Supplement to Common Knowledge

Proof of Proposition 3.12

Proposition 3.12 (Bicchieri 1993)
In an extensive form game of perfect information, the agents follow the backwards induction solution if the following conditions are satisfied for each agent \(i\) at each information set \(I^{ik}\):

  1. \(i\) is rational, \(i\) knows this and \(i\) knows the game, and
  2. At any information set \(I^{jk+1}\) that immediately follows \(I^{ik},\) \(i\) knows at \(I^{ik}\) what \(j\) knows at \(I^{jk+1}\).

The proof is by induction on \(m\), the number of potential moves in the game. If \(m = 1\), then at \(I^{i1}\), by (a) agent \(i\) chooses a strategy which yields \(i\) her maximum payoff, and this is the backwards induction solution for a game with one move.

Now suppose the proposition holds for games having at most \(m = r\) potential moves. Let \(\Gamma\) be a game of perfect information with \(r + 1\) potential moves, and suppose that \((\alpha)\) and \((\beta)\) are satisfied at every node of \(\Gamma\). Let \(I^{i1}\) be the information set corresponding to the root of the tree for \(\Gamma\). At \(I^{i1},\) \(i\) knows that (a) and (b) obtain for each of the subgames that start at the information sets which immediately follow \(I^{i1}\). Then \(i\) knows that the outcome of play for each of these subgames is the backwards induction solution for that subgame. Hence, at \(I^{i1}\), \(i\)’s payoff maximizing strategy is a branch of the tree starting from \(I^{i1}\) which leads to a subgame whose backwards induction solution is best for \(i\), and since \(i\) is rational, \(i\) chooses such a branch at \(I^{i1}\). But this is the backwards induction solution for the entire game \(\Gamma\), so the proposition is proved for \(m = r + 1\).

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