Supplement to Common Knowledge

Proof of Proposition 3.1

Proposition 3.1.
Let \(\Omega\) be a finite set of states of the world. Suppose that

  1. Agents i and j have a common prior probability distribution \(\mu(\cdot)\) over the events of \(\Omega\) such that \(\mu(\omega) \gt 0\) for each \(\omega \in \Omega\), and
  2. It is common knowledge at \(\omega\) that \(i\)’s posterior probability of event \(E\) is \(q_i(E)\) and that \(j\)’s posterior probability of \(E\) is \(q_j(E).\)

Then \(q_i(E) = q_j(E).\)

Let \(\mathcal{M}\) be the meet of all the agents’ partitions, and let \(\mathcal{M}(\omega)\) be the element of \(\mathcal{M}\) containing \(\omega\). Since \(\mathcal{M}(\omega)\) consists of cells common to every agents information partition, we can write

\[ \mathcal{M}(\omega) = \bigcup_k H_{ik}, \]

where each \(H_{ik} \in \mathcal{H}_i\). Since \(i\)’s posterior probability of event \(E\) is common knowledge, it is constant on \(\mathcal{M}(\omega),\) and so

\[ q_i(E) = \mu(E \mid H_{ik}) \text{ for all } k \]


\[ \mu(E \cap H_{ik}) = q_i(E) \mu(H_{ik}) \]

and so

\[\begin{align} \mu(E \cap \mathcal{M}(\omega)) &= \mu(E \cap \bigcup_k H_{ik}) = \mu(\bigcup_k E \cap H_{ik}) \\ &= \sum_k \mu(E \cap H_{ik}) = \sum_k q_i(E) \mu(H_{ik}) \\ &= q_i(E) \sum_k \mu(H_{ik}) = q_i(E) \mu(\bigcup_k H_{ik}) \\ &= q_i(E) \mu(\mathcal{M}(\omega)) \end{align}\]

Applying the same argument to \(j\), we have

\[ \mu(E \cap \mathcal{M}(\omega)) = q_j(E)\mu(\mathcal{M}(\omega)) \]

so we must have \(q_i(E) = q_j(E).\) \(\Box\)

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Giacomo Sillari <>

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