Notes to Daoism

1. Translation Note: The two spellings, “taoism” and “daoism”, come from two systems of romanizing Chinese. Western scholarship was dominated by the Wade-Giles system in which the sound closer to d was represented by a t and the sound closer to a t by t’. The Chinese recently developed and adopted their own official romanization.It used the more intuitive d/t representation.Western scholars are gradually adopting the official Chinese romanization. This creates a temporary inconvenience for the reader who does not know the two systems or their relation. It also creates a theoretical puzzle—’tao’ and ’Taoism’ are arguably English terms today. The choices of Chinese speakers should not change English conventions. However, English writers have already stopped writing Peking in favor of Beijing. Further, most Chinese scholars, including the author of this article, can hardly bring themselves to say “t-a-o” or “t-a-oism” (just as they cannot bring themselves to say Bei-zhing simply because TV and media people do).

2. This article employs a subscript technique for introducing Chinese concepts (characters) and phrases into an English metalanguage (English enriched to discussing the meaning of Chinese). Simple transliteration (e.g. with the now generally used pinyin Romanization) is confusing because there are typically several dozen characters with the same pinyin, even more if tones are not marked. Translation practices, further, may employ a similar number of English variants depending on the context. Earlier conventions were relatively inconvenient—including a superscript index to a glossary that required turning to the end of an article—or potentially misleading—putting possible English substitutions in parentheses which tempts us to regard the English concept as the topic under discussion. In the convention used here, the italicized syllable(s) is a phonetic rendering (in pinyin for Mandarin Chinese-characters have different pronunciations in all of the ±40 dialects of Chinese and current or historical practice in e.g. Japanese, Vietnamese, and Korean.) and the subscript contains one or more English candidate substitutions selected for the context. Chinese is an isolating language so the English phrases will vary with the context. With the widespread use of Unicode characters, we can now also insert the Chinese graph inline, to further aid the reader in tracing a single concept through several inferential contexts.

3. Eno, Robert 1990, The Confucian Creation of Heaven Buffalo: SUNY Series in Chinese Philosophy and Culture. Benjamin Schwartz expresses a similar view in his 1985 The World of Thought in Ancient China .

4. Though this seems to require that the mystical dao have some linguistic content to place it in the space of reasons and inference.

5. As Graham notes in his 1972 p. 59, another key argument can be found in Later Mohist writings.

6. Obviously, this textual observation does not prove the friendship is not a literary device-particularly in a text so imaginatively free in its fantasy dialogues and spokesmen. Some speculate that Hui Shi might have been a teacher-or they may have been fellow students.

Copyright © 2007 by
Chad Hansen <>

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