Teleological Theories of Mental Content
Consider, for example, the thought that blossoms are forming. On a representational theory of thought, this involves a representation of blossoms forming. A theory of mental content aims to tell us, among other things, why this representation has this content, and so why it is a thought about blossoms forming, rather than about the sun shining, pigs flying, or nothing at all. In general, a theory of mental content tries to explain why mental states, events or processes (or, assuming a representational theory of them, the mental representations involved) count as having the contents they have.
According to teleological theories, the contents of mental representations depend, at least in part, on functions, such as the functions of the systems that use or produce them. The relevant notion of function is held to be one used in biology and neurobiology in attributing functions to items, as in “a function of the pineal gland is secreting melatonin” and “a function of brain area MT is processing information about motion”. Proponents of teleological theories of mental content usually understand these functions to be what the items with the functions were selected for, either by phylogenetic natural selection or by some other similar process.
- 1. Broad Aims
- 2. Teleological Functions
- 3. Teleosemantic Theories
- 4. Problems for Teleosemantics
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1. Broad Aims
Many (perhaps all) mental states are about things, or are directed on to things, in the way that a belief that spring is coming is about spring coming, or in the way that a desire for chocolate is directed on to chocolate. In the terminology re-introduced into philosophy by Franz Brentano (1874/1924), such mental states exhibit intentionality. Alternatively, they can be characterized as representational states, or states with representational content. Prima facie, the fact that mental states have content, i.e. the fact that they exhibit this particular form of directedness towards the world, is rather mysterious. Teleological theories of mental content, like other theories of mental content, attempt to dispel this mystery: they aim to explain how mental states can be about things, directed on to things, or represent things.
In pursuing this aim, proponents of teleological theories usually adopt a physicalist framework, and try to formulate a theory of content that is naturalistic, or in other words a theory that is consistent with the natural sciences and their presumed working assumption that neither intentionality nor consciousness is ontologically fundamental. Most teleological theories thus attempt to show how intentionality, at its most fundamental, can be part of the natural world, by showing how it can be understood as deriving from other (non-mental) natural things.
In general, it is helpful to distinguish between two key questions that teleological theorists are trying to answer. First, there is the representational status question: in virtue of what do representational states count as representational, i.e. what makes it the case that these states have some content or other, rather than having no content at all? Secondly, there is the content-determination question: in virtue of what do representational states have the content they have, i.e. what makes it the case that these states have this specific content rather than some other content? A full teleological theory needs to address both of these questions, although (as we will see) there has been a tendency in the debate to focus on the second one.
One important aspect of mental representations that a theory of mental content needs to account for is their so-called “normative” nature. We may evaluate beliefs as true or false, memories as accurate or inaccurate, perceptions as veridical or illusory, desires as satisfied or not satisfied, and motor instructions as correctly or incorrectly executed. The mental states we evaluate in these ways count as true or false, accurate or inaccurate (etc.) by virtue of their contents, as well as by virtue of other things (such as the actual state of the world). For example, the truth of a belief that today is sunny depends on whether it is sunny, but also on it being a belief that today is sunny. If the content of the belief were different (e.g., if it were a belief that today is hot) then its truth value might be different. The “normative” nature of mental content poses at least a prima facie problem for all naturalistic theories of it, given the Humean warning against trying to derive prescriptive from descriptive facts. Teleological theories share the strategy of explaining the norms pertaining to mental content as deriving from so-called functional “norms”, which are regarded as descriptive rather than prescriptive. We return to this in the next section.
In relation to the “normative” nature of mental content, much attention is paid to the possibility of misrepresentation, since the distinction between correct and incorrect representation is arguably central. In fact, a capacity for misrepresentation is often regarded as essential for genuine representation (see esp. Grice 1957). Some state B, for instance, can only be a belief that today is sunny if B is true when the day is sunny and false when the day is not sunny. In other words, B only qualifies as a representational state of this particular kind if it is capable of misrepresenting the world under certain conditions. And the same holds, mutatis mutandis, for representational states of most kinds.
A distinction is sometimes made between representation of and representation as. Whether or not teleological theories of content are concerned with representation as or of depends on how those locutions are being used. Suffice it to say that teleological theories are generally offered as theories of referential content (i.e. of the kind of content that is tightly connected to truth-, correctness- or satisfaction-conditions), rather than of cognitive content or mode of presentation.
Further, the proponents of teleological theories rarely believe that referential content is a kind of narrow content, and so they are not usually offering theories of narrow content. How to characterize narrow content is controversial, but the proponents of teleological theories tend to agree with those who think that two beings who are physical replicas at a time t “from the skin in”, so to speak, can differ in the referential contents of their mental states at t. Of course, this view is also shared by plenty of other philosophers, who think that mental reference to content supervenes (in part) on things that are external to the individuals whose mental states are in question, such as on features of their social or physical environments and/or learning histories (perhaps for the reasons given by Putnam 1975 and Burge 1979, 1986). Still, a teleological theory of mental reference to content could be combined with the view that there is also a useful notion of narrow content. (See the entry on narrow mental content.)
A final point about broad aims is that teleological theories of mental content are usually intended as real nature theories. Those who offer real nature theories of intentional mental states think that our everyday ability to recognize the intentional mental states of ourselves and others does not make us experts on the fundamental nature of these intentional mental states, any more than our everyday ability to recognize water makes us experts on the fundamental nature of water. Teleological theories of mental content do not entail that, if Bill thinks that Mavis knows that today is Tuesday, then Bill must, in so thinking, be thinking that certain teleological functions pertain to Mavis’s cognitive system.
2. Teleological Functions
While teleological theories of mental content are quite diverse, they all share the idea that psycho-semantic norms depend, in part at least, on functional norms. Later sections explain various ideas about the nature of this dependence. This section describes the notion of function employed. It is generally thought to be in some sense both teleological and normative, but both “teleological” and “normative” need qualifying, and the use of these terms can lead to unnecessary misunderstandings. Let’s take the first of these terms first.
Talk of biological functions does often seem to have at least a teleological flavor. For example, to say that it is the function of the heart to pump blood can seem equivalent to saying that hearts are for pumping blood, or that hearts are there in order to pump blood (see esp. Wright 1973). There is also the closely related concept of an artifact’s function that appears to be purposive: for example, when we say that moving the cursor is the function of the computer’s trackpad, we might mean that this is what the trackpad was designed to do or was intended to do by the computer’s designer or user. Of course, if a teleological theory of mental content is to be a non-circular theory of original intentionality, the functions to which it appeals, as grounding original intentionality, cannot in turn depend on other intentional phenomena. (Some, but not all, prefer to use the term “teleonomic” in that case.)
The claim that the relevant notion of function is in some sense “normative” should also be read with care. What is meant by it is generally just that, when using this notion, we (and biologists) may speak of systems functioning normally or properly, as well as of abnormal functioning, malfunction, dysfunction, functional impairment, and so on. The relevant notion of function is one that permits the possibility of malfunction. That is, it allows for the possibility that a token trait has a function to do Z (in a situation S) while not doing Z (in S), or even while lacking the general disposition to do Z (in S). For example, Joe’s pineal gland could have the function to secrete melatonin even if it cannot secrete melatonin because of some internal damage. Whether it is appropriate to describe the notion as genuinely “normative” is unclear, since it is unclear what genuine normativity requires. But all that is usually meant by saying that the relevant notion of function is normative, at least by proponents of teleological theories of mental content, is that the relevant notion permits the possibility of malfunction, and underwrites the central function/dysfunction distinction employed in biology.
Recall that, as mentioned earlier, the relevant functional norms are understood by proponents of teleological theories of mental content to be descriptive rather than prescriptive. Some prefer to reserve the term “normative” for prescriptive contexts. On that way of speaking, a statement would count as normative only if it entailed an ought-claim without the addition of further premises. Proponents of teleological theories of mental content may all agree that no ought-claim follows from a function ascription without the addition of further premises (for discussion, see Jacob 2001), and thus that the relevant function ascriptions are not prescriptive and hence are not genuinely “normative” if that is what normativity requires. Different terminological practices dominate different discourses, but it is worth remembering that talk of purely descriptive “norms” is well established in some contexts (e.g., in talk of statistical norms). If either psycho-semantic or functional norms were prescriptive, the attempt to naturalize them would seem to ignore Hume’s warning to beware trying to derive ought-statements from is-statements, but those who offer teleological theories of mental content claim that the norms of both functions and content fall on the is side of any is/ought divide.
Those who favor teleological theories of content usually favor an etiological theory of functions, according to which an item’s function is determined by its history of selection or by past selection of things of that type. Roughly, on an etiological theory of functions, an items function is what it was selected for, or what things of the type were selected for (see, e.g., Millikan 1989a and Neander 1991; important precursors are Ayala 1970 and Wright 1973, 1976). This idea can be spelled out in different ways. One influential proposal stems from Karen Neander, who gives the following definition for functions in physiology:
It is a/the proper function of an item (X) of an organism (O) to do that which items of X’s type did to contribute to the inclusive fitness of O’s ancestors, and which caused the genotype, of which X is the phenotypic expression, to be selected by natural selection. (Neander 1991, 74)
Etiological theories of biological function need to allow for the fact that ancestral traits might have been selected for something other than the present function of descendent traits. For example, a penguin’s flippers and an emu’s vestigial wings no longer have the function of flight, even though ancestral forelimbs were selected for flight. Griffiths (1993) and Godfrey-Smith (1994) offer “modern history” versions of the etiological theory, according to which functions are determined by recent selection. Note that selection does not cease when traits “go to fixation” if on-going maintenance selection is still weeding out fresh harmful mutations as they arise. However, selection does require some variation and Schwartz (1999) suggests that a continuing usefulness supplement is needed, which kicks in if variation is absent for a time. In the absence of any variation, the trait retains its function if it is still adaptive.
It is important to note that standard etiological theories do not entail that all functions are directly grounded in processes of natural selection operating over an evolutionary span of time. Millikan (1984) offers a theory on which functions can also result from meme selection. Papineau (1984) speaks of learning and Dretske (1986) invokes functions that depend on recruitment by conditioning. Garson (2011, 2019a) argues that the notion of selection should be loosened so that differential retention without differential replication could count as selection, in which case neural selection would qualify as a form of selection that could underwrite content-determining functions. Finally, Millikan (1984) further suggests that functions of novel items can be derived from the functions of the mechanisms that produce them. While the contents of sensory-perceptual representations might be determined by functions that are directly grounded in processes of natural selection, it is plausible to suppose that the content-determining functions for (most) concepts are grounded in one of the other ways.
While etiological theories dominate the discussion of normative functions in philosophy of biology, the etiological theory is not uncontroversial. Some question whether teleology can be naturalized (e.g., Bedau 1991). Others support other theories for other reasons. Perhaps the systemic theory is the most popular alternative (see esp. Cummins 1975). Systemic theories of function emphasize the role of function ascriptions in functional analyses of systems. Functional analyses of systems conceptually decompose complex activities of whole systems into the activities of their contributing parts. The function of a part is its contribution to the complex activity of the system that is under analysis. Proponents of the etiological theory have no objection to the idea that biologists give functional analyses of systems but contend that the systemic analysis, on its own, fails to naturalize the normativity of functions or to do so successfully (i.e. it fails to provide an adequate account of malfunctioning). Some who support a systemic theory argue that biology has no need for a naturalistic notion of malfunction (e.g., Davies 2001), while others argue that abnormal functioning is statistically atypical (Boorse 2002, Craver 2001, Lewens 2004).
It is usual to note that etiological (teleological) functions are distinct from the causal-role functions involved in what is standardly called “functionalism” in philosophy of mind. Causal-role functions are often defined as a select subset of a trait’s actual causal dispositions, and functionalism is often defined as the view that mental states are individuated or classified into types on the basis of such dispositions (see, e.g., Block 1986). If causal-role functions are a subset of dispositions actually possessed by token traits then they do not permit the possibility of an important kind of malfunctioning because a trait cannot have the causal-role function to Z and at the same time lack the disposition to Z.
That said, the distinction between functionalism and what might be termed “teleo-functionalism” is less stark than might be thought (cf. Neander 2017, 90). One reason is that formulations of classical functionalism often spoke of the characteristic or normal causal roles of mental states. Sometimes this was explicitly to allow for pathology (see, e.g., Lewis 1980). Another reason is that, although teleological functions are often said to be selected effects or effects for which traits were selected, such functions can also be described as selected dispositions or dispositions for which traits were selected (Neander 2017, 127–130; Hundertmark 2021). Both forms of functionalism also permit multiple physical realizability of traits that perform the same functions.
3. Teleosemantic Theories
What all teleological (or “teleosemantic”) theories of mental content have in common is the idea that psycho-semantic norms are ultimately derivable from functional norms. Beyond saying this, it is hard to give a neat definition of the group of theories that qualify.
An appeal to functional norms can be combined with a variety of other ideas about content-determination. For example, there can be both isomorphic and informational versions of teleosemantics. In the former case, the proposal might be that the relevant isomorphism is one that cognitive systems are supposed to exploit. In the latter case, the theory might say that mental content depends on the information carrying, storing or processing functions of mechanisms. (The relevant notion of information is variously defined but, roughly speaking, a type of state or event is said to carry information about some other state or event when it is caused by it or reliably co-occurs with it.
It is sometimes said that the role of functions in a teleological theory of content is to explain how error (misrepresentation) is possible, rather than to explain how content is determined (Millikan 2004, 63), but the two go hand in hand. To see this, it helps to start with the crude causal theory of content and to see how the problem of error arises for it. According to the crude causal theory, a mental representation R represents that an F is present if and only if Rs are always caused by an F’s being present. One problem with this simple proposal is its failure to provide for the possibility of misrepresentation, as Fodor (1987, 101–104) points out. To see the problem, consider a mundane case where Joan’s belief that there is a cat (which is usually caused by cats) is caused by a small fox. The crude causal theory does not permit this characterization of the situation because, if a small fox caused Joan’s belief, then belief states of this type cannot represent that a cat is present; instead, their content must be something like a cat or a small fox is present. In other words, as soon as the state of a small fox’s being present causes Joan’s belief, it is included in the truth-conditions of that (type of) belief and so, on this theory, there is no logical space for the possibility of error: all candidate errors are transformed into non-errors by their very occurrence. Note that the problem of making room for error can also be described as the problem of specifying the content of representations in such a way that error is possible. So explaining how content is determined and how the possibility of error are accommodated are not separate tasks.
The error problem is an aspect of what (after Fodor) is often called “the disjunction problem.” With respect to the crude causal theory, the name applies because the theory entails disjunctive contents when it should not. For example, it entails that Joan’s belief has (something like) the content a cat or a small fox is present in the case just considered.
Asking how to alter the crude causal theory to allow for error is one place to begin looking for a more adequate proposal. One approach would be to try to describe certain situations in which only the right causes can produce the representation in question and to maintain that the content of the representation is whatever can cause the representation in such situations. This is sometimes referred to as a “type 1 theory.” A type 1 theory distinguishes between two types of situations, ones in which only the right causes can cause a representation (“type 1 situations”) and ones in which other things can too (“type 2 situations”) (Fodor 1990b, 60). A type 1 theory says that the first type of situation is content-determining. A type 1 teleological theory might state, for example, that the content of a perceptual representation is whatever can cause it when the perceptual system is performing its proper function, or when conditions are optimal for the proper performance of its function. Not all teleological theories of content are type 1 theories, however. The theory described in the next section is arguably a variant of a type 1 theory but some of the theories described in later sections are not.
The following sub-sections describe some key differences among teleological theories. It is not possible to describe all extant theories but most major approaches are sketched, along with a brief review of some of their strengths and weaknesses. General objections to teleological theories are discussed later, in section 4.
3.1 Informational Teleoemantics
Stampe (1977) was one of the first philosophers in modern times to suggest a theory of content according to which content is a matter of reliable causes. Dretske’s book, Knowledge and the Flow of Information (1981) has also been very influential. The theory Dretske develops in that book relies primarily on the notion of information, but he later offers a theory of content that combines both informational and teleological elements (Dretske 1986, 1988, 1995). He begins with a notion of information-carrying, which he calls “indicating”, and suggests that a representation’s content is what it has the function to indicate.
Dretske (1981) provides the most careful analysis of the indication relation and he often refers back to it in his later work. However, this analysis adverts to background knowledge, which is clearly an intentional phenomenon, so it had to be modified in order to serve as a basis for Dretske’s theory of content. The modified analysis runs as follows: an event token of type R indicates that a state of affairs of type C obtains if and only if (i) C in fact obtains and (ii) the probability of C’s obtaining, given that R is instanced, is one (assuming that certain background or “channel conditions” hold).
Dretske points out that representation is not equivalent to indication. “R indicates C” entails “C obtains”, so “misindication” (or “misinformation”) is impossible. Misrepresentation, by contrast, is clearly possible. So Dretske (1986) suggests that representations are states that have the function of indicating. The starting idea is this: if something has the function of indicating something else then it is supposed to indicate it but, since items don’t always perform their functions, room for error has been made. (The analysis of functions Dretske relies on here appears to be an etiological analysis of; see e.g., Dretske 1995, 7.)
However, Dretske (1986) sees a problem with this starting idea. He illustrates the problem with the case of ocean-dwelling anaerobic bacteria that have tiny magnets (magnetosomes) that are attracted to magnetic north, which serve to direct the bacteria downwards into the relatively oxygen-free sediment on the ocean floor . Plausibly, the function of the magnetosomes is to direct the bacteria to anaerobic conditions. If we “fool” the bacteria by holding a bar magnet nearby and lead the bacteria upward to their death, this looks like a case of natural misrepresentation. We were, in Dretske’s words, looking for “nature’s way of making a mistake” and we seem to have found it. The problem, says Dretske, is that it is indeterminate how we should describe the function of the magnetosomes. We can plausibly say that they have the function of indicating the oxygen-free sediment. But we can also plausibly say that they have the function of indicating geo-magnetic or even local magnetic north. If we say the latter, no misrepresentation has occurred. So Dretske’s interim conclusion is that we cannot count this as an unambiguous case of error, on his theory as outlined so far.
A number of distinct problems for teleological theories go under the name of “the functional indeterminacy problem” (section 4.1) and the magnetosome example can be used to illustrate several of them. However, Dretske’s response to the indeterminacy problem that he raised suggests that his main concern was with what is now often called “the problem of distal content”. His problem, then, is this. Suppose that we have a simple system that has just one way of detecting the presence of some feature of the environment. We have just seen a case of this for the anaerobic bacteria have just one way of detecting anaerobic conditions (via the local magnetic field). In such a case, if an inner state indicates the distal feature (anaerobic conditions) it will also indicate the more proximal feature (local magnetic north). Moreover, if there was selection for indicating the distal feature, there will also have been selection for indicating the more proximal feature (since the inner state indicates the former by indicating the latter). Dretske further points out that, even if a creature has several routes by which it can detect a given distal feature (e.g., even if the bacteria can detect anaerobic conditions by means of light sensors as well) there would still be a disjunction of more proximal features that the representation could count as representing, since it could still count as having the function of indicating the disjunction of more proximal features (i.e., local magnetic north or reduced light).
While we might be perfectly willing to allow that the magnetosomes in anaerobic bacteria do not represent or misrepresent, the problem of distal content generalizes. When you see a chair across the room as a chair across the room, you represent it as a solid 3D object at a distance from you and not as a stream of light reflected from it or as a pattern of firings in your retinas. Otherwise you would not try to walk to the chair and sit on it. An informational theory of content must therefore explain how mental representations represent distal features of the world, as opposed to the more proximal items that carry information about those distal features to the representational systems.
Dretske (1986) therefore modifies his proposal and maintains that a creature that is capable of representing determinate content must be capable of learning any number of new epistemic routes to the same distal feature. In that case, he says, there is no closed disjunction of more proximal stimuli that the representation could count as representing. He speaks of conditioning in this context. The relevant representation is recruited by conditioning to indicate the distal feature rather than the disjunction of more proximal features, because there is no finite time-invariant disjunction of more proximal stimuli that it has the function of indicating. However, it is controversial whether the presence of such a learning mechanism would, in fact, solve the distality problem (for discussion, cf. Loewer 1987 and the exchange between Garson 2019b and Schulte 2022).
The claim that misrepresentation is impossible without learning anyway seems problematic, since it appears to preclude representations produced by innate input systems, such as innate sensory-perceptual systems. Some psychologists also claim that some core concepts are innate (e.g., see Carey 2009). Later, Dretske (1988) appears to drop his conditioning requirement as a general requirement for (determinate) content, although he still maintains that instrumental conditioning or other forms of learning are necessary for acquiring the kind of content that can explain behavior. This re-raises the question of how representations produced by innate input analyzers can have distal content.
In addition to the problem of distal content, Dretske’s account also faces a number of other difficulties. Some arise from his strict definition of information and the notion of “channel conditions” (Fodor 1990c), others from the notion of a function to indicate/to carry information (Millikan 2004, ch. 6).
Despite these problems, however, Dretske’s central insight seems important and appealing. It is plausible that sensory-perceptual systems have the function to produce representations that carry information and that this bears on their content. An alternative attempt to elaborate this insight is sketched later (section 3.4).
3.2 Biosemantics and Related Views
Ruth Millikan and David Papineau were the first to offer teleological theories of content that put a strong emphasis on how mental representations are used within a system. In this section, we will mainly focus on Millikan’s ‘biosemantics’, as her theory is often called, while Papineau’s account will be the subject of the next section. Millikan presents her view in great detail in her (1984) and develops it further in her (2004) and (2017, part II); compressed versions are provided in her (1989b) and (2009).
The core of Millikan’s biosemantics consists of two claims. The first is that all representations are, at bottom, messages sent from a producer to one or more consumers. In other words, representations always stand midway between (i) a producer system that is supposed to generate them and (ii) one or more consumer systems that are supposed to respond to them in specific ways. According to Millikan, these systems must be designed to cooperate with each other, either by natural selection or by a process of individual learning. (Note that Millikan’s terminology varies; in some of her writings, producers are described as ‘senders’, representations as ‘intentional icons’ or ‘intentional signs’, and consumers as ‘receivers’ or ‘interpreters’.)
Since Millikan aims to give a fully general account of representation, her theory applies not only to mental representations, but also to representational devices that are used for communication between individuals, such as animal signals, linguistic utterances, and even maps and graphs. In these cases, it is whole organisms that count as producers and consumers. One of Millikan’s standard examples is the splash signal that beavers use to warn their conspecifics: the producer of this representation is the beaver that splashes its tail on the water, and the consumers are nearby beavers that react to the signal by diving for cover.
The producers and consumers of mental representations, by contrast, are subsystems of an organism. In very simple cases, the producer is a particular sensory system, and the consumer a motor system. Consider the often-cited example of the frog that visually detects appropriately small, dark, moving objects, and responds to them by darting out its tongue. In this case, the frog’s visual system can be described as the producer, the internal signals produced by it as representations, and the ‘prey-catching system’, i.e. the collection of motor mechanisms that reacts to these signals by generating the tongue-darting response, as the consumer.
The second core claim of Millikan’s theory, in a nutshell, is this: every representation belongs to a set of interrelated representations, and the representations of this set must correspond to certain other (usually external) states in a systematic way to enable the consumer to perform its proper functions. Or, to put it differently, (i) every representation R that is sent by a producer P to a consumer C belongs to a set of interrelated representations that P can send to C, and (ii) each representation of this set, if it is tokened, must ‘map onto’ (correspond to) a particular state of affairs in order for C to function properly (Millikan 1984, 96–102; 1989b, 283–290; and 2004, 71–86). The particular state that a representation must map onto is, of course, the represented state of affairs, the content of this representation. (Note that, strictly speaking, this formulation of Millikan’s second claim only covers descriptive/‘belief-like’ representations; Millikan’s theory of directive/‘desire-like’ representations and her account of ‘pushmi-pullyu representations’, i.e. of representations that are at once descriptive and directive, will be omitted here. For details on directive representations, cf. Millikan 1984, 96–102 and 2004, 191–201; for pushmi-pullyu representations, cf. Millikan 1995.)
To unpack the second claim, let us return to the beaver splash example. According to Millikan, a particular splash, produced by a beaver in location l at time t, is really a complex signal, consisting of the splash, the time and the location. Looking at the splash signal in this way, we can see that it belongs to a large set of interrelated signals consisting of the (same type of) splash in combination with many different times and locations. Moreover, since the consumers in this case are beavers that (typically) react to the signals by diving for cover, it is clear that there is indeed a systematic correspondence relation that must obtain between the splash signals and certain states in the world in order for the consumers’ behavior to fulfill a biological function. To put it briefly, signals of the form splash at location l and time t must correspond to states of the form danger at location l and time t: if this correspondence relation obtains, the consumer beavers (often) escape from danger by diving for cover; if it is does not obtain, they merely waste valuable energy. (This systematic correspondence relationship is described as a ‘mapping rule’, a ‘mapping function’, or a ‘semantic mapping’ by Millikan.)
There are two respects, however, in which our initial formulation of the second claim needs to be refined. First, we should note that in most cases, a correspondence between representation and represented state of affairs is not strictly necessary to enable the consumer to perform its proper functions; it is only necessary if the consumer is to perform its proper functions “in the Normal way”. By this expression, Millikan refers to the way in which the consumer’s functions have generally been performed on those occasions that were crucial for the proliferation or preservation of this (kind of) consumer (Millikan 1984, 100; 1989b, 286–287). Hence, to identify the mapping that determines the contents for a given set of representations R1, …, Rn, we need to (i) look at those past occasions where ancestral consumers of the relevant kind made the type of fitness contributions that led to the proliferation or preservation of consumers of this kind, and (ii) ask which correspondence relationships between R1, …, Rn and other states of affairs obtained in these situations that help to explain how the consumers were able to make these contributions. In the case of the beaver splashes, e.g., we must look at past occasions where the ancestors of today’s beavers responded to splash signals in a way that made a crucial contribution to their fitness (which, we may assume, are situations where they responded by diving for cover), and ask which correspondence relationships between the signals and other states of affairs help to explain these fitness contributions. Presumably, these are precisely those correspondence relationships between signals and danger that we have identified above.
To incorporate this point into our formulation of Millikan’s second claim, we can restate it thus: (i) every representation that is sent by a producer P to a consumer C belongs to a set of interrelated representations that P can send to C, and (ii) it is a Normal condition for C’s performance of its proper functions that representations of this set map onto certain other states in a systematic way, i.e. according to a particular ‘mapping rule’.
Another respect in which Millikan’s second core claim needs to be refined concerns the mapping rule that relates representations to their contents. Millikan describes this relationship as an “isomorphism” or “homomorphism” obtaining between the set of representations on the one hand and the set of represented states of affairs on the other (Millikan 2004, ch. 6; 2013b; 2020). The general idea is this: the mapping rule assigns to every representation (of the relevant set) a represented state of affairs, and does so in such a manner that transformation relations between representations correspond to transformation relations between represented states affairs. This condition is fulfilled in a straightforward way in the beaver splash example, where transformations of a splash signal that consist in the substitution of a particular time t* (for t) or location l* (for l) correspond to transformations that consist in the substitution of the very same time t* (for t) or location l* (for l) at the level of the represented state of affairs. But it can also be fulfilled in more interesting ways, e.g. by a set of sentences where the substitution of one name for another (“Ginger” for “Fred”) corresponds to the substitution of one object for another (Ginger for Fred) at the level of the represented states of affairs. (For an in-depth discussion of this aspect of Millikan’s theory, cf. Shea 2013.)
Importantly, Millikan’s second core claim is a fully general thesis, and is thus intended to apply to systems of representations that are more complex than the system of beaver splash signals. Take one of Millikan’s favorite examples, the waggle dance of the honey bee. Different waggle dances do not only vary with respect to the time and place of their performance, as beaver splashes do, but also with respect to the length and direction of the ‘waggle run’. Furthermore, variations of the latter kind make a significant difference to the responses of the consumer bees: the length and direction of their subsequent flights in search of food Normally depends on the length and direction of the waggle run. Hence, we get a more complex mapping rule that takes us from dances with different waggle run lengths and directions (performed in location l at time t) to states of the form nectar source located in direction r at distance d (relative to location l, at time t). This is the rule that specifies the correspondence relations that must obtain between dances and nectar positions for the consumer bees’ behavior to fulfill its biological functions (in the Normal way).
One aspect of Millikan’s theory that has received much attention in the literature is the fact that it entails, at least in certain cases, content ascriptions of a distinctive kind. This is well illustrated by the frog example. Let us suppose, for the sake of simplicity, that the frog’s sensory-perceptual representation belongs to a set of representations that only vary with respect to the time and place of their occurrence, and let us call this the system of ‘R-representations’. To find out what the content of the R-representations is, according to Millikan, we must first identify the proper function(s) of the frog’s prey-catching system (the consumer of the R-representations). Plausibly, the prey-catching system has the function of providing the frog with food, since there can be no doubt that the procurement of food was the fitness-enhancing effect that ancestral prey-catching systems (in ancestral frogs) had on former occasions that led to the proliferation and preservation of such systems. In a second step, we have to figure out what the correspondence relation is that has to obtain between the R-representations and the world if the prey-catching system is to perform its food-providing function in the Normal way (i.e. in the way that the ancestral systems did it). The answer is, quite obviously, that the correspondence relation has to obtain between R-representations and the presence of frog food. Hence, an R-representation occurring in location l at time t has the content there is frog food present in l at t, rather than (say) there is a fly in l at t or there is a small, dark, moving object in l at t (cf. Millikan 1991, 163). (This point will be discussed further in section 4.1.)
The central role that the representation consumer plays in this story has led many interpreters to describe Millikan’s theory as a ‘consumer theory’ or an ‘output-oriented version’ of teleosemantics (see, e.g., Jacob 2000; Neander 2004; Shea 2007). According to this interpretation, Millikan maintains that the representation producer, while necessary for an item’s representational status, plays no role in determining its content, which depends exclusively on the functional nature of the relevant consumer. While there are many passages in Millikan’s earlier writings that do indeed suggest such a view (cf. Millikan 1984, ch. 6, and especially Millikan 1989b), it should be noted that Millikan herself rejects this interpretation. Moreover, it is clear that Millikan puts greater emphasis on the ‘input-side’ of representational mechanisms in her more recent work, and often stresses the complementary roles of producers and consumers. In her (2017), for instance, she goes to some lengths to argue that representations which are Normally produced always carry natural information about their contents (where ‘natural information’ is understood in a non-Dretskean way), and in other writings, she even maintains that informational considerations of this kind can be employed to answer certain recalcitrant objections to her theory (as we will see below). This may suggest that Millikan’s original account, summarized above, must be supplemented with a claim about natural information, but whether this is indeed the case is an issue that cannot be resolved here.
Some argue that Millikan’s theory has advantages in comparison with Dretske’s indicator semantics (see e.g., Godfrey-Smith 1989 and Millikan 2004). On Millikan’s theory, a representation R can represent that some environmental feature F is present even if it was never the case that the presence of an R guaranteed the presence of an F. It suffices, on her theory, that Rs mapped onto Fs often enough for the representation’s consumers to have (so to speak) benefited from that mapping. Hence, there is no need to provide independently specifiable “channel conditions” for the mapping relation.
It can also be argued that Millikan has solved the problem of distal content for innate as well as learned concepts. Neither retinal images nor light reflected from prey feed a frog. So it can be argued, in the case of the frog’s perceptual representations, that the Normal condition for the proper functioning of its consumer (the prey-catching mechanism) is that the representation maps onto frog food, not that it maps onto light reflected from the prey, or onto retinal images.
One objection that can be raised against Millikan’s theory has to do with omnipresent beneficial background conditions. The prima facie worry is whether her theory succeeds in ruling them out as contents of ordinary perceptual representations. To stay with the same example, consider that other things besides frog food were required for a contribution to fitness on past occasions when the frog’s perceptual representation was used by the prey-catching system (e.g., oxygen and gravity). Does her theory entail that the frog’s perceptual representation has, in addition to the content there is frog food, contents like the oxygen concentration is above 18% or the local value of gravity is close to g? According to several interpreters, Millikan can easily avoid this consequence. She can admit that there are many conditions that the frog’s representational state (state R, for short) must correspond to if the prey-catching system is to fulfill its functions, but insist that it is only those conditions that are specific to R (i.e. that are not required, and do not Normally obtain, when R is absent) that constitute R’s content (Shea 2005, 40; Bergman 2021, 3–4). This would rule out conditions involving the oxygen concentration or the value of gravity. (Interestingly, Millikan herself seems to favor a different answer to the problem, one that mirrors her reply to the next objection; cf. Millikan 1993, 127.)
Another objection to Millikan’s theory is it yields content ascriptions that are overly specific, and thus implausible. Consider the fact that all sorts of circumstances could prevent a contribution to fitness: for example, an infected fly or a crow standing nearby could spell disease or death instead of nutrition for the frog (Hall, 1990). On this basis, Neander (1995) argues that Millikan’s theory has the unintended consequence that the frog’s representation has the content food that is not infected, when no crow is standing by … , etc. Millikan’s reply to this objection (cf. Millikan 2004, 85–86; 2009, 404) can be summarized as follows: the frog’s representation could only have this highly specific content if the representation’s producer, the frog’s visual system, had the function of producing states that mapped onto such a highly specific state. This, in turn, would only be possible if the visual system were sensitive to proximal states that carried the information that there is food that is not infected, not in the vicinity of a crow, etc. According to Millikan, however, there are no such proximal states, so the objection fails (for a critical rejoinder, cf. Martínez 2013a, 437–441). How this response relates to Millikan’s canonical statements of her position (e.g., in Millikan 1984, 1989b), and whether it indicates a departure from her original view, are questions that naturally arise at this point, but they will not be pursued further here.
Pietroski (1992) also argues that Millikan’s theory provides implausible content ascriptions, thereby entailing implausible intentional explanations. His tale of the kimu is intended to press the point. The kimu are color-blind creatures, until a mutation arises which results in a mechanism that produces a brain state, B, in response to red. Those who inherit this mechanism enjoy being in state B, which leads them to climb to the top of the nearest hill every morning (to see the rising sun or some red flowers). The result is that they avoid the dawn-marauding predators, the snorf, who hunt in the valley below and, solely as a result of this, there is selection for the mutation. As Pietroski wants to describe the case, Bs have the content there is red (or there is something red), and the desires that interact with Bs are desires to see something red. The point of the story is that Millikan’s theory does not allow us to characterize the kimu in this way. On her theory, the kimu do not see a visual target as red or desire the sight of something red, given that it was not the mapping between Bs and red but between Bs and snorf-free-space that was crucial for the fitness of the kimu (and so for the selection of any relevant consumers of the representation). On Millikan’s theory, Bs mean snorf-free-space and there is no representation of red in a kimu’s brain.
Pietroski argues that biting the bullet is radically revisionist in this case. Behavioral tests, he says, could support his claim. Plant a red flag among a crowd of snorf and the kimu will eagerly join them. It is consistent with his story that contemporary kimu might never have seen a snorf and might be unable to recognise one were it stood smack in front of their faces. Intuitively, the kimu do not represent snorf, or the absence of snorf, in any way, according to Pietroski. He suggests that this might be a problem for all teleological theories of content. However, it is more specifically an objection to biosemantics and closely related views (some other teleological theories of content imply that the kimu do represent red, see section 3.4).
Millikan (2000, 236) agrees that her theory entails that the kimu’s B-states represent fewer snorf this way. She argues that we need to distinguish between the properties represented and the properties that cause representations. How else, she asks, could a tortoise think chow this way, given that being nutritious is an invisible property and so could not cause a sensory-perceptual representation? Setting aside what a tortoise really thinks, the worry is how a causal theory of content can allow for the representation of that which lies behind the surface features of objects.
Price (2001) offers a detailed teleological theory that is similar to Millikan’s. She defends Millikan’s interpretation of the mind of the kimu on the ground that it better explains their behavior (Price 2001, 113–115). She endorses the idea that the point of making content ascriptions is to rationalize behavior (as proposed, e.g., by Davidson 1984 and Dennett 1987), and her claim is that a desire to avoid snorf is a better reason to climb to the top of the hill than a desire to see red. Different responses are possible. First, one could argue that a desire to see red is reason enough to climb a hill. Secondly, one could also question whether it is the role of content ascriptions to rationalize behavior, or whether this is the crucial role in the context in question.
In relation to this last point, one can ask more generally if some content ascriptions are suitable for some theoretical purposes and others for others. One might agree that folk psychological ascriptions of intentional mental states are meant to rationalize behavior but question whether this is their role in cognitive science. In the latter case, the aim is to explain the psychological capacities of humans and (in the case of cognitive neuroethology) other creatures. Thus a question to ask is what content ascriptions would serve the explanatory purposes of the mind and brain sciences, rather than our folk psychological intuitions. Neander (2006) and Schulte (2012) argue that Millikan’s biosemantics generates the wrong contents for mainstream (information-processing) theories of perception in relation to the simple system cases discussed in the philosophy literature. A principle of such mainstream theories is that, in vision, the ‘deeper’ properties of objects that are directly relevant for biological fitness are only represented after the surface features of objects are first represented (see, e.g., Palmer 1999). The worry is that biosemantics and related theories entail that, at least in certain cases, it is only the ‘deeper’, beneficial properties that are represented in perception.
To a large extent, Millikan’s theory has been responsible for the great interest, both positive and negative, that philosophers have shown in this general class of theories. Her writings on the topic are extensive and this section has only touched on the basics of her view.
3.3 Desire-First Theories
David Papineau’s theory also emphasizes the ‘use’ of representations in the production of behavioral output, but does so in a different way than Millikan’s account. In a first step, Papineau (1984, 1987, 1993, 1998) identifies a desire’s content with the effect it is supposed to produce; then, in a second step, he provides an account of belief content in terms of desire content. Hence, his theory can aptly be described as a ‘desire-first’ version of teleosemantics.
In a bit more detail, the theory runs as follows. According to Papineau, a desire’s satisfaction condition is “that effect which it is the desire’s biological purpose to produce” (1993, 58–59), by which he means that “[s]ome past selection mechanism has favored that desire – or, more precisely, the ability to form that type of desire – in virtue of that desire producing that effect” (1993, 59). So our desires have the function of bringing about certain conditions – either conditions that enhanced the fitness of our ancestors in the distant past (if the selection mechanism in question was natural selection) or conditions that constituted a reward for us in the recent past (if the selection mechanism was a mechanism of individual learning). These conditions are the satisfaction conditions of our desires or, in other words, their contents.
The truth condition of a belief, Papineau tells us, can (roughly) be equated with “that condition which guarantees that actions based on that belief will satisfy the desires it is acting in concert with” (1993, 70). Suppose that I have the desire to get food (which is, on Papineau’s view, a desire with the function of bringing it about that I get food), and this desire collaborates with a certain belief B to cause me to go and look in the fridge. On Papineau’s view, it seems that we can say that B has the content that there is food in the fridge, because there being food in the fridge is the condition that guarantees that my desire to get food will be satisfied by the action I am performing.
Both parts of Papineau’s theory have been criticized. Against his account of desire content, critics have raised two main types of objections. First, they have proposed straightforward counterexamples to the account: cases where a desire has p as a satisfaction condition, but where it seems that the desire cannot possibly have the function of bringing it about that p (Enç 1994; Loewer 1997, 116–117). These counterexamples include entirely novel desires, like John’s desire to bury his broken iPhone 12 under a Magnolia tree, which lack a selectional history and thus, prima facie, a function. They also include desires directed at actions that have never been fitness-enhancing or rewarding, like the desire to commit suicide, and desires that cannot contribute to their own satisfaction, like the desire for sunny weather or the desire to change the past.
In reply to this line of criticism, Papineau could appeal to the compositionality of desires (in the way that he appeals, in the case of a closely related problem, to the compositionality of beliefs; cf. Papineau 1993, 75 and 82–83). In short, he could argue that once some basic desires and beliefs have content, the concepts that are the constituents of these attitudes acquire contents as well (in virtue of the role they play within these attitudes), and these concepts can then be recombined to produce further desires which may be entirely novel, incapable of contributing to their own satisfaction, or directed at actions that are neither fitness-enhancing nor rewarding. However, this solution would have to be spelled out in detail in order to be fully convincing.
A second line of objection against Papineau’s account of desires is that it leaves desire content highly indeterminate. My desire for food, for instance, usually gives rise to a whole chain of events: the occurrence of certain bodily movements, the ingestion of food, the uptake of nutrients and, ultimately, the enhancement of my biological fitness. Arguably, all of these events could be characterized as “effects which it is the desire’s biological purpose to produce”, so it may seem that the theory does not assign a unique content to my desire. In a later paper, Papineau (1998, 9) attempts to solve this problem by saying that a desire’s content is determined by its “specific function”, where the specific function of a trait is ‘‘the immediate effect it produces at the lowest level of description where it appears as an unanalysed component in the functional analysis’’ (Papineau 1998, 4; our emphasis). This move rules out contents like I induce the uptake of nutrients or I enhance my biological fitness (for the desire that is, ex hypothesi, a desire for food), but it is controversial whether it succeeds in fully resolving the indeterminacy problem (cf. Schulte 2019, 164–168).
Papineau’s account of belief content, which is adapted from the ‘success semantics’ of Frank Ramsey (1927) and J.T. Whyte (1990), also faces some problems. The first problem is that none of the actions we ordinarily perform are based on a single belief. If I go to the fridge to look for food, my action is not only based on the belief that there is food in the fridge, but also on my belief about the location of the fridge in my apartment, about my own current position, about my physical abilities, and so on. Papineau (1993, 73) recognizes this problem and proposes the following solution: his initial formula should be applied to sets of beliefs on which actions are based, and the truth-conditions of a single belief should then be identified by comparing the collective truth-conditions of different sets which contain that belief as a member. Even if this solution works, however, a second problem remains: the truth of all the beliefs on which my action is based still does not guarantee that my action will be successful, not only because (for all we know) the laws governing our universe are indeterministic, but also because my success requires that a number of background conditions hold (conditions involving gravity, the concentration of oxygen, etc.), about which I may have no beliefs at all (Perry 1993). This suggests that Papineau’s account of belief content must be modified further, but it is unclear how this should be done (for two different proposals, cf. Blackburn 2005 and Nanay 2013).
Finally, we should note that there is one respect in which Papineau’s view has changed somewhat in recent years. In his earlier writings, Papineau focuses on organisms with a belief-desire psychology and is doubtful whether we can attribute determinate contents to creatures with simpler mechanisms of behavior control (see, e.g., Papineau 1998, 5). In his most recent paper on the topic, however, Papineau (2016) proposes a new general account of content that also applies to those simpler creatures. According to this account, a representation R is always part of a producer-consumer system S, and the content of R is the condition p that ensures that the behavior generated by the consumer in response to R fulfills the specific function of S (Papineau 2016, 100). For organisms that possess beliefs and desires, the desire-first account sketched above still applies, but as a special case of the more general producer-consumer theory.
3.4 Causal-Informational Theories
The problems faced by use-oriented theories like Millikan’s and Papineau’s have led some theorists to reconsider the informational approach originally pioneered by Stampe and Dretske (section 3.1). One new theory that stands in this tradition is Karen Neander’s (2013, 2017) causal-informational theory of content.
Neander’s starting point is the notion of a response function (Neander 2013; 2017, ch. 6). She claims that sensory-perceptual systems have such response functions, where to ‘respond’ to something is to be caused by it to do something else. For example, a visual system might be caused by a red instantiation to change into a RED state, and it might have been selected (in part) for being disposed to do so. This means, according to Neander, that the system has the function to respond to red instances by changing into a RED state.
On Neander’s view, the resulting states (like, e.g., RED) are representations of the causes to which the system is supposed to respond by producing these states. They are, so to speak, representations of their ‘Normal causes’. On this view, RED has the content red is present if the visual system that produces RED has the function to produce it in response to the presence of red, or more specifically in response to red being instanced in the receptive field of the perceptual processing pathways responsible for RED’s production. Since ‘information’ is defined in causal terms by Neander, she can also state her view by saying that RED has the content red is present because it is supposed to carry the information that red is present (Neander 2017, 146). This is Neander’s basic idea, though two further requirements are added. One is a second-order similarity requirement (Neander 2017, ch. 8) that we will set aside here.
The other is a requirement that is designed to solve the problem of distal content, i.e. to exclude states that are too proximal (the Prox-Cs, for short) from the contents of sensory representations. With the addition of this requirement, Neander’s analysis looks as follows:
A sensory-perceptual representation, R, in a sensory-perceptual system S, has the descriptive content C is present and not Prox-C is present if:
- S was selected for producing Rs in response to Cs and,
- if S was selected for producing Rs in response to both Cs and Prox-Cs, it was selected for producing Rs in response to Prox-Cs because this was a means to its producing Rs in response to Cs and not vice-versa (cf. Neander 2013, 34; 2017, 222).
Note first that clause (1) on its own does not determine suitably distal content because there is a causal chain leading from C to R and, if the system had been selected for responding to Cs by producing Rs, it must also have been selected for responding to the proximal items (the Prox-Cs) in the causal chain (such as the light reflected from Cs toward the retina of the eye, in the case of visual perception). There is, however, an asymmetry, to which clause (2) appeals. The system was selected for its disposition to respond to the proximal items because by that means it responded to the more distal items, but the system was not selected for responding to the more distal item because by that means it responded to the more proximal items. This is why C, rather than one of the Prox-Cs, qualifies as the content of R.
Clause (1), which articulates the basic idea of Neander’s approach, ensures different content ascriptions to those generated by biosemantics and other ‘use-oriented’ theories. For example, consider again the notorious case of the frog. Plausibly, the relevant visual pathways in the frog’s brain were selected for their disposition to be caused by a certain configuration of visible features (roughly, something’s being small, dark and moving) to produce the sensory-perceptual representation in question, as well as for their disposition to initiate orienting and so on thereby. They were plausibly selected for this preferential response to the configuration of visible features because things with these features were often enough nutritious for the frog. The visual pathways in the frog were not selected for a disposition to respond to the nutritional value of a stimulus, however. For the normal frog’s visual system has no causal sensitivity to the nutritional value of the stimulus and cannot have been selected for a causal sensitivity it did not have. So, on this proposal, the visual content of the representation is there’s something small, dark, moving (or something along these lines) rather than there’s frog food. (For analogous reasons, Pietroski’s kimus are characterized as representing the presence of red, not the absence of snorf; cf. the discussion in section 3.2.)
According to Neander (2006) the configuration of visible features is the right style of visual content to ascribe for the purpose of mainstream scientific explanations of an anuran’s visual capacities (see also Neander 2017, ch. 5). Nor does this proposal seem to generate overly specific contents of the kind mentioned earlier in relation to Millikan’s biosemantics. On Neander’s theory, the frog does not represent the stimulus as not carrying an infectious disease, even if only those small, dark and moving things that were not carrying an infectious disease contributed to frog fitness when the frog was fed. Sensory-perceptual systems can only have been selected for causal dispositions which past systems of the type possessed. Since past systems had no disposition to respond preferentially to the absence of an infectious disease in visual stimuli that were small, dark and moving, the fact that contributions to fitness were made only on those occasions when an infectious disease was absent is, again, a background evolutionary fact that is not content-constitutive on this proposal.
One possible concern is whether sufficient room for misrepresentation has been made. Some early discussions of teleological theories of content assumed that the content of the frog’s representation must be there’s frog food or there’s a fly or else misrepresentation would be impossible. On Neander’s view, the frog would not be in error when it snapped at something small, dark and moving that was not frog food, or not a fly. However, misrepresentation is possible on this proposal. A representation that is supposed to be produced in response to something that is small, dark and moving and is instead produced in response to something large and looming would count as misrepresenting and a neurologically damaged frog (e.g., one with a damaged thalamus) will indeed attempt to catch all sorts of inappropriate things (e.g., an experimenter’s hand or even the frog’s own limbs). Neander’s theory also entails that a kimu’s B-state will misrepresent if it is tokened in response to anything that is not red. More importantly, perhaps, it seems to entail that human REDs will misrepresent if tokened in response to something not-red, as could happen in color contrast illusions or in unusual viewing conditions.
As Millikan (2013a) and others have pointed out, there are representations that cannot be caused by their contents, such as TOMORROW. No tomorrow has ever caused a thought about tomorrow. However, TOMORROW is not a sensory-perceptual representation and so this is not an objection to Neander’s proposal per se. As with other modest theories, however, the challenge is explaining how to link this modest theory for some mental contents to a more comprehensive theory that accounts for all of the contents of all of our concepts (see also section 4.4).
Neander’s theory has been the focus of much discussion in recent years. A number of critics have taken issue with Neander’s solution to the distality problem. Price (2014) and Artiga (2015) question whether the ‘distality principle’ (i.e. the second clause of the analysis presented above) is really consistent with Neander’s basic idea. Schulte (2018, 2022) defends the consistency of Neander’s view, but argues that it yields problematic content ascriptions in certain hypothetical cases and, arguably, also in actual cases (e.g. cases of olfactory perception). He then develops a modified version of the causal-informational theory that is supposed to avoid these consequences.
Another aspect of Neander’s theory that has been criticized is her causal requirement: the claim that properties can only enter into the content of a sensory-perceptual representation R if they are causally relevant for bringing it about that R is tokened. Green (2017) argues that this requirement, as spelled out by Neander (2017, 270–271), has the counterintuitive consequence that visual representations that appear to represent an object as moving through adjacent regions of space (‘something moves from region 1 to region 2 to …’) actually represent the successive occurrence of object presences in those regions (‘something is in region 1, then something is in region 2, then …’). Ganson (2021a) also takes issue with the causal requirement. He contends that Neander cannot accommodate distance representations that are generated on the basis of visual cues that are statistically, but not causally related to the distance of perceived objects.
Whether Neander’s theory or some other version of causal-informational teleosemantics can overcome these problems will be a matter for future discussion.
3.5 Other Views
Recent years have seen a considerable revival of the naturalistic program in general, and teleosemantics in particular. In addition to new work by Millikan, Neander and Papineau, there have been a number of significant contributions by other authors as well. Some of these are presented in this section; others, which are more closely concerned with particular problems for the teleosemantic approach, will be discussed in section 4.
Among the new approaches, one of the most influential is Nicholas Shea’s “varitel semantics”, which is carefully worked out in his (2018). Although this theory stands firmly in the tradition of Millikan and Papineau, it has a number of novel and distinctive features. According to Shea, representational systems are characterized by three features, which are usually found together in nature, and which have to do with the production of ‘outcomes’ (i.e. movements, actions, or the consequences of actions). More specifically, the outcomes produced by representational systems are (i) “robust”, (ii) “stabilized”, and (iii) they are being brought about by mechanisms “in which internal components stand in exploitable relations to relevant features of the environment” (Shea 2018, 51). Let us look at these three characteristics in turn.
First, the production of an outcome F is supposed to be robust. In Shea’s terminology, this means that F is produced (a) “in response to a range of different inputs” and (b) “in a range of different relevant external conditions” (Shea 2018, 55). Depending on the ranges in question, the production of F can be described as more or less robust. Of particular importance is clause (a) of the definition, since it is demanding enough to exclude certain outcomes completely. If, for example, a plant closes its flowers only in response to a change in temperature, then the flower-closing behavior does not qualify as a robust outcome. However, if the plant also closes its flowers in response to some other input, e.g. a change in light levels, then the behavior does count as (minimally) robust (Shea 2018, 213–214).
Secondly, the production of outcome F by system S is supposed to have been stabilized by a process of natural selection, a process of individual learning, or by having contributed to the survival of S. In other words, F must be an etiological function of S, although it should be noted that Shea expands the processes that can ground such functions by including past contributions to survival in addition to natural selection and learning. (Furthermore, Shea allows that representational systems may have design functions instead of stabilized functions, so stabilization is not strictly necessary for representation; cf. Shea 2018, 64–65.)
Thirdly, the production of outcome F by system S must involve a mechanism with internal components (vehicles) that stand in exploitable relations to environmental features. In many cases, the exploitable relations in question are informational: the mechanism’s internal components carry correlational information about the presence of certain features in the environment (Shea 2018, ch. 4). In other cases, the exploitable relations are relations of structural correspondence: the mechanism’s internal components stand in relations to each other that ‘mirror’ relations between entities in the external world (Shea 2018, ch. 5). Furthermore, there may still be other types of exploitable relations. This pluralism about the relations that are constitutive of representational content is one of the reasons why Shea names his approach “varitel semantics” (Shea 2018, 43).
One respect in which Shea’s approach is very attractive is the fact that he pays close attention to the explanatory role of representations, and offers a detailed argument for the claim that his theory can account for the “explanatory purchase” of representational properties (Shea 2018, ch. 8). Another potential advantage is the fact that Shea does not rely on the producer-consumer model that has long dominated in the teleosemantics literature, and instead adopts a more flexible framework that allows for highly interconnected representational systems that cannot be cleanly separated into subsystems (Shea 2018, 19).
However, there also several respects in which the theory may appear problematic. Some critics object that Shea’s way of drawing the distinction between representational and non-representational systems is unconvincing, either because his requirements for representational status are too weak (Rescorla 2021, Kracauer 2022), or because the distinction is not significant from an explanatory point of view (Ganson 2021b, 287). Other theorists have criticized Shea’s claims about the explananda (Rupert 2022) and the utility (Egan 2020) of representational explanations. (For replies to some of these objections, cf. Shea 2020 and 2022.) Finally, given that Shea’s account of content determination resembles those of Millikan and Papineau, one may wonder whether some of their problems (especially the problem of overly specific contents) are also problems for Shea.
There is another family of views that has gained some prominence in recent years, and that should be discussed in this section. What distinguishes these views from standard teleosemantic theories is the fact that they combine a teleological theory of content with a non-etiological account of function (Schroeder 2004; Nanay 2014; Bauer 2017; Piccinini 2020a).
Nanay’s (2014) proposal, for instance, combines a broadly Dretskean version of informational teleosemantics with Nanay’s own modal theory of functions (Nanay 2010). Like Dretske, Nanay maintains that representing something consists in “having the function to indicate (carry information about)” it (Nanay 2014, 799). However, it should be noted that he restricts this account to “pragmatic representations”, which are defined as the representations that are most directly involved in the guidance of actions (Nanay 2014, 805). His account of content can thus be summarized as follows: for any pragmatic representation R, R represents that p iff R has the function of indicating (carrying the information) that p. This account of content is then combined with Nanay’s modal theory of functions which says, roughly speaking, that a (token) trait of an organism has the function to do X if doing X would contribute to the organism’s fitness. Accordingly, a rough formulation of Nanay’s theory says that a pragmatic representation R of an organism O represents that p iff R’s indicating (carrying the information) that p would contribute to O’s fitness (Nanay 2014, 804).
The main advantage of Nanay’s proposal is that it is a thoroughly non-historical account of content. As such, it avoids the difficulties of standard teleosemantic accounts that arise from the assumption that content properties are determined by selectional history, like the Swampman problem (section 4.2), or problems concerning our epistemic access to content properties. On the other hand, the modal theory of function that serves as the basis for Nanay’s account has been heavily criticized (Artiga 2014, Garson 2019c), and there are also some more specific objections to his treatment of representational content (cf. Bauer 2017; Hundertmark 2018, 156–170).
A different non-etiological version of teleosemantics has recently been developed by Piccinini (2020a, 2020b). Piccinini (2020a) also starts with a version of informational teleosemantics, restricted to sensory representations. Simplifying a bit, his account says that a sensory representation R has the content <p> if (i) R’s producer has the function of generating R so that R carries the information that p, and (ii) R can guide the agent’s behavior with respect to the fact that p (Piccinini 2020a, 263). (This account is extended to other types of representation in Piccinini 2020b.) In a further step, Piccinini combines his teleological analysis of content with a so-called goal-contribution theory of function (Piccinini 2020a, ch. 3; Maley & Piccinini 2017). This theory construes biological functions as regular contributions to the (objective) biological goals of an organism, where these goals include survival, development, reproduction and helping others (especially offspring and relatives).
This theory of function is not completely ahistorical, since the population relevant for determining whether a trait makes a regular contribution to fitness may extend into the past (Maley & Piccinini 2017, 245, fn 10), but it does make functions much less dependent on historical facts than they are on etiological accounts. This fact may be used to argue that Piccinini’s account has advantages over standard teleosemantic theories when it comes to problems concerning our epistemic access to contents. But whether this is the case, and whether the theory can avoid the difficulties that plague other non-etiological versions of teleosemantics, is a topic for future discussions.
4. Problems for Teleosemantics
The preceding survey of teleological theories of content does not mention all of the extant teleological theories but it illustrates some of the commonalities and differences among them. Now we turn to some objections that have been raised against the general idea of teleosemantics. This section looks at the objections that have been most influential. Some have already been touched on in previous sections.
4.1 Functional Indeterminacy
There are several potential indeterminacy problems (for a survey, cf. Neander 2017, ch. 7). In addition to the problem of distal content, which has already been discussed above two other indeterminacy problems are especially prominent.
The first, raised by Fodor (1990b), is the problem of locally co-instantiated properties. Fodor’s example is the familiar case of the frog that snaps at anything that is suitably small, dark and moving and thereby feeds itself (see section 3.2). For the sake of the argument, Fodor makes the (unrealistic) assumption that the property of being small, dark and moving and the property of being a fly are always co-instantiated in the frog’s environment, such that all flies are small, dark, moving things, and vice versa. According to Fodor, if it was adaptive for the frog to snap at flies then it was equally adaptive for it to snap at small, dark, moving things. Hence, when we look at the frog’s detection device, we can equally well say that the function of the device is to detect flies and that its function is to detect small, dark, moving things. So, if we try to determine the content of the representation by reference to the function of the detection mechanism, the content remains indeterminate. We can choose to describe the function one way or another but if the content depends on how we choose to describe the function it is not a naturalized content. Note that the candidate contents there’s a fly and there’s frog food and there’s a small, dark moving thing each license different assessments concerning misrepresentation. If the frog is representing the stimulus as a fly, for instance, it will misrepresent a small, dark, moving non-fly as a fly. If it represents the stimulus as a small, dark, moving thing, this will not be the case.
The second prominent indeterminacy problem is the problem of properties mutually implicated in selection. It stems from the fact that traits are selected for complex causal roles. Consider, for example, an antelope population where an altered hemoglobin shape was selected for because it (i) increased oxygen uptake, (ii) which allowed the antelopes to move to higher ground, (iii) which gave them access to richer pasture in summer, (iv) and so improved their nutritional status, their immunity to disease, their vigor in avoiding predation, their attraction to mates and (v) their chances of survival and reproduction (Neander 1995). To determine the function of a trait, such as the altered shape of the hemoglobin, the etiological theory of functions tells us to ask, “what did past instances do that was adaptive and that caused traits of that type to be selected?”. In this case, the answer is (i) through (v). The altered shape of the hemoglobin did all of this, and all of this was adaptive, and all of this contributed to the selection of the trait (i.e., it was selected for all of this). So all of this would seem to be the trait’s function. Its function is the complex causal role for which it was selected.
The problem for content can be seen when we consider mechanisms that produce or consume representations. For instance, the frog’s detection device was selected because it (a) responded to small, dark, moving things and (b) that helped the frog catch these things, and (c) that provided the frog with nutrients and (d) that contributed to the frog’s chances of survival and reproduction in various ways. Thus ancestral detection devices contributed to the selection of that type of device by way of a complex causal route in which the visible configuration of the stimulus and the nutritional properties of the stimulus both play a role. Note that this does not depend on these features of the environment being locally co-instantiated. Even if not all small, dark and moving things were nutritious and not all nutritious things were small, dark and moving in the frog’s natural habitat, this problem of complex causal roles would still remain. The problem is that the systems responsible for the production and the consumption of representations were selected for complex causal roles in which a number of environmental features were involved.
While these two problems might be fatal to simple teleological theories of content, it is clear that the theories which are currently at the center of discussion have ample resources to deal with them. On Neander’s causal-information theory, for example, the content of the frog’s sensory-perceptual representation is not indeterminate between there’s a small, dark, moving object, there’s a fly and there’s frog food (whether the relevant properties are locally co-instantiated or not). The reason is that the frog’s visual system was not selected for producing the relevant sensory-perceptual representation in response to objects of order Diptera (flies), or to objects with nutritional value (frog food). A frog’s visual system is not causally sensitive to an object’s nutritiousness, or to its membership in the order Diptera, and could not have been selected for a causal sensitivity it did not have (see section 3.4). The same holds, mutatis mutandis, for Millikan’s teleological theory, which entails that the frog’s representation has the content there’s frog food rather than there’s a fly or there’s a small, dark, moving object (see section 3.2).
Of course, whether these ways of resolving the indeterminacies are ultimately successful or whether they give rise to further, more serious problems is a matter of debate. Some theorists who are skeptical of the prospects of Neander’s and Millikan’s solutions have thus proposed alternative answers to the problems of content indeterminacy, especially to the more serious problem of properties mutually implicated in selection.
Nicholas Agar (1993), for instance, supports the idea that the frog’s representation means there’s small, dark, moving frog food, a content intended to incorporate all of the properties causally responsible for the selection. By contrast, Manolo Martínez (2013) argues that it is not these properties themselves that enter into the content of the frog’s representation, but the natural kind (understood as a ‘homeostatic property cluster’) that accounts for the frequent co-instantiation of these properties. According to this proposal, the content of the frog’s representation would be something like there’s a fly. (This content ascription is also favored by Artiga 2019, who synthesizes Martínez’ approach with Millikan’s biosemantics, and extends it to representations that do not refer to natural kinds.)
Finally, some proponents of teleological theories do not think that content is determinate in the cases used to illustrate the alleged problem. Dennett (1995) maintains that such content indeterminacy is unproblematic. Papineau (1998) maintains that content is indeterminate in the case of a creature that lacks a belief-desire psychological structure (although he abandons this position later in Papineau 2016). More recently, Bergman (2021) has argued that content indeterminacy in the frog case is acceptable, because (i) it is a type of indeterminacy that is comparatively ‘well-behaved’, more like vagueness than like other, more radical forms of semantic indeterminacy and (ii) there are good reasons to suppose that the indeterminacy does not generalize to the propositional attitudes of human beings. According to Bergman, this is an attractive position, not least because it can explain why theorists continue to disagree about what the correct content ascription in the frog case is.
Another objection that has been influential is the Swampman objection. Swampman-style examples have been around for some time (Boorse 1976; Millikan 1984, 93). Swampman in particular was introduced by Davidson (1987) as a potential objection to his own historical (but not teleological) theory of content. When Swampman comes into existence he is a perfect physical replica of Davidson at a certain point in time (t).
Swampman’s history differs radically from Davidson’s because he comes into existence as a result of a purely accidental collision of elementary particles. Crucially, he does not partake in our evolutionary history or have any other evolutionary history or any developmental history of his own. Nor is he created by God or copied from Davidson by a machine. The resemblance between Davidson and Swampman is nothing but a stupendous coincidence. Swampman’s appearance of design is deceptive because he in no way derives from any design process, natural or intentional. Swampman’s component parts have no functions according to an etiological theory of function and so his “brain” states have no contents according to standard teleological theories of mental content.
Many people find these results highly counter-intuitive, especially the result that Swampman lacks all intentional states. Assuming physicalism, we could substitute Swampman for Davidson and no one, including his most intimate friends and family, would detect a difference. Swampman would make noises that his friends and family would interpret as witty, interesting and meaningful but, according to standard teleological theories (and Davidson’s own theory of content) Swampman has no ideas about philosophy, no perceptions of his surroundings and no beliefs or desires about anything at all.
We have already seen that some proponents of teleosemantics avoid this problem entirely by adopting a non-historical conception of function (section 3.5). For those theorists who do not want to take this route, there are two broad strategies in responding to the Swampman objection. One is to try to loosen the grip of the intuition that Swampman has intentional states and the other is to argue that any intuitions that remain do not show that teleological theories are wrong. In either case, it is important to isolate the relevant intuition because, by all accounts, Swampman would have much that Davidson had at t. All of the chemical activity in Davidson’s brain when he understood words, for example, would occur in Swampman’s brain-analog and certain descriptions of this activity will apply to both equally: e.g., physical, chemical and formal descriptions of it. Further, it is trivial that Swampman has narrow content if “narrow content” is defined as whatever most closely approximates content that nonetheless supervenes on just the narrow physical states of an individual at a time and “from the skin in.” By definition, whatever narrow content Davidson’s mental states had at t, Swampman’s inner states had too, since Swampman is at t physically indistinguishable “from the skin in” from Davidson at t. What teleological theories entail is that Swampman, no matter what narrow content he has, lacks regular normative content. The intuition that conflicts with teleological theories, therefore, is that Swampman’s inner states, which are narrowly identical to Davidson’s, are true, false, accurate or inaccurate in the usual sense.
Those who try to dislodge this intuition argue that an appearance of design can be misleading. (Recall that “design” here includes the mechanical design-work of natural selection.) Consider, for example,Swampman’s eyes, or eye-analogs. It might be intuitive to attribute functions to them. But in nature nothing so intricately organized as if for the performance of a function fails to be the result of a design process. It is argued that habits of thought, which usually take us from an appearance of design to a function ascription, lead to false ascriptions in purely hypothetical unrealistic cases (Neander 1991). The same habits of thought, the argument continues, also lead us to falsely ascribe intentionality to Swampman’s internal states.
We might grant the point about functions and yet resist the move from functions to intentionality. The problem for theories of content, as opposed to theories of function, is exacerbated by the relation between intentionality and consciousness. Many philosophers find it plausible that an individual’s phenomenal consciousness at a time supervenes on just the inner physical properties of that individual at that time. If this narrow supervenience thesis is true, then Swampman will have phenomenal consciousness when he comes into existence, assuming Davidson did at t. However, it is hard to see how we can attribute phenomenal consciousness to Swampman without also attributing some intentional states to him. Suppose, for example, that Swampman has a red-sensation. Then presumably it will seem to him that there is something red. But it seeming to him that there is something red is presumably an intentional state. (See the entry on the contents of perception.)
Here we connect with another important issue that lies outside of the scope of this entry. However, it should be briefly noted that proponents of teleosemantics have several options for dealing with this problem. They can either deny the narrow supervenience thesis for phenomenal consciousness (see, e.g., Dretske 1995) or they can argue that there is no necessary connection between phenomenal consciousness and intentionality, i.e. that a being can be phenomenally conscious without having genuine intentional states (see, e.g., Neander 1996 and Papineau 2021).
The second broad strategy is to argue that Swampman intuitions cannot show that teleological theories are false because they are irrelevant. They are, it can be argued, not to the point if a teleological theory is offered as an a posteriori, real-nature theory. This strategy comes in two versions, which should be clearly distinguished.
Proponents of the first version of this strategy, e.g. Millikan (1996) and Neander (1996), insist that common Swampman intuitions are irrelevant because they are incorrect. They argue that it may be natural to think that a possible being like Swampman would have intentional states, but that this intuitive verdict is in fact false. The analogy with an a posteriori analysis of the nature of water is thought to be helpful here. Following Kripke and Putnam, many have been persuaded that the term “water” and the concept WATER have referred to H2O exclusively, even before it was known that water is H2O, because there was deference to an unknown nature that explained the superficial properties by means of which we usually recognize instances of the liquid. On this view, it was (in 1700) natural to think that there could be water without H2O, although this was not, in fact, metaphysically possible, given that water is H2O. Along similar lines, it can be argued that a Swampman that has intentional states is only an apparent, but not a genuine metaphysical possibility, and that common Swampman intuitions thus do not undermine standard teleosemantic theories of content. (Note that the claim here is not that Swampman is metaphysically impossible, but only that a Swampman with intentional states is.)
Of course, in the case of intentionality, unlike the case of water, the hidden nature or essence cannot be an inner structure, if a teleological theory is correct. On such a theory, intentionality is alleged to be an historical kind, so the previously hidden nature is alleged to be a matter of history. As proponents of teleological theories point out, there is an apparent need for other historical kinds in biology (e.g., offspring, homologs and species).
According to the second version of the ‘real nature’ strategy, defended by Papineau (2001; 2016), the common intuitive verdict that Swampman would have intentional states may well be true, but its truth would be irrelevant, because it does not conflict with the core claims of teleosemantics (correctly understood). The idea here is that Swampman’s existence is a mere possibility, while teleosemantics is a claim about the actual world – very roughly, the claim that in the actual world, intentional states are selectional states of a certain kind (Papineau 2001, 283–284). Hence, the mere possibility of a Swampman whose intentional states are not selectional states is perfectly compatible with the truth of teleosemantics.
There has been much discussion of this second strategy in recent years. Some critics argue that it is undermined by actual Swampman-like cases (Peters 2014, Porter 2020), or by the epistemic possibility of such cases (Sebastián 2017). Braddon-Mitchell and Jackson (2002) have tried to show that such a version of teleosemantics collapses into a form of analytical functionalism. Furthermore, Schulte (2020, 2286–2288) contends that acknowledging even the mere possibility of a Swampman with intentional states is incompatible with the reductive aspirations of teleosemantics. Such considerations may lead us to reject the teleosemantic approach (at least in its standard, etiological form), but they can also be taken as reasons to adopt the first version of the ‘real nature’ strategy instead of the second.
Complete teleosemantic theories not only say how the content of a state R is determined, given that R is a representation (thereby answering the content-determination question), they also say what it takes for R to qualify as a representation in the first place (thereby answering the representational status question). Hence, such theories entail claims about which systems count as possessing representational states, and which do not. Accordingly, they can be criticized as being too restrictive or too liberal (or as too restrictive in certain respects and too liberal in others). The Swampman objection, for example, aims to show that standard teleosemantic theories are too restrictive in one respect, since they entail that Swampman does not qualify as a representational system, even though he should.
Other theorists have criticized standard teleosemantics as being too liberal. A very influential objection along these lines has been raised by Tyler Burge (2010, 303–307, 315–319; 2014; see also Rescorla 2013). Burge starts from the assumption that a theory of representation should attribute representational states to a system only if such attributions have genuine explanatory value (due to the fact that they can figure in distinctively psychological explanations). He then argues that teleosemantic theories, as well as all other naturalistic (“deflationary”) theories, attribute representational states to very simple organisms, e.g. to plants, protists and bacteria, where it is clear that such attributions have no explanatory value. This leads him to conclude that teleosemantic theories invariably attribute representational states “too broadly” – or, in other words, that teleosemantic theories are too liberal.
Now, Burge is certainly right in claiming that many prominent teleosemantic theories are very liberal in attributing representational states. Millikan’s biosemantics, for instance, arguably entails that all living beings are representational systems. Shea’s theory is not quite as liberal, but it still seems to imply that many plants, protists and bacteria qualify as having representations (see section 3.5). Hence, it is no surprise that many proponents of teleosemantics seek to defend representational liberalism against Burge’s criticism. Artiga (2016), for instance, who endorses a radical liberalism along Millikanian lines, aims to show that Burge’s case against the explanatory value of representational characterizations of simple organisms begs the question against teleosemantics (for discussion, cf. Schulte 2019a), and he also gives a positive argument for the value of such characterizations in his (2021). In a similar vein, Shea (2018) argues at length that his (moderately) liberal theory allows us to make sense of the explanatory role of content attributions in cognitive science.
Other theorists have challenged Burge’s assumption that they are committed to some form of representational liberalism. Schulte (2015) starts from Burge’s (2010) positive thesis that it is the possession of sensory systems with constancy mechanisms (e.g. size constancy, color constancy, shape constancy or motion constancy) that marks the distinction between representational and non-representational organisms. If that is right, Schulte argues, then there is a natural way for proponents of teleosemantics to incorporate that insight into their account: they can require producers of sensory representations to be systems with constancy mechanisms (where this is spelled out in a naturalistic way) and maintain that non-sensory representations presuppose the existence of sensory ones. By Burge’s own standards, such a theory would not be too liberal. An alternative non-liberal version of teleosemantics has been proposed by Butlin (2020a): he argues that sensory representations need not satisfy Schulte’s constancy-mechanism requirement as long as they have an ‘active consumer’, i.e. a consumer system where distinct processes are responsible for generating behavior and for coordinating behavior with environmental conditions.
4.4 Sophisticated Concepts and Capacities
The weightiest objection to teleological theories of content and the hardest to assess is that it is unclear how such theories could explain our most sophisticated concepts and cognitive capacities.
No naturalistic theory of content at this time yet makes perfectly clear how we think about democracy, virtue, quarks or even carburetors, and so this is not a problem that is peculiar to teleofunctional theories. However, it is sometimes argued that teleological theories of content have a special problem in this respect (e.g., by Peacocke 1992). The thought is that they may have some hope of working for contents that concern things that impact on fitness – food, shelter, mates, etc. – but that they are, in principle, unable to deal with contents that cannot have impacted on fitness, or not in any suitably selective way. Some contents cannot have impacted on fitness because they belong to the future or are non-existent. Others cannot affect fitness in any suitably selective way because, although they have an impact, their impact is too non-specific: for example, quarks have an impact but because they are omnipresent in our environment they cannot qualify as the content of a representation by virtue of some simple selectional story.
This objection is hard to assess for a number of reasons. One is that there are many different kinds of sophisticated concepts and capacities and accounting for them all is a large task. Another is that, while the objection is posed as an objection to all teleosemantic theories, different versions will address it in different ways. Yet another is that we might allow that it is still early days with respect to the development of teleological (and other) naturalistic theories of mental content. It has really only been since the advent of cognitive science in the middle of the last century and the general acceptance of a broadly physicalist perspective on the mind in the decades that followed that philosophers of mind have devoted much effort to trying to give a naturalistic theory of mental content.
In view of all of this, the present section can do little more than offer a few remarks about how some versions of teleosemantics make some inroads on the issue. Most of the points that follow have been touched on in earlier sections.
It should be emphasized that those who favor teleosemantic theories rarely restrict the relevant functions to those that derive from natural selection operating over an evolutionary span of time. As remarked earlier, there might be non-intentional selection processes that operate over the span of a culture or over the span of an individual’s own development or life. Meme selection, conditioning or some other forms of learning and neural selection are considered to be relevant kinds of selection by some proponents of teleosemantics.
Millikan would in this context ask us to take note of her notions of derived and adapted proper functions (Millikan 1984, ch. 2). What Millikan refers to as a “direct proper function” belongs to a mechanism for which there has been selection. The mechanisms that produce camouflage patterns on the surface of the octopus have the direct proper function to do so. The patterns that these mechanisms produce by means of which they perform this function possess what Millikan calls a “derived proper function,” derived from the function of the mechanism to provide camouflage. Further, a pattern produced on a particular occasion has an “adapted derived proper function,” which is a relational function, in this case to provide camouflage in that particular setting in which the octopus is situated. Millikan makes use of these extended senses in which items may have functions to try to explain the contents of novel representations and representations that are produced as a result of learning. Learning mechanisms have certain functions and when they perform their functions in particular circumstances their products can have adapted derived proper functions in relation to those circumstances, whether or not the circumstances obtained during the history of our species.
Millikan (2000) gives an extensive treatment of concepts. In brief, her view is that conceptions play no role in determining the extensions of the concepts with which they are associated. Millikan’s theory presupposes innate learning mechanisms that are tuned to identify substances of different sorts in accord with certain principles. The relevant sort of substance is that which accounts for the past selective success of the learning mechanisms. For instance, some mental mechanisms might have been selected for recognizing faces of individuals in accord with certain principles of operation, and others might have been selected for recognizing animals of different species in accord with other principles of operation. These mechanisms can acquire the “purpose” to recognize something more specific, such as a particular individual’s face or animals of a particular species: this is because the mechanisms were selected for recognizing things in that domain (faces or animals) in accord with certain principles of operation and, in accord with those principles, they now have the have the “purpose” to recognize a particular individual’s face or animals of a particular species. The extension of a substance concept, Millikan tells us, is what substance it was selected to recognize.
Large issues relevant to assessing the different teleological theories of content remain to be settled. On a hopeful note, much good work has been done in exploring the possible range of such theories, in producing interesting in-principle objections and in responding to such objections in ways that have resulted in better developed or better defended versions. We should also keep in mind that serious work on naturalistic theories of content has only been going on for decades rather than centuries and that, on a philosophical timescale, that is quite a short time.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Teleosemantics, Mark Rowland’s “field guide” entry on teleosemantics, archived at the Internet Archive.
- Teleofunctionalism, Scholarpedia entry by William Lycan & Karen Neander.
- Bibliography on “Teleological Accounts of Mental Content”, maintained by Ming Tan.
The authors would like to thank Hannah Altehenger, Marc Artiga, Karl Bergman, David Chalmers, Fabian Hundertmark, Ruth Millikan, David Papineau, Georges Rey and Nick Shea for penetrating comments and helpful suggestions. The editors would also like to thank Christopher von Bülow for carefully reading this entry and calling numerous typographical errors to our attention.