Supplement to Critical Thinking


This supplement elaborates on the history of the articulation, promotion and adoption of critical thinking as an educational goal.

John Dewey (1910: 74, 82) introduced the term ‘critical thinking’ as the name of an educational goal, which he identified with a scientific attitude of mind. More commonly, he called the goal ‘reflective thought’, ‘reflective thinking’, ‘reflection’, or just ‘thought’ or ‘thinking’. He describes his book as written for two purposes. The first was to help people to appreciate the kinship of children’s native curiosity, fertile imagination and love of experimental inquiry to the scientific attitude. The second was to help people to consider how recognizing this kinship in educational practice “would make for individual happiness and the reduction of social waste” (iii). He notes that the ideas in the book obtained concreteness in the Laboratory School in Chicago.

Dewey’s ideas were put into practice by some of the schools that participated in the Eight-Year Study in the 1930s sponsored by the Progressive Education Association in the United States. For this study, 300 colleges agreed to consider for admission graduates of 30 selected secondary schools or school systems from around the country who experimented with the content and methods of teaching, even if the graduates had not completed the then-prescribed secondary school curriculum. One purpose of the study was to discover through exploration and experimentation how secondary schools in the United States could serve youth more effectively (Aikin 1942). Each experimental school was free to change the curriculum as it saw fit, but the schools agreed that teaching methods and the life of the school should conform to the idea (previously advocated by Dewey) that people develop through doing things that are meaningful to them, and that the main purpose of the secondary school was to lead young people to understand, appreciate and live the democratic way of life characteristic of the United States (Aikin 1942: 17–18). In particular, school officials believed that young people in a democracy should develop the habit of reflective thinking and skill in solving problems (Aikin 1942: 81). Students’ work in the classroom thus consisted more often of a problem to be solved than a lesson to be learned. Especially in mathematics and science, the schools made a point of giving students experience in clear, logical thinking as they solved problems. The report of one experimental school, the University School of Ohio State University, articulated this goal of improving students’ thinking:

Critical or reflective thinking originates with the sensing of a problem. It is a quality of thought operating in an effort to solve the problem and to reach a tentative conclusion which is supported by all available data. It is really a process of problem solving requiring the use of creative insight, intellectual honesty, and sound judgment. It is the basis of the method of scientific inquiry. The success of democracy depends to a large extent on the disposition and ability of citizens to think critically and reflectively about the problems which must of necessity confront them, and to improve the quality of their thinking is one of the major goals of education. (Commission on the Relation of School and College of the Progressive Education Association 1943: 745–746)

The Eight-Year Study had an evaluation staff, which developed, in consultation with the schools, tests to measure aspects of student progress that fell outside the focus of the traditional curriculum. The evaluation staff classified many of the schools’ stated objectives under the generic heading “clear thinking” or “critical thinking” (Smith, Tyler, & Evaluation Staff 1942: 35–36). To develop tests of achievement of this broad goal, they distinguished five overlapping aspects of it: ability to interpret data, abilities associated with an understanding of the nature of proof, and the abilities to apply principles of science, of social studies and of logical reasoning. The Eight-Year Study also had a college staff, directed by a committee of college administrators, whose task was to determine how well the experimental schools had prepared their graduates for college. The college staff compared the performance of 1,475 college students from the experimental schools with an equal number of graduates from conventional schools, matched in pairs by sex, age, race, scholastic aptitude scores, home and community background, interests, and probable future. They concluded that, on 18 measures of student success, the graduates of the experimental schools did a somewhat better job than the comparison group. The graduates from the six most traditional of the experimental schools showed no large or consistent differences. The graduates from the six most experimental schools, on the other hand, had much greater differences in their favour. The graduates of the two most experimental schools, the college staff reported:

… surpassed their comparison groups by wide margins in academic achievement, intellectual curiosity, scientific approach to problems, and interest in contemporary affairs. The differences in their favor were even greater in general resourcefulness, in enjoyment of reading, [in] participation in the arts, in winning non-academic honors, and in all aspects of college life except possibly participation in sports and social activities. (Aikin 1942: 114)

One of these schools was a private school with students from privileged families and the other the experimental section of a public school with students from non-privileged families. The college staff reported that the graduates of the two schools were indistinguishable from each other in terms of college success.

In 1933 Dewey issued an extensively rewritten edition of his How We Think (Dewey 1910), with the sub-title “A restatement of the relation of reflective thinking to the educative process”. Although the restatement retains the basic structure and content of the original book, Dewey made a number of changes. He rewrote and simplified his logical analysis of the process of reflection, made his ideas clearer and more definite, replaced the terms ‘induction’ and ‘deduction’ by the phrases ‘control of data and evidence’ and ‘control of reasoning and concepts’, added more illustrations, rearranged chapters, and revised the parts on teaching to reflect changes in schools since 1910. In particular, he objected to one-sided practices of some “experimental” and “progressive” schools that allowed children freedom but gave them no guidance, citing as objectionable practices novelty and variety for their own sake, experiences and activities with real materials but of no educational significance, treating random and disconnected activity as if it were an experiment, failure to summarize net accomplishment at the end of an inquiry, non-educative projects, and treatment of the teacher as a negligible factor rather than as “the intellectual leader of a social group” (Dewey 1933: 273). Without explaining his reasons, Dewey eliminated the previous edition’s uses of the words ‘critical’ and ‘uncritical’, thus settling firmly on ‘reflection’ or ‘reflective thinking’ as the preferred term for his subject-matter. In the revised edition, the word ‘critical’ occurs only once, where Dewey writes that “a person may not be sufficiently critical about the ideas that occur to him” (1933: 16, italics in original); being critical is thus a component of reflection, not the whole of it. In contrast, the Eight-Year Study by the Progressive Education Association treated ‘critical thinking’ and ‘reflective thinking’ as synonyms.

In the same period, Dewey collaborated on a history of the Laboratory School in Chicago with two former teachers from the school (Mayhew & Edwards 1936). The history describes the school’s curriculum and organization, activities aimed at developing skills, parents’ involvement, and the habits of mind that the children acquired. A concluding chapter evaluates the school’s achievements, counting as a success its staging of the curriculum to correspond to the natural development of the growing child. In two appendices, the authors describe the evolution of Dewey’s principles of education and Dewey himself describes the theory of the Chicago experiment (Dewey 1936).

Glaser (1941) reports in his doctoral dissertation the method and results of an experiment in the development of critical thinking conducted in the fall of 1938. He defines critical thinking as Dewey defined reflective thinking:

Critical thinking calls for a persistent effort to examine any belief or supposed form of knowledge in the light of the evidence that supports it and the further conclusions to which it tends. (Glaser 1941: 6; cf. Dewey 1910: 6; Dewey 1933: 9)

In the experiment, eight lesson units directed at improving critical thinking abilities were taught to four grade 12 high school classes, with pre-test and post-test of the students using the Otis Quick-Scoring Mental Ability Test and the Watson-Glaser Tests of Critical Thinking (developed in collaboration with Glaser’s dissertation sponsor, Goodwin Watson). The average gain in scores on these tests was greater to a statistically significant degree among the students who received the lessons in critical thinking than among the students in a control group of four grade 12 high school classes taking the usual curriculum in English. Glaser concludes:

The aspect of critical thinking which appears most susceptible to general improvement is the attitude of being disposed to consider in a thoughtful way the problems and subjects that come within the range of one’s experience. An attitude of wanting evidence for beliefs is more subject to general transfer. Development of skill in applying the methods of logical inquiry and reasoning, however, appears to be specifically related to, and in fact limited by, the acquisition of pertinent knowledge and facts concerning the problem or subject matter toward which the thinking is to be directed. (Glaser 1941: 175)

Retest scores and observable behaviour indicated that students in the intervention group retained their growth in ability to think critically for at least six months after the special instruction.

In 1948 a group of U.S. college examiners decided to develop taxonomies of educational objectives with a common vocabulary that they could use for communicating with each other about test items. The first of these taxonomies, for the cognitive domain, appeared in 1956 (Bloom et al. 1956), and included critical thinking objectives. It has become known as Bloom’s taxonomy. A second taxonomy, for the affective domain (Krathwohl, Bloom, & Masia 1964), and a third taxonomy, for the psychomotor domain (Simpson 1966–67), appeared later. Each of the taxonomies is hierarchical, with achievement of a higher educational objective alleged to require achievement of corresponding lower educational objectives.

Bloom’s taxonomy has six major categories. From lowest to highest, they are knowledge, comprehension, application, analysis, synthesis, and evaluation. Within each category, there are sub-categories, also arranged hierarchically from the educationally prior to the educationally posterior. The lowest category, though called ‘knowledge’, is confined to objectives of remembering information and being able to recall or recognize it, without much transformation beyond organizing it (Bloom et al. 1956: 28–29). The five higher categories are collectively termed “intellectual abilities and skills” (Bloom et al. 1956: 204). The term is simply another name for critical thinking abilities and skills:

Although information or knowledge is recognized as an important outcome of education, very few teachers would be satisfied to regard this as the primary or the sole outcome of instruction. What is needed is some evidence that the students can do something with their knowledge, that is, that they can apply the information to new situations and problems. It is also expected that students will acquire generalized techniques for dealing with new problems and new materials. Thus, it is expected that when the student encounters a new problem or situation, he will select an appropriate technique for attacking it and will bring to bear the necessary information, both facts and principles. This has been labeled “critical thinking” by some, “reflective thinking” by Dewey and others, and “problem solving” by still others. In the taxonomy, we have used the term “intellectual abilities and skills”. (Bloom et al. 1956: 38)

Comprehension and application objectives, as their names imply, involve understanding and applying information. Critical thinking abilities and skills show up in the three highest categories of analysis, synthesis and evaluation. The condensed version of Bloom’s taxonomy (Bloom et al. 1956: 201–207) gives the following examples of objectives at these levels:

  • analysis objectives: ability to recognize unstated assumptions, ability to check the consistency of hypotheses with given information and assumptions, ability to recognize the general techniques used in advertising, propaganda and other persuasive materials
  • synthesis objectives: organizing ideas and statements in writing, ability to propose ways of testing a hypothesis, ability to formulate and modify hypotheses
  • evaluation objectives: ability to indicate logical fallacies, comparison of major theories about particular cultures

The analysis, synthesis and evaluation objectives in Bloom’s taxonomy collectively came to be called the “higher-order thinking skills” (Tankersley 2005: chap. 5). Although the analysis-synthesis-evaluation sequence mimics phases in Dewey’s (1933) logical analysis of the reflective thinking process, it has not generally been adopted as a model of a critical thinking process. While commending the inspirational value of its ratio of five categories of thinking objectives to one category of recall objectives, Ennis (1981b) points out that the categories lack criteria applicable across topics and domains. For example, analysis in chemistry is so different from analysis in literature that there is not much point in teaching analysis as a general type of thinking. Further, the postulated hierarchy seems questionable at the higher levels of Bloom’s taxonomy. For example, ability to indicate logical fallacies hardly seems more complex than the ability to organize statements and ideas in writing.

A revised version of Bloom’s taxonomy (Anderson et al. 2001) distinguishes the intended cognitive process in an educational objective (such as being able to recall, to compare or to check) from the objective’s informational content (“knowledge”), which may be factual, conceptual, procedural, or metacognitive. The result is a so-called “Taxonomy Table” with four rows for the kinds of informational content and six columns for the six main types of cognitive process. The authors name the types of cognitive process by verbs, to indicate their status as mental activities. They change the name of the ‘comprehension’ category to ‘understand’ and of the ‘synthesis’ category to ’create’, and switch the order of synthesis and evaluation. The result is a list of six main types of cognitive process aimed at by teachers: remember, understand, apply, analyze, evaluate, and create. The authors retain the idea of a hierarchy of increasing complexity, but acknowledge some overlap, for example between understanding and applying. And they retain the idea that critical thinking and problem solving cut across the more complex cognitive processes. The terms ‘critical thinking’ and ‘problem solving’, they write:

are widely used and tend to become touchstones of curriculum emphasis. Both generally include a variety of activities that might be classified in disparate cells of the Taxonomy Table. That is, in any given instance, objectives that involve problem solving and critical thinking most likely call for cognitive processes in several categories on the process dimension. For example, to think critically about an issue probably involves some Conceptual knowledge to Analyze the issue. Then, one can Evaluate different perspectives in terms of the criteria and, perhaps, Create a novel, yet defensible perspective on this issue. (Anderson et al. 2001: 269–270; italics in original)

In the revised taxonomy, only a few sub-categories, such as inferring, have enough commonality to be treated as a distinct critical thinking ability that could be taught and assessed as a general ability.

A landmark contribution to philosophical scholarship on the concept of critical thinking was a 1962 article in the Harvard Educational Review by Robert H. Ennis, with the title “A concept of critical thinking: A proposed basis for research in the teaching and evaluation of critical thinking ability” (Ennis 1962). Ennis took as his starting-point a conception of critical thinking put forward by B. Othanel Smith:

We shall consider thinking in terms of the operations involved in the examination of statements which we, or others, may believe. A speaker declares, for example, that “Freedom means that the decisions in America’s productive effort are made not in the minds of a bureaucracy but in the free market”. Now if we set about to find out what this statement means and to determine whether to accept or reject it, we would be engaged in thinking which, for lack of a better term, we shall call critical thinking. If one wishes to say that this is only a form of problem-solving in which the purpose is to decide whether or not what is said is dependable, we shall not object. But for our purposes we choose to call it critical thinking. (Smith 1953: 130)

Adding a normative component to this conception, Ennis defined critical thinking as “the correct assessing of statements” (Ennis 1962: 83). On the basis of this definition, he distinguished 12 “aspects” of critical thinking corresponding to types or aspects of statements, such as judging whether an observation statement is reliable and grasping the meaning of a statement. He noted that he did not include judging value statements. Cutting across the 12 aspects, he distinguished three dimensions of critical thinking: logical (judging relationships between meanings of words and statements), criterial (knowledge of the criteria for judging statements), and pragmatic (the impression of the background purpose). For each aspect, Ennis described the applicable dimensions, including criteria. He proposed the resulting construct as a basis for developing specifications for critical thinking tests and for research on instructional methods and levels.

In the 1970s and 1980s there was an upsurge of attention to the development of thinking skills. The annual International Conference on Critical Thinking and Educational Reform has attracted since its start in 1980 tens of thousands of educators from all levels. In 1983 the College Entrance Examination Board proclaimed reasoning as one of six basic academic competencies needed by college students (College Board 1983). Departments of education in the United States and around the world began to include thinking objectives in their curriculum guidelines for school subjects. For example, Ontario’s social sciences and humanities curriculum guideline for secondary schools requires “the use of critical and creative thinking skills and/or processes” as a goal of instruction and assessment in each subject and course (Ontario Ministry of Education 2013: 30). The document describes critical thinking as follows:

Critical thinking is the process of thinking about ideas or situations in order to understand them fully, identify their implications, make a judgement, and/or guide decision making. Critical thinking includes skills such as questioning, predicting, analysing, synthesizing, examining opinions, identifying values and issues, detecting bias, and distinguishing between alternatives. Students who are taught these skills become critical thinkers who can move beyond superficial conclusions to a deeper understanding of the issues they are examining. They are able to engage in an inquiry process in which they explore complex and multifaceted issues, and questions for which there may be no clear-cut answers (Ontario Ministry of Education 2013: 46).

Sweden makes schools responsible for ensuring that each pupil who completes compulsory school “can make use of critical thinking and independently formulate standpoints based on knowledge and ethical considerations” (Skolverket 2018: 12). Subject syllabi incorporate this requirement, and items testing critical thinking skills appear on national tests that are a required step toward university admission. For example, the core content of biology, physics and chemistry in years 7-9 includes critical examination of sources of information and arguments encountered by pupils in different sources and social discussions related to these sciences, in both digital and other media. (Skolverket 2018: 170, 181, 192). Correspondingly, in year 9 the national tests require using knowledge of biology, physics or chemistry “to investigate information, communicate and come to a decision on issues concerning health, energy, technology, the environment, use of natural resources and ecological sustainability” (see the message from the School Board). Other jurisdictions similarly embed critical thinking objectives in curriculum guidelines.

At the college level, a new wave of introductory logic textbooks, pioneered by Kahane (1971), applied the tools of logic to contemporary social and political issues. Popular contemporary textbooks of this sort include those by Bailin and Battersby (2016b), Boardman, Cavender and Kahane (2018), Browne and Keeley (2018), Groarke and Tindale (2012), and Moore and Parker (2020). In their wake, colleges and universities in North America transformed their introductory logic course into a general education service course with a title like ‘critical thinking’ or ‘reasoning’. In 1980, the trustees of California’s state university and colleges approved as a general education requirement a course in critical thinking, described as follows:

Instruction in critical thinking is to be designed to achieve an understanding of the relationship of language to logic, which should lead to the ability to analyze, criticize, and advocate ideas, to reason inductively and deductively, and to reach factual or judgmental conclusions based on sound inferences drawn from unambiguous statements of knowledge or belief. The minimal competence to be expected at the successful conclusion of instruction in critical thinking should be the ability to distinguish fact from judgment, belief from knowledge, and skills in elementary inductive and deductive processes, including an understanding of the formal and informal fallacies of language and thought. (Dumke 1980)

Since December 1983, the Association for Informal Logic and Critical Thinking has sponsored sessions at the three annual divisional meetings of the American Philosophical Association. In December 1987, the Committee on Pre-College Philosophy of the American Philosophical Association invited Peter Facione to make a systematic inquiry into the current state of critical thinking and critical thinking assessment. Facione assembled a group of 46 other academic philosophers and psychologists to participate in a multi-round Delphi process, whose product was entitled Critical Thinking: A Statement of Expert Consensus for Purposes of Educational Assessment and Instruction (Facione 1990a). The statement listed abilities and dispositions that should be the goals of a lower-level undergraduate course in critical thinking. Researchers in nine European countries determined which of these skills and dispositions employers expect of university graduates (Dominguez 2018 a), compared those expectations to critical thinking educational practices in post-secondary educational institutions (Dominguez 2018b), developed a course on critical thinking education for university teachers (Dominguez 2018c) and proposed in response to identified gaps between expectations and practices an “educational protocol” that post-secondary educational institutions in Europe could use to develop critical thinking (Elen et al. 2019).

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