\). A proposition \(E \subseteq \Omega\) is common knowledge for the agents of \(N\) at \(\omega\) iff \(\mathcal{M}(\omega) \subseteq E\). In Aumann (1976), \(E\) is defined to be common knowledge at \(\omega\) iff \(\mathcal{M}(\omega) \subseteq E\).

\((\Leftarrow)\) By Lemma 2.16, \(\mathcal{M}(\omega)\) is common knowledge at \(\omega\), so \(E\) is common knowledge at \(\omega\) by Proposition 2.4.

\((\Rightarrow)\) We must show that \(\mathbf{K}^*_N (E)\) implies that \(\mathcal{M}(\omega) \subseteq E\). Suppose that there exists \(\omega' \in \mathcal{M}(\omega)\) such that \(\omega' \not\in E.\) Since \(\omega' \in \mathcal{M}(\omega), \omega'\) is reachable from \(\omega\), so there exists a sequence \(0, 1, \ldots ,m-1\) with associated states \(\omega_1, \omega_2 , \ldots ,\omega_m\) and information sets \(\mathcal{H}_{i_{ k} }(\omega_k)\) such that \(\omega_0 = \omega,\) \(\omega_m = \omega',\) and \(\omega_k \in \mathcal{H}_{i_k}(\omega_{k+1}).\) But at information set \(\mathcal{H}_{i_{ k} }(\omega_m)\), agent \(i_k\) does not know event \(E\). Working backwards on \(k\), we see that event \(E\) cannot be common knowledge, that is, agent \(i_1\) cannot rule out the possibility that agent \(i_2\) thinks that … that agent \(i_{m-1}\) thinks that agent \(i_m\) does not know \(E.\) \(\Box\)

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