## Rubinstein’s Proof

[Note: See Definition 3.2 for the notation used in this proof.]

Let $$T_2$$ denote the number of messages that Joanna’s e-mail system sends, and $$T_1$$ denote the number of messages that Lizzi’s e-mail system sends. We might suppose that $$T_i$$ appears on each agent’s computer screen. If $$T_1 = 0$$, then Lizzi sends no message, that is, $$\omega_1$$ has occurred, in which case Lizzi’s unique best response is to choose $$A$$. If $$T_2 = 0$$, then Joanna did not receive a message. She knows that in this case, either $$\omega_1$$ has occurred and Lizzi did not send her a message, which occurs with probability .51, or $$\omega_2$$ has occurred and Lizzi sent her a message which did not arrive, which occurs with probability $$.49\varepsilon$$. If $$\omega_1$$ has occurred, then Lizzi is sure to choose $$A$$, so Joanna knows that whatever Lizzi might do at $$\omega_2$$,

\begin{align} E(u_2 (A) \mid T_2 =0) &\ge \frac{2(.51) + 0(.49)\varepsilon}{.51 + .49\varepsilon} \\ &\gt \frac{-4(.51) + 2(.49)\varepsilon}{.51 + .49\varepsilon} \\ &\ge E(u_2(B) \mid T_2 =0) \end{align}

so Joanna is strictly better off choosing A no matter what Lizzi does at either state of the world.

Suppose next that for all $$T_i \lt t$$, each agents’ unique best response given her expectations regarding the other agent is $$A$$, so that the unique Nash equilibrium of the game is $$(A,A)$$. Assume that $$T_1 = t$$. Lizzi is uncertain whether $$T_2 = t$$, which is the case if Joanna received Lizzi’s $$t$$th automatic confirmation and Joanna’s $$t$$th confirmation was lost, or if $$T_2 = t - 1$$, which is the case if Lizzi’s $$t$$th confirmation was lost. Then

\begin{align} \mu_1 (T_2 = t-1 \mid T_1 = t) &= z \\ &= \frac{\varepsilon}{\varepsilon + (1-\varepsilon)\varepsilon} \\ &\gt \frac{1}{2}. \end{align}

Thus[1] it is more likely that Lizzi’s last confirmation did not arrive than that Joanna did receive this message. By the inductive assumption, Lizzi assesses that Joanna will choose $$A$$ if $$T_2 = t-1$$. So

\begin{align} E(u_1 (B) \mid T_1 = t) &\le -4z + 2(1-z) \\ &= -6z + 2 \\ &\lt -3 + 2 \\ &= -1, \end{align}

and

$E(u_1 (A) \mid T_1 = t) = 0$

since Lizzi knows that $$\omega_2$$ is the case. So Lizzi’s unique best action is $$A$$. Similarly, one can show that $$A$$ is Joanna’s best reply if $$T_2 = t$$. So by induction, $$(A,A)$$ is the unique Nash equilibrium of the game for every $$t \ge 0$$.