Act-consequentialism is one of today’s leading moral theories. Broadly construed, it holds that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that its outcome is not evaluatively outranked by that of any available alternative. To evaluatively rank (hereafter, simply “rank”) a set of outcomes is to rank them along some evaluative dimension, such as their overall goodness, their goodness for the agent, their goodness for others besides the agent, or some combination of such things. And when we combine act-consequentialism with different ways of ranking outcomes, we get different versions of act-consequentialism. For instance, Benthamite utilitarianism (Bentham 1789) combines act-consequentialism with the view that outcomes are to be ranked in terms of their overall goodness and that the overall goodness of an outcome is simply a function of the intensities and durations of the pleasures and pains that it contains. On this theory, agents must always maximize hedonic utility—the net balance of pleasure over pain for all concerned. By contrast, ethical egoism (Shaver 2002 ) is an act-consequentialist theory that ranks outcomes in terms of how good they are for the agent. It holds that one outcome outranks another if and only if it is better for the agent. And, so, ethical egoism implies that an agent ought to produce the outcome that’s best for themself even if it’s worse overall. In contrast to these two, self/other utilitarianism (Sider 1993: 128) holds that one outcome outranks another if and only if it outranks the other both in terms of how good it is and in terms of how good it is for others besides the agent. On this view, an agent may perform an act whose outcome is worse than that of some available alternative so long as that outcome is worse only for themself. And these three are but a few of the possibilities.
Although there are many ways to rank outcomes and, consequently, many versions of act-consequentialism, Benthamite utilitarianism (hereafter, simply “utilitarianism”) is its archetypal and prototypical form. The problem is that few are willing to accept it given its counterintuitive implications, including the following:
- we ought to lobotomize people if this would maximize hedonic utility by enabling them to enjoy simple bodily pleasures free of intellectual discontent,
- we are required to sacrifice our own lives to save the lives of others even if this would produce only slightly more hedonic utility overall, and
- we are permitted to maim, torture, and even kill innocent people so long as doing so would produce more (perhaps, only slightly more) hedonic utility.
Yet, despite such counterintuitive implications, utilitarianism tends to haunt even those of us who refuse to accept it, for there seems to be something quite compelling about its act-consequentialism (Berker 2013: 364; Foot 1985: 196; Korsgaard 1993 [1996: 225]). Of course, what exactly, if anything, is so compelling about it is controversial and, thus, something that we’ll need to consider below.
Given this putative tension between the attractiveness of act-consequentialism and the unattractiveness of its archetype’s implications, a potentially promising research project is to come up with a version of act-consequentialism that avoids utilitarianism’s counterintuitive implications. Given that many standard versions of non-consequentialism (including standard versions of Kantianism, virtue ethics, and theological voluntarism) avoid many, if not all, of utilitarianism’s counterintuitive implications, we could do this by constructing a ranking of outcomes that, when combined with act-consequentialism, yields the same (or nearly the same) deontic verdicts that one of these non-consequentialist theories delivers. This is to consequentialize that non-consequentialist theory. (Note that deontic verdicts are verdicts such as “right”, “obligatory”, “permissible”, “supererogatory”, “ought to be performed”, etc. Unlike evaluative verdicts such as “good” and “better”, which are directly normative only for what we should desire/prefer, deontic verdicts are also directly normative prospectively for what we should do/intend and retrospectively for whom we should blame/praise.)
To illustrate, consider theological voluntarism—the view that the ultimate right-making feature of an action is that it accords with God’s will. And let’s consider the version that holds that God wills that we abide by the Ten Commandments. To consequentialize this non-consequentialist theory, we need to replace its account of the ultimate right-maker with one that holds instead that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that its outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative and that one outcome outranks another if and only if the agent refrains from violating the Ten Commandments in the one but not the other. This act-consequentialist counterpart theory yields the same set of deontic verdicts that this version of theological voluntarism delivers—e.g., that it’s obligatory to honor your parents and wrong to both lie and commit murder. But this counterpart theory is a version of act-consequentialism as opposed to theological voluntarism because it holds that the feature of lying that ultimately makes it wrong is, not that God wills us to refrain from lying, but that the outcome in which the agent lies is outranked by the outcome in which they neither lie nor violate any other commandment.
Thus, to consequentialize a non-consequentialist theory, we combine act-consequentialism with a ranking of outcomes such that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory yields, in every possible world, the same (or nearly the same) deontic verdicts that the target non-consequentialist theory yields. Historically, this has most often been done in the hopes of coming up with a version of act-consequentialism that avoids most, if not all, of utilitarianism’s counterintuitive implications. And this project is often called “the consequentializing project” (Portmore 2007; S. A. Schroeder 2017; Suikkanen 2020). But, as we’ll see below, some contemporary philosophers consequentialize for other reasons. Indeed, there are three different types of consequentializing and, consequently, three distinct consequentializing projects. And, so, when we consider various objections to consequentializing below, we’ll need to be careful not to conflate them, as many of these objections apply only to certain types of consequentializing.
- 1. How Consequentializing Differs from Other Attempts to Reconcile Utilitarianism with Common Moral Opinion
- 2. Consequentializing Commonsense Deontic Verdicts
- 3. Three Motives for, and Types of, Consequentializing
- 4. Objections to Consequentializing
- 4.1 There Is Nothing Uniquely Compelling about Act-Consequentialism
- 4.2 Some Key Features of Commonsense Morality Cannot Be Consequentialized
- 4.3 Act-Consequentialist Counterpart Theories Are Gimmicky
- 4.4 Act-Consequentialist Counterpart Theories Are Explanatorily Inadequate
- 4.5 “Has an Outcome that Outranks Every Available Alternative” Isn’t Equivalent to “Ought to Be Performed”
- 5. Conclusion
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1. How Consequentializing Differs from Other Attempts to Reconcile Utilitarianism with Common Moral Opinion
There are at least two ways of trying to modify utilitarianism in the hopes of reconciling some portion of it with common moral opinion. One way is to keep its act-consequentialism but trade in its simplistic ranking of outcomes for a more sophisticated one. Consider, then, that utilitarianism (which, recall, is short for “Benthamite utilitarianism”) ranks outcomes according to quantitative hedonism: the view that the only things that ultimately matter in ranking outcomes are the intensities and durations of the pleasures and pains that they contain. Yet, it seems that many more things matter, including whether those outcomes are ones in which we violate people’s rights or affect the quality—and not just the quantity—of their pleasures and pains. And this has led to theories such as rights consequentialism (Sen 1982) and qualitative utilitarianism (Mill 1861), respectively. The other is to keep utilitarianism’s quantitative hedonism but trade in its act-consequentialism. For instance, whereas Bentham held that we should evaluate acts in terms of their own utilities, we could instead evaluate actions in terms of whether they accord with the code of rules that, if accepted by the vast majority of everyone everywhere, would produce more hedonic utility than the vast majority of everyone everywhere accepting some alternative code. And this has led to theories such as rule-utilitarianism. (Perhaps, there’s even a third way: holding that the outcomes that are to be ranked are to be individuated not only metaphysically but also presentationally, such that they themselves can be agent-relative—see N. R. Howard 2022.)
Of course, these different ways of trying to reconcile some portion of utilitarianism with common moral opinion are not mutually exclusive. Brad Hooker’s (2000) rule-consequentialism not only trades in utilitarianism’s act-consequentialism for rule-consequentialism but also trades in its simplistic ranking of outcomes for one that admits that other things besides pleasures and pains matter in the ranking of outcomes. The result is a moral theory that is very close to commonsense morality in its deontic verdicts.
But although there may be more than one way of reconciling some portion of utilitarianism with common moral opinion, consequentializing involves doing so by revising its method of ranking outcomes while keeping its act-consequentialism intact. This is because many (including non-consequentialists) believe that when we move away from utilitarianism’s act-consequentialism, we give up the very thing that we found most compelling about it in the first place. For, as Philippa Foot has argued, utilitarianism’s
[act-]consequentialist element is one of the main reasons why utilitarianism seems so compelling
as well as the main reason why
the move to rule utilitarianism seems to be an unsatisfactory answer to the problem of reconciling utilitarianism with common moral opinion. (1985: 196 & 198)
2. Consequentializing Commonsense Deontic Verdicts
As we’ve seen, one of the main motivations for consequentializing certain commonsense deontic verdicts is to reconcile utilitarianism’s putatively compelling act-consequentialism with common moral opinion. This section considers the various kinds of deontic verdicts that consequentializers have sought to accommodate and the sorts of moves they have historically made to do so.
Interestingly, consequentializing seems to go nearly as far back as act-consequentialism itself (see Hurley 2020: 27). Indeed, it goes at least as far back as John Stuart Mill’s development of qualitative hedonism in response to the objection that (Benthamite) utilitarianism is, given its commitment to quantitative hedonism, “a doctrine worthy only of swine”. Mill argued that there are certain kinds of pleasures (e.g., intellectual pleasures) that human beings, but not swine, are capable of and that these “higher” pleasures are qualitatively different than the “lower”, bodily pleasures of which both swine and human beings are capable—so much so that no quantity of these lower pleasures could ever be as good as a sufficient quantity of higher pleasures (1861 [1991: 14–17]).
G. E. Moore (1903) went even further, arguing
- that pleasure isn’t the only intrinsic good,
- that not all goods are good for someone, and
- that the goodness of a whole needn’t equal the sum of the goodness of its parts taken individually.
And this wholesale rejection of hedonism was, as W. D. Ross pointed out, a significant development, allowing the act-consequentialist to account for the fact
that pleasure is not the only thing in life that we think good in itself, that for instance we think the possession of a good character, or an intelligent understanding of the world, as good or better. (1930 [2002: 17])
This move to reject hedonism can take the consequentializer even further when it’s combined with the rejection of utilitarians’ narrow conception of an act’s outcome. Utilitarians tend to think of an act’s outcome as consisting solely in what’s causally downstream from the act. For they hold that hedonic utility is all that matters and that things that are not causally downstream from the act—things such as whether the act is an instance of keeping a promise, whether the agent’s motive in performing it was virtuous, and whether there’s a victim of some past injustice who would be compensated by it—don’t themselves affect how much hedonic utility it produces. But there’s no reason why the act-consequentialist can’t be concerned with more than just the causal consequences of an act. And, so, it’s now standard to construe the outcome of an act broadly to include everything that would be the case if it were performed. (Of course, if it’s indeterminate what would be the case if it were performed, we would need to switch from talking about the act’s outcome to talking about its prospect, which is a probability distribution consisting of all its possible outcomes and their associated probabilities. But I’ll ignore this complication in what remains.)
Once the act-consequentialist both rejects hedonism and construes an act’s outcome broadly, they can hold that certain types of actions are intrinsically bad—that, for instance, “breaking a promise is intrinsically bad” (Ewing 1948: 187). The consequentializer can, then, insist that whatever features of actions that the target non-consequentialist theory takes to be intrinsically wrong-making are instead features of outcomes that make them rank poorly—the idea being that what’s most salient is not whether an act has the property of being a promise-breaking but whether its outcome has the property of being one in which this promise-breaking occurs. The consequentializer can thereby accommodate our intuition that breaking a promise is wrong even if breaking it would produce just as much hedonic utility as keeping it. It’s wrong because outcomes in which promises are broken are, other things being equal, worse than those in which they are kept.
But although these moves are significant, they are insufficient to allow the consequentializer to accommodate other commonsense intuitions. For commonsense holds that breaking a promise is wrong even if breaking it would produce just as much good as keeping it (Ross 1930 [2002: 18]), and the overall goodness of breaking a promise must take into account whatever intrinsic badness there is in the act itself. For instance, commonsense holds that it would be wrong, other things being equal, for Abe to break his promise even to prevent Bert and Carl from breaking their promises. Yet, clearly, it must, other things being equal, be better for Abe to break his promise than for Bert and Carl to break theirs. For even if promise-breakings are intrinsically bad, two promise-breakings would have to be worse than just one, other things being equal.
To accommodate such commonsense intuitions, consequentializers have typically appealed to an evaluator-relative ranking of outcomes, one where the agent’s ranking differs from that of, say, some bystander (see, e.g., Sen 1983—but see Dougherty 2013 and Setiya 2018 for an approach that doesn’t appeal to evaluator relativism). Whereas the bystander has no good reason to prefer Abe’s breaking his promise to two others’ breaking theirs, Abe has a good reason to prefer two others’ breaking their promises to his breaking his promise in that Abe has a special responsibility for his own promises, a responsibility that he doesn’t have for ensuring that the others keep theirs. Thus, given an agent’s special responsibility for their own agency, Abe should rank the outcome in which he keeps his promise and two others break theirs above the outcome in which he breaks his promise and two others keep theirs. And, so, the act-consequentialist can accommodate the intuition that breaking a promise is wrong even if breaking it would produce just as much good as (or even more good than) keeping it.
Now, commonsense morality differs from utilitarianism not only in taking there to be restrictions on performing certain types of action—such as promise-breakings—even for the sake of bringing about the overall best outcome (i.e., agent-centered restrictions), but also in taking there to be options either to bring about the overall best outcome or to refrain from doing so (i.e., agent-centered options). To accommodate the latter, consequentializers have typically appealed to a dual ranking of outcomes (see Sider 1993 and Portmore 2011). To illustrate, recall self/other utilitarianism and imagine that you must choose between (a) giving your last aspirin to some stranger, alleviating their mild headache, or (b) taking it yourself, alleviating your severe headache. Assuming that everything else is equal, utilitarianism requires you to take the aspirin yourself, as this will bring about the overall best outcome: the one with less overall pain. But, intuitively, you are also permitted to give it to the stranger. Self/other utilitarianism accommodates this intuition by holding that the permissibility of actions depends on two different rankings of their outcomes: one that ranks them in terms of how good they are overall and another that ranks them in terms of how good they are for everyone but the agent. More specifically, self/other utilitarianism holds that an act is permissible if and only if there is no available alternative whose outcome outranks its outcome on both of these two rankings. And since taking the aspirin yourself outranks giving it to the stranger in terms of what’s best overall but giving it to the stranger outranks taking it yourself in terms of what’s best for others, both are permissible.
Unfortunately, however, self/other utilitarianism accommodates only one of two types of agent-centered options: namely, agent-sacrificing options. Agent-sacrificing options are options to either maximize the overall good or sacrifice your own greater interests (and the overall good) for the sake of doing more to promote the lesser interests of others. But just as important are agent-favoring options. Agent-favoring options are options to either maximize the overall good or favor promoting your own interests over promoting the overall good. To illustrate, suppose that you legally and justifiably possess two tablets of an opioid drug. Now, given your built-up tolerance to this drug, you would need to take both tablets to alleviate your moderate pain. But there are two strangers who are also in moderate pain, and they would each need only one tablet to alleviate their pain, for they have no built-up tolerance to this drug. Thus, you can either take both tablets yourself or give the two strangers one tablet each. And the latter would be better overall, as it would alleviate twice as much pain. Nevertheless, it seems that you are permitted to do either, which is an intuitive verdict that self/other utilitarianism cannot accommodate.
But, as consequentializers have shown, other act-consequentialist theories can. One is Schefflerian utilitarianism (see Portmore 2011: 93–7). It holds that an act is permissible if and only if there is no available alternative whose outcome outranks its outcome both in terms of utility for others (other than the agent, that is) and in terms of egoistically-adjusted utility, where egoistically-adjusted utility includes everyone’s utility but adjusts the overall total by giving the agent’s utility ten times the weight of each other’s. Schefflerian utilitarianism implies that you are permitted to either take the two tablets yourself (as this would produce the most egoistically-adjusted utility) or give the two strangers one tablet each (as this would produce the most utility for others). What’s more, Schefflerian utilitarianism allows that in the previous case you can either take the aspirin to alleviate your own severe headache (as this would produce the most egoistically-adjusted utility) or give it to the stranger to alleviate their mild headache (as this would produce the most utility for others). Thus, Schefflerian utilitarianism is an act-consequentialist theory that accommodates both agent-favoring options and agent-sacrificing options. Still, it is a rather simplistic theory, and one that seems both arbitrary in setting the egoistic multiplier at ten and ad hoc in its appeal to a dual ranking of outcomes solely as a means to avoiding counterintuitive implications. But consequentializers have tried to come up with ever more sophisticated consequentialist theories that seek to address these issues—see, e.g., Portmore 2011: chaps. 5–6.
There are, of course, other commonsense deontic verdicts that consequentializers may wish to accommodate as well as other moves they may need to take to do so. But the above should serve as a brief history of some of the significant moves that consequentializers have made.
3. Three Motives for, and Types of, Consequentializing
We can consequentialize, but why should we? As we’ll see, there are three different answers, resulting in three distinct types of consequentializing.
3.1 Earnest Consequentializing
We’ve already seen what is perhaps the original, and most common, motivation for consequentializing: to avoid utilitarianism’s counterintuitive deontic verdicts while retaining what’s most intuitively compelling about it—its act-consequentialism (S. A. Schroeder 2017: 1477). Following Sergio Tenenbaum (2014), I’ll call those with this motive for consequentializing earnest consequentializers. Earnest consequentializers (e.g., Sen 1983 and Portmore 2011) give what’s known as the intuitive argument for consequentializing (S. A. Schroeder 2017: 1477):
- On the one hand, there is something intuitively compelling about utilitarianism: its act-consequentialism.
- On the other hand, standard versions of non-consequentialism avoid most, if not all, of the counterintuitive deontic verdicts associated with utilitarianism. Still, they do so at the cost of abandoning act-consequentialism.
- Thus, by consequentializing standard versions of non-consequentialism, we can produce an act-consequentialist counterpart theory that retains what’s most compelling about utilitarianism while avoiding most, if not all, of the counterintuitive deontic verdicts associated with it.
- And, in doing so, nothing nearly as compelling is lost.
- Therefore, by consequentializing standard versions of non-consequentialism, we can produce a theory that’s more intuitively attractive than both utilitarianism and standard versions of non-consequentialism.
Earnest consequentializing is made possible because theory selection is underdetermined by the data that our theories seek to explain (see Duhem 1914 ; Quine 1951 ; and Baumann 2019). To illustrate, consider two moral theories: utilitarian theological voluntarism and utilitarian act-consequentialism. These two explain the same data set: that all and only acts that maximize hedonic utility are permissible. However, their explanations are quite different. Utilitarian theological voluntarism holds that the explanation lies with the fact that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that it accords with God’s will along with the fact (as they see it) that God is perfectly good and, so, wills each of us to maximize hedonic utility (see Paley 1802). Utilitarian act-consequentialism, by contrast, holds that the explanation lies with the fact that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that its outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative along with the fact (as they see it) that an act’s outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative if and only if it maximizes hedonic utility. Thus, the moral data (i.e., the given set of deontic verdicts) can be explained either in non-consequentialist terms or in act-consequentialist terms. And, to consequentialize, we just need to opt for the latter.
The fact that data underdetermines theory selection also makes Kantianizing possible. And, so, just as we can consequentialize a non-consequentialist theory, we can Kantianize a non-Kantian theory (Hurley 2013; Sachs 2010). For instance, if we wanted to Kantianize utilitarianism, we need only combine Kantianism (which, on at least one interpretation, is the view that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that it shows the proper respect for humanity) with the assumption that an act shows the proper respect for humanity if and only if it maximizes hedonic utility. Indeed, the point generalizes: for any moral theory X that holds that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that it is F, we can X-ize a non-X theory that holds instead that it is G simply by combining X’s account of the ultimate right-maker with the assumption that an act is F if and only if it is G. (This will be possible so long as F and G are such that it’s possible that an act is F if and only if it is G.)
We can even theologically voluntarize a non-theological-voluntarist theory such as Kantianism. To do so, we need only combine theological voluntarism’s view that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that it accords with God’s will with the assumption that an act accords with God’s will if and only if it shows the proper respect for humanity. The result is a version of theological voluntarism (viz., Kantian theological voluntarism) that yields the same set of deontic verdicts that Kantianism delivers.
But if we can account for the moral data on various types of theories, why opt to do so in terms of act-consequentialism rather than non-consequentialism? In other words, why consequentialize rather than, say, Kantianize? The earnest consequentializer answers that it is because there is something uniquely compelling about act-consequentialism (what’s often called “the Compelling Idea”) and nothing nearly so compelling about Kantianism or any other non-consequentialist theory. This claim is, of course, controversial, but we’ll address this controversy both in the next section and in section 4.1 below.
3.2 Notational Consequentializing
Some are motivated to consequentialize out of a desire to establish both that the consequentialist/non-consequentialist distinction is unimportant and that there is nothing uniquely compelling about act-consequentialism (see Dreier 2011 and Louise 2004). Because these philosophers hold that the act-consequentialist counterpart of a target non-consequentialist theory is a mere notational variant on that theory, I’ll call them notational consequentializers. They give what’s known as the assimilation argument for consequentializing (S. A. Schroeder 2017: 1480):
- Every plausible non-consequentialist theory has an act-consequentialist counterpart theory such that the two are necessarily co-extensive in their deontic verdicts (Dreier 2011: 104–111).
- If an act-consequentialist theory and a non-consequentialist theory are necessarily co-extensive in their deontic verdicts, then they are equivalent in the strong sense of being mere notational variants of each other, just as the view that the average kinetic energy of the molecules in a pot of boiling water at one atmosphere of pressure is 100 degrees Celsius is a mere notational variant of the view that the average kinetic energy of the molecules in a pot of boiling water at one atmosphere of pressure is 212 degrees Fahrenheit (Dreier 2011: 111–115).
- If every plausible non-consequentialist theory is a mere notational variant of some extensionally equivalent act-consequentialist counterpart theory, then the consequentialism/non-consequentialism distinction is unimportant (and, indeed, empty), for every plausible moral theory has, then, both an act-consequentialist notational variant and a non-consequentialist notational variant (Dreier 2011: 114–115).
- Thus, the consequentialism/non-consequentialism distinction is unimportant (and, indeed, empty).
But, for now, let us examine why the notational consequentializer thinks that the first premise is true. It’s because they have high hopes for what’s known as the Footian Procedure (Portmore 2011: 112), a procedure for generating an act-consequentialist counterpart theory for any plausible target non-consequentialist theory. To follow this procedure, we simply combine act-consequentialism’s view that an act is permissible if and only if its outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative with the assumption that an act’s outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative if and only if it is F, where “F” stands for whatever feature of actions that the target non-consequentialist theory takes to be the ultimate right-maker (e.g., “showing the proper respect for humanity” in the case of Kantianism). In other words, we generate a ranking of outcomes as follows: we rank the outcome of every act that the target non-consequentialist theory takes to be permissible above the outcome of every available alternative that the target non-consequentialist theory takes to be impermissible. What’s more, if the target non-consequentialist theory allows that some acts are morally better than others in that we have more moral reason to perform them than to perform those others, then we rank their outcomes above those of the others, and we do so by whatever degree the target non-consequentialist theory takes them to be morally better. Because, on this procedure, whether one outcome outranks another on the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory just depends on whether the act that would produce the one is, on the target non-consequentialist theory, morally better than the act that would produce the other, it guarantees that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory delivers, in every possible world, the same deontic verdicts that the target non-consequentialist theory yields.
But this procedure doesn’t guarantee that the first premise in the assimilation argument is true. For it may not always be possible to employ the Footian Procedure. It won’t be possible if the structural features of the target non-consequentialist theory’s morally-better relation are incompatible with those of act-consequentialism’s ranking of outcomes (see Brown 2011). To illustrate, suppose that act-consequentialism’s ranking of outcomes must be transitive, whereas the target non-consequentialist theory’s morally-better relation is intransitive. For suppose that the target non-consequentialist theory holds:
- that act A is morally better than act B,
- that act B is morally better than act C, but
- that act C is morally better than act A.
In that case, there will be no way to employ the Footian Procedure to consequentialize this non-consequentialist theory if act-consequentialism’s ranking of outcomes must be transitive.
In any case, notational consequentializing aims to use the Footian Procedure, if possible, to demonstrate that every plausible non-consequentialist theory has an extensionally equivalent act-consequentialist counterpart theory with the goal of establishing that, in every instance, the target non-consequentialist theory and the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory are mere notational variants of each other. In doing this, the notational consequentializer hopes to establish that the consequentialist/non-consequentialist distinction is unimportant (and, indeed, empty). And this would mean that there is nothing uniquely compelling about act-consequentialism and, so, no reason (or, at least, no non-pragmatic reason) for us to consequentialize rather than, say, Kantianize (cf. Dreier 2011: 115).
3.3 Pragmatic Consequentializing
Most recently, some have consequentialized for purely pragmatic reasons (see Colyvan, Cox, & Steele 2010 and Lazar 2017). For instance, Seth Lazar tells us:
My interest in consequentializing is purely instrumental. It allows me to represent my moral theory in a way that makes it amenable to decision theory. …Consequentializing [my] deontological moral theory allows [me] to apply it to situations with imperfect information. It makes deontological decision theory possible. (2017: 586–87)
I’ll call those with this or some other pragmatic motive for consequentializing pragmatic consequentializers. They give what’s known as the pragmatic argument for consequentializing (S. A. Schroeder 2017: 1488). And if we take the relevant pragmatic motive to be the one that Lazar cites, the corresponding version of this argument would be as follows:
- Whereas consequentialist theories are amenable to decision theory, non-consequentialist theories are not, which gives consequentialist theories a distinct advantage over non-consequentialist theories when dealing with imperfect information.
- But, by consequentializing a non-consequentialist theory, we can faithfully represent its extension even if we do thereby misrepresent (or, at least, make opaque) its explanation for that extension (Colyvan et al. 2010: 523).
- Thus, if we consequentialize a non-consequentialist theory, we can then apply decision theory to the resultant act-consequentialist counterpart theory and thereby determine the target non-consequentialist theory’s deontic verdicts in situations involving imperfect information.
Thus, pragmatic consequentializing aims to consequentialize some plausible non-consequentialist theory using the Footian Procedure to come up with an act-consequentialist counterpart that can then be employed for some practical purpose. For instance, Lazar (2017) consequentializes the deontic verdicts that his non-consequentialist theory yields in situations involving perfect information so that he can then use the tools of decision theory on the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart to determine what deontic verdicts his non-consequentialist theory yields in situations involving imperfect information.
So, for the pragmatic consequentializer, the reason for consequentializing rather than, say, Kantianizing is that there’s supposedly something unique about act-consequentialism that makes it amenable to decision theory, which is pragmatically useful.
4. Objections to Consequentializing
Consequentializing has its fair share of detractors. Some deny that it’s possible to consequentialize every plausible non-consequentialist theory. Others see it as possible but consider it a mere gimmick. Others, still, take it to be possible and more than a mere gimmick but find the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theories to be explanatorily inadequate. Unfortunately, though, those leveling such objections haven’t always been careful to note that there are different types of consequentializing and that many of these objections apply only to certain types. Below, I’ll consider these and other objections to consequentializing as well as which types of consequentializing are subject to them.
4.1 There Is Nothing Uniquely Compelling about Act-Consequentialism
As we’ve seen, even those who refuse to accept utilitarianism find that there is, nonetheless, something quite compelling about it: its act-consequentialism. But what’s so compelling about act-consequentialism? Let’s call whatever it is “the Compelling Idea”. For earnest consequentializing to succeed, this so-called Compelling Idea must be both genuinely compelling and something that all and only act-consequentialist theories share. Both claims have been denied. So, let’s look at various proposals for the Compelling Idea and see if any of them are both genuinely compelling and unique to act-consequentialism.
One proposal is as follows.
Best Option: It is always morally permissible for you to perform your morally best option—that is, the best option in terms of whatever morally matters (Hurley 2017).
Although this seems to be a genuinely compelling idea (but see Portmore 2019 for some doubts), it is not at all unique to act-consequentialism. For, arguably, most, if not all, moral theories endorse it (Hurley 2017: 40). So, the earnest consequentializer must look elsewhere. Perhaps, then, the Compelling Idea concerns the best outcome as opposed to the best option.
Best Outcome: It is always morally permissible for you to perform the option that would bring about the best outcome (Scheffler 1982 ; Ewing 1948: 188).
Unlike Best Option, this idea is undoubtedly unique to act-consequentialism, but some argue that it isn’t compelling—or, at least, not uncontroversially so (see Hurley 2017). After all, many find it intuitive to think that certain types of acts (e.g., breaking a promise) are wrong even if they bring about the best outcome. For instance, deontologists believe that there are agent-centered restrictions that prohibit you from performing certain act-types even in some situations in which your performing an instance of one of these act-types would prevent two or more others from each performing a morally comparable instance of this act-type (see Scheffler 1985: 409). So, as we saw above, even if there’s something intrinsically bad about acts of this type, the outcome in which you perform an instance of this act-type would, other things being equal, have to be better than the outcome in which two or more others each perform a morally comparable instance of this act-type. So, if the Compelling Idea is to be genuinely compelling even to those who endorse agent-centered restrictions, it better not appeal to the best outcome. For the best outcome is the outcome with the most good, the good being what’s desirable from a universal point of view rather than what’s desirable from the agent’s point of view. And this has led some earnest consequentializers to appeal instead to the following.
Best-Relative-to: It is always morally permissible for you to perform the option that would bring about the outcome that’s best-relative-to you (Sen 1983; Smith 2003).
The problem with this proposal is that the better-relative-to relation seems to be a purely theoretical notion. In which case, it would be impossible for us to have any pre-theoretical grasp on claims involving it, such as Best-Relative-to (M. Schroeder 2007). And if that’s right, then Best-Relative-to cannot be something that we find compelling—at least, not pre-theoretically. Of course, some believe that we can avoid this worry by defending, via a certain conception of the good, the idea that what’s best-relative-to someone is just what that someone has most reason to desire (see, e.g., Smith 2003). Others, though, have sought to avoid the controversy by instead appealing to the following.
Most Reason to Desire: It is always morally permissible for you to perform the option that would bring about the outcome that you have most reason to desire—or, in other words, the outcome that you ought, or that it is fitting for you, to prefer to every available alternative (Portmore 2007).
One advantage of this proposal is that it explains why utilitarianism and ethical egoism
have something deep in common that is the source of their common appeal, as demonstrated by Sidgwick . (M. Schroeder 2007: 290)
For the two theories share a commitment to Most Reason to Desire in that they are both act-consequentialist theories, broadly construed. That is, they both hold that whether an agent ought to perform an act is determined solely by whether that agent ought to prefer its outcome to those of the available alternatives. It’s just that whereas the ethical egoist holds that agents ought always to prefer that they themselves have more hedonic utility, the utilitarian holds that agents ought always to prefer that there is more hedonic utility overall.
Most Reason to Desire also seems to be what Philippa Foot (1985) had in mind. Foot said,
What is it…that is so compelling about [act-]consequentialism? It is, I think, the rather simple thought that it can never be right to prefer a worse state of affairs to a better. It is this thought that haunts us. (1985: 198)
But, of course, act-consequentialism is not a theory about what it is right to prefer, but rather a theory about what it is right to do. Nevertheless, we can charitably interpret Foot as assuming that the Compelling Idea is Most Reason to Desire. This idea in conjunction with her claim that it can never be right to prefer a worse state of affairs to a better one entails the thought that it is always morally permissible to bring about the best outcome, and this is the thought that she sought to debunk by arguing that we have no grasp of the notion of the best outcome except as the outcome most favored by benevolence from among those actions permitted by justice. The problem, though, is that Foot is wrong about its never being right to prefer a worse state of affairs to a better one. For, as Jamie Dreier has pointed out,
it is perfectly intelligible and pretty plausible that it is fitting for me to prefer, say, the safety of my children to the safety of yours, and for you conversely to prefer your children’s safety to mine. (2011: 101)
So, even if we should accept Foot’s assumption that Most Reason to Desire is the Compelling Idea, we should reject her assumption that it can never be right to prefer a worse outcome to a better outcome. After all, the outcome in which my less gifted child is saved is, other things being equal, worse than the one in which your more gifted child is saved (that is, it should, other things being equal, be dispreferred from a universal point of view), but I should, nevertheless, prefer it from my own point of view.
Although Most Reason to Desire is quite compelling, it is not unique to act-consequentialism. For it turns out that consequentializing is a double-edged sword in that it can just as easily be employed to render non-consequentialism compatible with Most Reason to Desire as it can be used to render act-consequentialism compatible with commonsense deontic verdicts (Sachs 2010). For in showing that there is a ranking of outcomes that renders act-consequentialism compatible with some non-consequentialist theory’s deontic verdicts, the consequentializer also shows that there is a ranking of outcomes (the very same one) that renders this non-consequentialist theory compatible with Most Reason to Desire. As Benjamin Sachs points out,
all the non-consequentialist has to do in order to make her theory compatible with the Compelling Idea is accept the fruits of the consequentialist’s labor. (2010: 261)
But although this works so long as we hold that the Compelling Idea is something like Most Reason to Desire, it doesn’t work if we think that the Compelling Idea includes a claim about what, on act-consequentialism, grounds the deontic statuses of actions. Consider that Sachs’s objection rests on the assumption that the best version of non-consequentialism is compatible with the Compelling Idea if the best version of act-consequentialism is compatible with the Compelling Idea. And, as even he admits, this assumption holds only if the Compelling Idea doesn’t include a claim about what, on act-consequentialism, grounds the deontic statuses of actions (Sachs 2010: 266–9). So, if the earnest consequentializer wants to avoid Sachs’s objection, they need only to adopt something like the following proposal.
Reasons for Preferring Ground Deontic Statuses: An act’s deontic status is grounded in the agent’s reasons for preferring its outcome to those of the available alternatives. Consequently, it is always morally permissible for an agent to perform the option that would bring about the outcome that they ought (or that it is fitting for them) to prefer to every available alternative (Portmore 2011: 5).
Like Most Reason to Desire, this proposal has the advantage of accounting for the thought that the Compelling Idea is something that both utilitarianism and ethical egoism hold in common. What’s more, it seems quite attractive to many—or, at least, to those who accept a teleological conception of action. On this conception, actions are attempts to affect how the world goes. And, thus, whenever one acts intentionally, one acts with the aim of making the world go a certain way. The aim needn’t be anything having to do with the causal consequences of the act. The aim could be nothing more than to perform the act in question. One could, for instance, run merely with the aim of running. But the fact remains that, for every intentional action, there is some end at which the agent aims. Thus, it’s natural to suppose that the reasons for performing an action derive from the reasons for desiring the ends that it would achieve. And, so, one has most reason to act in whatever way will make the world go as one ought to prefer that it goes (see Mill 1861 : Ch. 1; Portmore 2019: 262–3; Thomson 2003: 8; Wood 2017: 266). After all, wouldn’t it be odd to think that one isn’t permitted to do what would best achieve the aims that one ought to want to achieve? In any case, given Most Reason to Desire’s inclusion of the claim that an act’s deontic status is grounded in the agent’s reasons for preferring its outcome to those of the available alternatives (which earnest consequentializers take to be definitive of act-consequentialism), it is at least unique to act-consequentialism.
So, if Reasons for Preferring Ground Deontic Statuses is indeed compelling, then there is something uniquely compelling about act-consequentialism. And, in that case, the earnest consequentializer is off and running. But, some—such as Paul Hurley (2018)—deny that it is compelling. But even if he is correct, this poses no problem for either notational consequentializers or pragmatic consequentializers, for neither insists on there being something uniquely compelling about act-consequentialism. So, this would be a worry for only earnest consequentializers.
4.2 Some Key Features of Commonsense Morality Cannot Be Consequentialized
Some argue that it’s not possible to consequentialize every plausible non-consequentialist theory (see, e.g., Brown 2011). As we’ll see below, their being correct would be a problem for both notional consequentializers and pragmatic consequentializers, but not necessarily for earnest consequentializers.
Both the notational consequentializer and the pragmatic consequentializer are committed to what’s known as the Extensional Equivalence Thesis: for every plausible non-consequentialist theory, there is an act-consequentialist counterpart theory that yields, in every possible world, the same set of deontic verdicts that it yields (Dreier 2011: 98). The notational consequentializer is committed to this, for it is just the first premise in their assimilation argument for consequentializing. And the pragmatic consequentializer is committed to this, for the second premise in their pragmatic argument for consequentializing assumes that, in consequentializing a non-consequentialist theory, we can faithfully represent its extension.
Nevertheless, the Extensional Equivalence Thesis is controversial. For instance, Campbell Brown (2011) has argued that the consequentializer cannot accommodate prohibition dilemmas: situations in which every available act is impermissible. Now, whenever there are certain deontic verdicts that the act-consequentialist supposedly cannot accommodate, there are two options for proponents of the Extensional Equivalence Thesis. One option is to concede that the act-consequentialist cannot accommodate such verdicts but argue that any non-consequentialist theory that includes such verdicts is implausible. This is what Dreier does concerning prohibition dilemmas (see Dreier 2011: 105–6). The other option is to argue that, despite appearances, there’s a way for the act-consequentialist to accommodate these deontic verdicts. Some argue, for instance, that the consequentialist can accommodate prohibition dilemmas by adopting a cyclic ranking of outcomes (Peterson 2010: 158). Thus, if the target non-consequentialist theory holds that all three of an agent’s options—say, A, B, and C—are impermissible, then the consequentialist can just adopt a ranking where A’s outcome outranks B’s outcome, B’s outcome outranks C’s outcome, and C’s outcome outranks A’s outcome. Since each outcome is outranked by that of some available alternative, each available act is impermissible. But, of course, this assumes, as noted above, that the act-consequentialist can adopt an intransitive ranking of outcomes, which Brown contests.
Whereas pragmatic consequentializing and notational consequentializing will succeed only if the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory yields the same set of deontic verdicts that the target non-consequentialist theory yields, earnest consequentializing can succeed even without such perfect coextension (cf. Tenenbaum 2014: 233). After all, the success of earnest consequentializing requires only that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory is better overall than both utilitarianism and standard versions of non-consequentialism; it doesn’t require that it can yield all the same deontic verdicts that any plausible non-consequentialist theory can. Given the earnest consequentializer’s goal of coming up with an act-consequentialist theory that is more intuitively compelling than both utilitarianism and standard versions of non-consequentialism, they eschew the Footian Procedure. For although employing the Footian Procedure ensures that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory will be perfectly co-extensive with the target non-consequentialist theory, it doesn’t guarantee that it will be more intuitively compelling than that non-consequentialist theory. For it could be that the act-consequentialist would have to accept some very implausible rankings of outcomes to ensure its perfect co-extension with the target non-consequentialist theory. And, as we’ll see below, this is indeed what some philosophers have argued (e.g., Emet 2010 and C. Howard 2021).
In any case, the earnest consequentializer adopts a different procedure for consequentializing: what’s known as the Coherentist Procedure (Portmore 2011: 113). On this procedure, we don’t just adopt whatever ranking of outcomes is necessary to ensure that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory will be perfectly co-extensive with the target non-consequentialist theory. Instead, we hold constant the idea that one act is morally better than another if and only if its outcome outranks that of the other while revising, in light of each other and in light of our various background beliefs, both our pre-theoretical judgments about whether one outcome outranks another and our pre-theoretical judgments about whether the act that produces the one is morally better than the act that produces the other. And we do this until we reach wide reflective equilibrium—a state in which we have arrived at an acceptable coherence among our entire set of beliefs (see Daniels 2003 ). And it may be that, to reach wide reflective equilibrium, we must reject some of the target non-consequentialist theory’s deontic verdicts rather than adopt the ranking of outcomes needed to consequentialize them.
Admittedly, no one has pre-theoretical judgments about the ranking of outcomes in the abstract. But these are evaluative rankings, and arguably such evaluative rankings concern what the agent ought (or what it is fitting for the agent) to desire/prefer (see Portmore 2011: 59–62 and 112–114). Hence, the earnest consequentializer holds that the judgment that one outcome outranks another is just the judgment that the agent ought (or that it is fitting for the agent) to prefer the one to the other. And we clearly have judgments both about which outcomes an agent ought to prefer and about which outcome it would be fitting for them to prefer—but I’ll talk only of what they ought to prefer in the remainder. Many would, for instance, judge both that, if my child has fallen into the sea, I ought to prefer that she does not drown and that, if Sergio can rescue only one of two groups of people drowning, I ought to prefer that Sergio rescues the group that includes my child even if the other group is somewhat larger. And these judgments seem to be independent of our judgment about what Sergio ought to do, for we may judge that, although Sergio ought to save the larger group, I ought, nevertheless, to prefer that Sergio saves the smaller group—that being the group that includes my child. And, in some instances, the Coherentist Procedure may call for revising such pre-theoretical judgments. For suppose that the target non-consequentialist theory holds that my turning in my daughter to police is morally better than my refraining from doing so but our pre-theoretical judgment is that I ought to prefer the outcome in which I refrain from turning her in to the outcome in which I turn her in. In that case, the act-consequentialist counterpart theory must either deny that my turning her in is morally better than my not doing so (and, thus, give up being perfectly co-extensive with the target non-consequentialist theory) or reject the intuitive judgment that I ought to prefer the outcome in which I refrain from turning her in to the outcome in which I turn her in. But, even so, it could be that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory is more intuitively plausible than both utilitarianism and standard versions of non-consequentialism.
But even if the earnest consequentializer doesn’t need to accommodate every deontic verdict that every plausible non-consequentialist theory can accommodate, they do need to consequentialize a good number of them. Moreover, they need to do so without sacrificing whatever the Compelling Idea is. And whether they can do that depends on what the Compelling Idea is. To illustrate, suppose that we take the Compelling Idea to be Best Outcome. Since the best outcome is the outcome that’s best from what Sidgwick (1907) described as “the point of view of the universe”, it seems that we must abandon this idea if we want to consequentialize certain deontic verdicts, such as those stemming from agent-centered restrictions (but see Dougherty 2013; N. R. Howard 2022; and Setiya 2018 for a contrary position). And this is why many earnest consequentializers reject Best Outcome in favor of Best-Relative-to, Most Reason to Desire, or Reasons for Preferring Ground Deontic Statuses.
4.3 Act-Consequentialist Counterpart Theories Are Gimmicky
Some philosophers claim that consequentializing a target non-consequentialist theory results in a gimmicky act-consequentialist counterpart theory—and, thus, one that’s implausible (see, e.g., Nozick 1974: 29). And, admittedly, the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theory can seem gimmicky when we arrive at it via the Footian Procedure. In that case, the consequentializer just takes whatever features of actions that the target non-consequentialist theory holds to be intrinsically wrong-making and insists that they are instead features of outcomes that make them rank poorly. So, if the non-consequentialist theory holds that an act’s being a promise-breaking is, other things being equal, what makes it wrong, the consequentializer will hold instead that an outcome’s including a promise-breaking is, other things being equal, what makes it rank lower than one that doesn’t. And this move can seem ad hoc.
But the fact that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theories are gimmicky (and, thus, ad hoc) is no objection to either notational consequentializing or pragmatic consequentializing. Such consequentializers will readily concede that these resulting theories are gimmicky. The notational consequentializer will argue that all extensionally equivalent theories are gimmicky representations of each other in that they are all just arbitrarily different notational variants on the same moral view. So, the fact that consequentializing produces gimmicky act-consequentialist counterpart theories is no objection to notational consequentializing. And it’s no objection to pragmatic consequentializing either. The pragmatic consequentializer is happy to admit not only that the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theories are gimmicky but also that they are, consequently, implausible. For pragmatic consequentializers reject the resulting act-consequentialist counterpart theories that they construct merely for certain pragmatic purposes.
Of course, things are different for the earnest consequentializer. It would be a problem if they produced an act-consequentialist counterpart theory that was gimmicky. But, arguably, the result of earnest consequentializing isn’t gimmicky given that it employs the Coherentist Procedure rather than the Footian Procedure. Of course, when the earnest consequentializer accommodates, say, our intuition that it’s wrong for Abe to break his promise even to prevent both Bert and Carl from breaking theirs, they do so by insisting that Abe ought to prefer the outcome in which he keeps his promise and Bert and Carl break theirs to the outcome in which he breaks his promise and Bert and Carl keep theirs. But the motivation for this move isn’t the ad hoc one that making it allows them to accommodate this intuition. Instead, the earnest consequentializer motivates this move on independent grounds: agents bear a special responsibility for their own agency and, thus, for their own promises. Thus, an agent should, other things being equal, blame themselves more harshly for breaking one of their own promises than for letting two others each break one of theirs. And this motivation should appeal even to non-consequentialists. For non-consequentialists, such as Bernard Williams, have powerfully argued that agents have a special responsibility for their own actions, a responsibility that they don’t bear for what they allow others to do. In any case, this thought that agent’s bear a special responsibility for their own agency can motivate the earnest consequentializer’s claim that agents should prefer, other things being equal, the outcome in which two others violate an agent-centered restriction to the outcome in which they themselves violate that restriction—see Otsuka 2011: 42; Portmore 2011: 100–103; and Williams 1973: 93–100. And, so, there needn’t be anything gimmicky about the way in which the earnest consequentializer motivates these sorts of moves in accommodating our commonsense moral intuitions.
So, on the one hand, it’s clear that both notational consequentializing and pragmatic consequentializing produce gimmicky act-consequentialist counterpart theories by employing the Footian Procedure but unclear why this should be objectionable. On the other hand, it’s clear that it would be objectionable for the earnest consequentializer to produce a gimmicky act-consequentialist counterpart theory but unclear why we should think that they would given that they employ the Coherentist Procedure rather than the Footian Procedure.
4.4 Act-Consequentialist Counterpart Theories Are Explanatorily Inadequate
Even if the act-consequentialist counterpart theories that earnest consequentializers produce aren’t gimmicky, they could be objectionable for other reasons. Indeed, some argue that they are explanatorily inadequate. For whereas many earnest consequentializers adopt Reasons for Preferring Ground Deontic Statuses and, so, hold that the deontic statuses of actions are grounded in the reasons that agents have for preferring (or dispreferring) the outcomes in which they are performed, others believe that it’s the other way around. As they see it, these act-consequentialist counterpart theories invert the true explanatory direction. For whereas the earnest consequentializer holds that the impermissibility of Abe’s breaking his promise is grounded in the fact that he ought to prefer the outcome in which he keeps it, they believe instead that Abe’s reason for preferring the outcome in which he keeps it is grounded in the fact that it’s impermissible for him to break it. And precursors of this objection go as far back as E. F. Carritt (1928: 72–3) and W. D. Ross (1939: 289), both of whom argued that even if we think that promise-breakings are bad, we should think this only because it’s wrong to break a promise. And, so, the wrongness of promise-breakings explains their badness, not the other way around, as the act-consequentialist might suppose.
Earnest consequentializers retort that it’s actually non-consequentialists who invert the true order of explanation. They argue that the deontic statuses of actions are grounded in reasons for performing them and that it’s more plausible to think that reasons for actions are grounded in reasons for preferring their outcomes than vice versa (see, e.g., Portmore 2011: chap. 3, especially 78–82).
More recently, however, Stephen Emet (2010) and Christopher Howard (2021) have argued that act-consequentialist counterpart theories are explanatorily inadequate for a different reason. They argue that, in taking the Compelling Idea to be something such as Reasons for Preferring Ground Deontic Statuses, the earnest consequentializer is forced to give up a plausible rationale for certain deontic verdicts. Take, for instance, the deontic verdict that it would be wrong for you to kill even in a situation in which the mafia has credibly threatened to kill five innocent strangers unless you kill a sixth (C. Howard 2021: 728). Howard claims that, in providing a rationale for this verdict, the earnest consequentializer must eschew the plausible view that it lies with the fact that your potential victim has the kind of value that calls for your not treating them as a mere means and must instead embrace the implausible view that it lies with the fact that you, the agent, ought to have a self-centered, and self-indulgent, preference for keeping your own hands clean. He argues that since your reasons for refraining from treating your potential victim as a mere means
have their source in the value of [your potential victim], …they’re reasons…[that] don’t derive from…[your] reasons for preferring some outcomes to others. (2021: 749)
But this reasoning is fallacious. From the fact that A ultimately derives from (and, thus, has its source in) C, it doesn’t follow that A doesn’t derive from B. For it could be that A derives from B, which in turn derives from C.
Act-consequentialists are committed to the evaluative rankings of outcomes being explanatorily prior to the deontic statuses of the actions that produce them, but they’re not committed to the evaluative rankings of outcomes being explanatory prior to the deontic statuses of attitudes, such as the attitude of respect towards ends-in-themselves. Given this, earnest consequentializers can argue that there’s nothing that precludes them from holding either that persons are ends-in-themselves who are owed respect or that this fact is explanatorily prior to the evaluative rankings of outcomes. That is, earnest consequentializers can argue that you have a duty to respect persons and that this duty gives rise to a duty to prefer that you not treat them as a mere means—even as a mere means to that of preventing the mafia from killing five others. What’s more, given this duty to prefer the outcome in which you refrain from killing the one to the outcome in which you kill the one as a mere means to preventing the mafia from killing the five, the former outranks the latter from your evaluative position. And this, given act-consequentialism, explains the impermissibility of your killing the one to prevent the five from being killed by the mafia. Thus, the earnest consequentializer hopes to consequentialize the deontic verdict that it’s wrong for you to kill the one even to prevent the mafia from killing the five without giving up the plausible thought that the rationale for this ultimately lies with your would-be victim and their value as an end-in-themself (see Portmore forthcoming and Portmore 2019: 235–7).
Now, one may object that if someone concedes that the rationale for the impermissibility of your killing the one to prevent the five from being killed by the mafia ultimately lies with your would-be victim and their value as an end-in-themself, then they thereby commit themself to Kantianism as opposed to act-consequentialism. But earnest consequentializers argue that this is a mistake. They believe that the difference between Kantianism and act-consequentialism is that whereas the former holds that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that it shows the proper respect for humanity, the latter holds that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is instead that its outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative. Thus, the act-consequentialist can hold that what determines whether one outcome is outranked by another is anything other than the deontic statuses of the acts that produce them. So, they can even hold that what determines whether the one outranks the other is whether the agent treats someone who is an end-in-themself as a mere means in the one but not the other.
As the earnest consequentializer sees things, moral theories are to be differentiated by what they take the ultimate right- and wrong-making features of actions to be, not by what they take the ultimate rationale for an act’s being right or wrong to be. To illustrate, consider utilitarian theological voluntarism again. It holds both that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that it accords with God’s will and that God is perfectly good and, so, wills each of us to maximize the good, which they take to be hedonic utility. In their view, the ultimate rationale for an act’s being obligatory is that it produces the best outcome. For they hold that an act’s outcome being best is what explains why God (being perfectly good) wills the agent to perform it. And God’s willing the agent to perform it, in turn, explains why it’s obligatory. But, as earnest consequentializers see things, this doesn’t make the view act-consequentialist. Indeed, they see it as a rival to act-consequentialism given that it holds that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that it accords with God’s will, not that its outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative. And this does seem to be a significant difference. For if the theological voluntarist were to be convinced that, in fact, God isn’t perfectly good and even wills us to torture children for fun, they would be forced to concede that it would be right to do so. By contrast, the act-consequentialist’s view of what’s right is independent of their view on what God wills. Given this, earnest consequentializers think that we should conclude that a theory that holds that the ultimate right-making feature of an act is that its outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative is act-consequentialist even if it holds that the rationale for the wrongness of your killing the one to prevent the mafia from killing the five ultimately lies with your would-be victim and their value as an end-in-themself.
There is, of course, more to be said on this topic of explanatory adequacy, including whether the earnest consequentializer can give a plausible explanation for the idea that it’s sometimes wrong to violate an agent-centered constraint even to minimize one’s own violations of that constraint—see, e.g., Brook 1991; Kamm 1996; Lopez et al. 2009; Otsuka 2011; and Portmore forthcoming. Still, the above should give the reader a sense of why non-consequentialists might find act-consequentialist counterpart theories to be explanatorily inadequate and how the earnest consequentializer might reply to such worries.
4.5 “Has an Outcome that Outranks Every Available Alternative” Isn’t Equivalent to “Ought to Be Performed”
This last objection applies only to notational consequentializers. As we saw above, notational consequentializers accept two controversial assumptions: the first two premises of their assimilation argument. We already considered their defense of the first premise in section 4.2. And now it’s time to see how they defend the second premise: the assumption that if an act-consequentialist theory and a non-consequentialist theory are necessarily co-extensive in their deontic verdicts, then they are equivalent in the strong sense of being mere notational variants of each other.
Before we get to this defense, though, it’s important to get clear on what the assumption is. It’s that just as we can refer to the average kinetic energy of the molecules in a pot of boiling water at one atmosphere of pressure using either the metric expression “100 degrees Celsius” or some equivalent non-metric expression such as “212 degrees Fahrenheit”, we can refer to what makes an act one that ought to be performed using either the consequentialist expression “has an outcome that outranks every available alternative” or some putatively equivalent non-consequentialist expression such as “is necessary to show the proper respect for humanity”. The thought, then, is that what matters is only what Dreier calls the “active ingredients”, not the expressions that we use to label them. And, in the case of what makes a pot of water boiling, the active ingredient is the average kinetic energy of the water’s molecules, whereas, in the case of what makes an act one that ought to be performed, it is, according to Dreier, the features of its outcome (which includes the act itself) that contribute to its deontic status—see Dreier 2011: 114.
Now, one way of defending this underlying thought is to claim, as A. C. Ewing did, that “the good” just means “what ought to be brought into existence, other things being equal” (1939: 8). But, on this view, a non-consequentialist who claims that it can be wrong to bring into existence what’s best is just misusing the word “best”. And this may seem too quick.
Dreier is less quick. He claims only that insofar as we have some pre-theoretical notion of a good outcome,
its specific content is too weak and thin for it to come apart from the notion of what we are to choose. (Dreier 2011: 115)
Dreier’s idea (following Foot) is that we don’t have a concept of goodness (applied to outcomes) that is independent of thoughts about what we ought to do. (S. A. Schroeder 2017: 1482)
For, as Dreier sees it, the notion of an act whose outcome outranks every available alternative cannot come apart from the notion of an act that ought to be performed.
One reason to doubt this, however, is that whereas some theories hold that whether an agent ought to perform an act just depends on whether its outcome outranks every available alternative, other theories hold that it depends instead on whether the outcome of the best option in which the agent performs it outranks every available alternative. Thus, an act whose outcome outranks every available alternative needn’t be one that ought to be performed, contrary to Dreier’s assertions. To illustrate, consider the following example from Frank Jackson:
Wonderful things will happen if I raise both my arms at some given time t. OK things will happen if I raise neither arm at t, and also if I raise my right arm but not my left arm at t. Dreadful things will happen if I raise my left arm but not my right arm at t. If I raise my left arm at t, I will not raise my right arm at t. I am completely free to raise or not to raise either of my arms at t. Let’s suppose that all the foregoing is known for certain by me at the time in question. (2014: 645)
According to some theorists, I ought not to raise my left arm at t, because the outcome of my raising my left arm at t is outranked by that of an available alternative: that of my raising neither arm at t. These theorists include both omnists and actualists—see Portmore 2019 and Timmerman & Cohen 2019 , respectively. Given that I will not raise my right arm at t if I raise my left arm at t, dreadful things will happen if I raise my left arm at t. But OK things will happen if I instead either raise neither arm at t or raise only my right arm at t. So, these theorists hold that I should not raise my left arm at t.
But other theorists hold that I ought to raise my left arm at t, because although its outcome is outranked by that of refraining from raising my left arm at t, the outcome of the best option in which I raise my left arm at t—that is, the option in which I raise both my arms at t—outranks every available alternative. These theorists include both maximalists and possibilists—see Portmore 2019 and Timmerman & Cohen 2019 , respectively. After all, wonderful things will happen if I raise both my arms at t. And I have no option where something better than wonderful things would happen. So, I ought to raise both my arms at t. And since this entails raising my left arm at t, I ought to raise my left arm at t.
This suggests, contrary to Dreier’s assertions, that the notion of an act whose outcome outranks every available alternative can come apart from the notion of an act that ought to be performed. For these two types of theorists agree that the outcome of my raising my left arm at t (the outcome in which dreadful things happen) is outranked by that of my raising neither arm at t (the outcome in which OK things happen). And they agree that the outcome of my raising both my arms at t (the outcome in which wonderful things happen) outranks those of every available alternative. But despite their agreeing on how all the outcomes rank, they disagree on whether I ought to perform the option of raising my left arm at t. In other words, the two theories agree on how to rank all the available outcomes but disagree on whether the act whose outcome outranks every available alternative must always be the one that ought to be performed—see Nair 2020. Thus, the two theories disagree on what the active ingredients are and not just on how to label them. For whereas omnists (and actualists) hold that the active ingredient in making an act one that ought to be performed is that its outcome outranks every available alternative (as Dreier assertions entail), maximalists (and possibilists) hold that it is instead that the outcome of the best option in which the agent performs it outranks every available alternative. Of course, Dreier could try to argue that these two types of theories are somehow equivalent, but, as Shyam Nair points out, doing so would involve uncharitably insisting that one of them accepts a very implausible claim about how to rank outcomes—see his 2020. Unfortunately, Nair’s argument is too long and complex to summarize here. But the reader should at least have a sense of this objection and how it might be rebutted.
As Campbell Brown (2011) has noted, arguing with an act-consequentialist can be frustrating. You describe some action—say, your killing one innocent person to prevent the mafia from killing five other innocent people. And then you claim that although your doing this would clearly be wrong, the outcome in which you do this is one that you should prefer to (and, thus, one that outranks) the outcome in which you don’t do this. You conclude, therefore, that act-consequentialism is false: an act can be wrong even though its outcome is not outranked by that of any available alternative. But the act-consequentialist retorts that, to reach this conclusion, you had to presuppose a particular account of how outcomes rank, one that the act-consequentialist needn’t accept. So, you were wrong to conclude that act-consequentialism is false. All that you’ve shown is that a certain version of act-consequentialism is false. But we already knew that act-consequentialism yields counterintuitive deontic verdicts when combined with certain assumptions about how outcomes rank. We learned that long ago by studying the implications of utilitarianism.
Note, then, that arguing against act-consequentialism is a complex task. You can’t test it in isolation from various background assumptions. Instead, you must evaluate it along with various background assumptions, including assumptions not only about how to rank outcomes but also about the nature of actions and the reasons for performing them.
This entry suggests that evaluating the merits of consequentializing is similarly complex. First, there’s no consequentializing tout court, but only three different types of consequentializing. Objections that apply to one don’t necessarily apply to the others. Second, each type of consequentializing has a different motivation. So, there’s no way to assess whether consequentializing is, in general, unmotivated. We can assess only whether a particular type of consequentializing is unmotivated. And, in the case of earnest consequentializing, this is further complicated by the fact that earnest consequentializers offer different motivations for different moves—e.g., the idea that we have a special responsibility for our own agency as a motivation for why agents should prefer that others rather than themselves violate agent-centered restrictions. Third, there are two different procedures for consequentializing a non-consequentialist theory. And this means that we can’t just assess whether, in general, consequentializing produces a gimmicky theory. We must instead look at whether either of these two procedures produces a gimmicky theory.
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Thanks to Chris Howard, Shyam Nair, Drew Schroeder, and especially an anonymous reviewer for helpful comments on earlier drafts of this entry.