Notes to Conceptual Art

1. The term does, however, seems to have been used as early as 1961 in New York by the artist Henry Flynt in relation to some of the pieces and performances originating in the Fluxus Group (Wood, 2002: 8).

2. Richard Long, 1967, A Line Made by Walking. For documentation, see the external image.

3. Bruce Nauman, 1968, Playing a Note on the Violin While I Walk around the Studio. For documentation, see the external image.

4. Piero Manzoni, 1961. For documentation, see the external image.

5. Two important theories based on this idea: (i) George Dickie’s ‘Institutional Theory of Art’; (ii) Jerrold Levinson’s ‘Historical Definition of Art’. For (i), X is an artwork if and only if X is an artefact upon which someone acting on behalf of a certain institution (the artworld) confers the status of being a candidate for appreciation. For (ii), X is an artwork if it is made with the intention of promoting (or preventing) pleasure, and, most importantly, of being perceived and appreciated as a work of art within the historical framework of art making and art appreciation. This theory thus allows for the possibility that an artefact could be made outside a social context such as the artworld, but emphasizes the intention of the maker instead. For more on these theories, see Dickie (1973) and Levinson (1979).

6. This piece consists of a cylinder measuring one kilometre, inserted into the ground, with a brass plate placed at the top to indicate where it is. For documentation, see the external image

7. For Bell (1914) and Fry (1920) possessing ‘significant form’ is such a necessary and sufficient condition. Also, Beardsley (1958) defines art as something produced with the intention of giving it the capacity to satisfy aesthetic interest.

8. For more on the value of art in general, see (Budd 1995).

9. For documentation, see the external image.

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Elisabeth Schellekens <>

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