Robert Desgabets

First published Fri Mar 23, 2001; substantive revision Wed Feb 7, 2018

Dom Robert Desgabets (1610–1678) was an early defender and teacher of the Cartesian philosophy at St. Maur in the region of Lorraine, France. He was born in Ancemont and in 1636 became a monk in the Benedictine order. He taught theology at Saint-Evre at Toul between 1635–1655, and served as Procurer General of Mihiel to Paris during 1648–49. Although he is little-known today, he played an important role in the development and transmission of the Cartesian philosophy, especially in Paris and Toulouse. He is best known for his role in the theological controversy over the Cartesian explication of the Eucharist (Desgabets, 1671), and for his defense of Nicolas Malebranche against the skeptic Simon Foucher (Desgabets, 1675). His major philosophical writings were not published until 1983.[1] His contributions in natural philosophy include pioneering work in the study of blood transfusion and mechanics. His unusual marriage of Cartesianism and empiricism challenges many standard views of Descartes and the Cartesian philosophy.

1. Life and Writings

Although Robert Desgabets (1610–1678) is perhaps the most original of the Cartesian thinkers, even lauded by his most famous student, Pierre-Sylvain Régis, as “one of the greatest metaphysicians of our century” (Regis, 1704, p. 328), only one book and two small works were published during his lifetime.[2] His correspondence indicates that he was interested in mechanics before 1644, prior to his acquaintance with the writings of Descartes. For a metaphysical thinker like Desgabets, it was Descartes, not Galileo or Bacon, who offered a new and complete philosophic system. In Desgabets’s estimation, the only legitimate rival system to Descartes’s was the one developed by Pierre Gassendi, but in the final analysis, the “new scientific discoveries” weighed decisively in Descartes’s favor.

In 1658 Desgabets participated in the Cartesian conferences held at M. de Montmort’s, where he reportedly participated in discussions with Rohault, Clerselier, and Cordemoy. Desgabets delivered a lecture which outlined his invention of an apparatus and procedure for blood transfusion, but he seems to have abandoned its study shortly thereafter. In 1667, after a controversy erupted between the English and the French over who first invented the procedure, a physician by the name of Jean Denis was spurred to publish the written version of Desgabets’s lecture. This appeared in 1668, four years after the physicians Clark and Henshaw of England had attempted the operation on animals without success (Desgabets, 1668). Prior to this research, in 1656, Christopher Wren successfully injected medications directly into the veins of animals, after which in 1665, another Englishman and physician, Richard Lower, a teacher and friend of John Locke, successfully injected blood into animals using this same method. Genevieve Rodis-Lewis has sorted out many of the details of this history, and shows that the two procedures created by Lower and Desgabets are so different as to confirm the independence of their inventions (Rodis-Lewis, 1974). But whether and when Desgabets experimented with his procedure has not been firmly established. What is evident, however, is that Desgabets, like Wren, was inspired by Harvey’s discovery of the circulation of blood. Once Harvey had shown how the circulation of blood is best understood as a mechanism operating according to lawful movements, he opened the way for blood transfusion to be understood along similar lines, as a species of the communication of movement. Where evidence of Desgabets’s actual experimentation with blood transfusion is lacking, his descriptions of it show that he was aware of the possibility of shock if the quantities transferred were too great for the subject (Rodis-Lewis, 1974).

Throughout his lifetime Desgabets engaged in many theological and philosophical controversies with such distinguished seventeenth-century thinkers as Mabillon, Rapin, Foucher, Malebranche, Cordemoy, Arnauld and Poisson. One of his more famous interlocutors was the Cartesian Gérauld de Cordemoy (1626–1684). Despite his admiration for Cordemoy, Desgabets was shocked by the atomism in the Discernement du corps et de l’âme (1666), a copy of which had been sent to him by Clerselier. Desgabets subsequently wrote to Clerselier, opposing Cordemoy’s arguments in favor of the existence of the void and against the infinite divisibility of extension. According to Desgabets, the marriage of Cartesian and anti-Cartesian elements in this work formed an irreconcilable schism in the Cartesian philosophy. Although Desgabets himself was not one to adopt Cartesianism in its entirety, in his view his own criticisms perfected and maintained the integrity of the Cartesian principles, while Cordemoy’s adoption of atoms and the void was a direct affront to the Cartesian metaphysics.[3]

Another, much more scandalous interchange took place between Desgabets and Thomas Le Géant between 1671–1672 over Desgabets’s thoughts on the Eucharist, which he stated in an anonymous work, the second of his publications, Considérations sur l’état présent de la controverse touchant le T. S. Sacrement de l’autel (1671). Lemaire credited this work with having been the primary cause of the persecution of Cartesianism in France, since it brought to light the incompatibility of the Cartesian philosophy with the official Church doctrine on the mystery of the Eucharist (Lemaire, 1901, p. 124). Desgabets had entered this on-going debate in 1654 at Clerselier’s request. Desgabets’s intention was to defend the Cartesian doctrine of material substance against the Peripatetic doctrine of substantial forms in his explication of transubstantiation. Clerselier and Rohault had defended Descartes’s ideas on the subject along similar lines, but no one had been willing, either privately or publicly, to argue as Desgabets eventually did, that the body of Christ is really extended in the host. In addition, Desgabets’s persistence and perhaps even imprudence, pushed the issue into the open. For, it was shortly after the publication of the anonymous Considérations in 1671, that Desgabets sent additional writings on the topic to Abbey Le Roi, who communicated them to Nicole and Arnauld. The latter found Desgabets’s views dangerous and completely against tradition. It was through his acquaintance with Nicole and Arnauld, that the non-Cartesian Le Géant learned of the document and the identity of its author. Le Géant alerted the Procurer General of the Congregation of Benedictines, who ordered Desgabets to report to his superiors concerning the matter. This led to an interrogation and the subsequent issuance of an order on the 15th of December 1672, which demanded that Desgabets renounce his views on the Eucharist (Armogathe, 1977, pp. 104–105; Lemaire, pp. 51, 127–128). Desgabets promised to obey, and retreated to a monastery at Breuil. Fortunately this did not end his philosophical work. The controversy attracted the attention of Cardinal de Retz, who was known for his radical spirit of reform among conservative ecclesiastics in France. Cardinal de Retz, who was a partisan of the new Cartesian philosophy, provided protection for Desgabets and invited him to the Cartesian conferences held at Chateau de Commercy. It was here that Desgabets criticized and corrected what he saw as the errors of Descartes, and completed his “indefectibility thesis,” which he had started in 1653–1654.

Desgabets’s last published work, Critique de la critique de la Recherche de la vérité (1675), was intended as a defence of Malebranche against the sceptic Simon Foucher. However, Malebranche did not share this assessment, writing that although he was pleased with the person, he was not pleased with the contents of his book; he further lamented that Desgabets ought to have better understood his ideas before taking on a defense. Desgabets himself was never to see Malebranche’s scolding response which was published in the “Advertissement” of the third edition of the Search After Truth (Malebranche, 1958–84, v2, pp. 500–503), since Desgabets died at Breuil on March 13, 1678, just fourteen days before it appeared.

Desgabets’s most important Cartesian text, Supplément à la philosophie de M. Descartes (1675), was intended as a supplement to Descartes’s Meditations. In this work, Desgabets examines many of Descartes’s important doctrines and arguments. Desgabets defends the Cartesian doctrines of sensible qualities, matter, mind-body dualism, mind-body union and interaction in man while criticizing Descartes’s argument for the cogito as the first principle of knowledge, the claim that there is such a process as pure intellection, that there are innate ideas, and that ideas have objective reality (pure possibility). What is particularly interesting is the central importance that Desgabets gives to the role of sensation in knowledge, and his development of Descartes’s treatment of truth as both eternal and immutable but in some sense (one much contested in the literature) contingent. Desgabets more than once remarks in this work that “M. Descartes is not always a good Cartesian,” which typifies his conviction that Cartesianism is more than the sum of the particulars set down by Descartes himself.

Viewing Desgabets’s work as a whole, there is no doubt that what he viewed as a revision or perfection of the Cartesian philosophy others have viewed as a fundamental departure. In his favor, he never strayed from the Cartesian metaphysics, i.e., its substance dualism of mind and matter, substance-mode ontology, mind-body union and interaction, and the view that extension is the essence of matter and thought the essence of mind; and he remained loyal to the Cartesian physics against the atomists. However, heretically to some, he strongly rejected the rationalist epistemology which often dominates in Descartes, and argued that Descartes’s own principles favor a sensory foundation for knowledge.

2. Metaphysics

Despite the originality of many of Desgabets’s ideas, he was orthodox in his Cartesianism (Watson, 1966; 1987). Desgabets adhered strictly to Descartes’s doctrine of matter as body extended in three dimensions. Physics, as Desgabets conceived it, was both mathematically and metaphysically grounded in the solid of the geometer. He also maintained the substance dualism of mind and matter while retaining their causal interaction. And he, like Descartes, insisted upon the substantial unity of man and the specificity of his nature and defended the Cartesian interpretation of ideas against such non-orthodox Cartesians as Malebranche. Although he claimed that the nature of the mind-body union is “the most impenetrable thing in the world,” he had much to say about its sensory basis and its operations.

Desgabets subscribed completely to the Cartesian doctrine of matter as a substance extended in length, width, and breadth. It was posited against the prevailing Peripatetic view that posits prime matter and substantial forms in order to explain the permanence underlying the continuous change that matter undergoes. On Descartes’s view, the essence of matter is its extension in three dimensions, and all of its changing attributes, properties and modes, such as movement, rest, figure, situation and composition of parts, are completely dependent upon and follow from this unified extension (OPD 2: 27). Matter, or corporeal substance, is clearly known when it is viewed as the geometrical object of mathematicians, as a magnitude extended in length, width and breadth. Likewise, corporeal bodies are best viewed as the movements, rest, figures, arrangements and sizes of which corporeal substance is capable, and which, in its various diversifications and assemblages, “… now pass for the form of all particular bodies of which the world is composed” (OPD 1: 3). And, in all of this, “… there is nothing which is not governed by the laws of mechanics” (OPD 2: 4).

Furthermore, Desgabets viewed bodies as portions of matter, which in the case of animals are highly delicate and organized machines composed of an infinite number of parts capable of an infinite diversity of movements. He held this view against that of the Peripatetics who believed that there must be an internal principle of thought in beasts because of the intricacy and apparent human-like intelligence of their movements. According to Desgabets, the kind of thinking that attributes such an internal principle to beasts is the same kind of thinking that results in the attribution of intelligence to clocks, “However, the same affront to reason and philosophy is committed by the Americans and the Barbarians of the Orient who not being able to understand the mechanical reasons for the movement of clocks, or the true causes of natural effects, attribute souls and intelligence to machines, and likewise to fire, lakes etc., and in doing so expose themselves to the mockery of Europeans” (OPD 4: 132–133). In other words, no appeal to internal principles, or final causes is required to explain the movements of beasts, any more than it is needed to explain the movements of clocks. The complexity of movements, whether involved in the operations of clocks or those of animate bodies, is explicable in purely mechanistic terms.

Likewise, all motions communicated within or between material bodies are effected by physical contact and proceed according to the laws of local motion. Desgabets was careful to stress that the ultimate source of movement is not matter but God, who imparted motion to the universe in its creation. For Desgabets, it is this fact that grounds the laws of nature: “It is the constant and uniform manner of the action of God which founds these laws, by means of which He forms and maintains this beautiful harmony in the world which is one of the greatest objects of our sciences” (OPD 1: 13). As Desgabets saw it, the operation of these laws of nature and the rules of the communication of movement were the true and unique foundations of the new physics.

Desgabets also subscribed to the Cartesian conception of mind as an immaterial substance whose essence is thought. The distinction between mind and matter is thus a real and substantial one, impossible not to perceive: “Never has an infant asked for lies or truths for breakfast, nor has he imagined that the stones encountered along his path were the gross thoughts of some countryman” (OPD 5: 197). Minds, or immaterial substances, are of three kinds: uncreated, which is God; mind detached from body, which is an angel; and mind united with organized body, which is a reasonable soul. The second of these, angels, are the only pure minds in the created universe and they have no corporeal extension, no local presence or correspondence to time—they are simple and indivisible minds. Such minds or spirits cannot be perfected by any substantial union since their specific spiritual being does not require anything corporeal to carry out its functions. However, they are capable of participating in the movements of the visible world, though in doing so, they must undergo a kind of degradation and punishment in order to receive pain. The third of these spiritual beings is man, who consists of a cross between purely intellectual and purely corporeal things. In this Desgabets appears to have strayed slightly from the official Cartesian doctrine of dual substances, since he claimed that outside of God there are three sorts of simple created substances, matter or body, angel, and one which is composed of body and soul, which is man. However, this tripartite division of substances is supported by a more fundamental bipartite division of material and spiritual substances, so that man is best understood as a state of being which emerges out of the conjunction of two substances, rather than as a substance in the primary sense. This is not unlike Descartes’s account of man as a “composite entity” possessing two principle attributes, namely extension and thought, a being which itself is not a simple substance. Nonetheless, in Desgabets as in Descartes, how to interpret the human soul as as substance (Miller, 2008), or as a modal being (Lennon, 1994), is contentious.

It was an important point for Desgabets that man, unlike angels, is a being composed of body and soul, who continually experiences the union of the two substances by the endless impressions he finds in himself. The relation of mind and body in man is an essential one which must not be regarded as a penal state of the soul, but as the accomplishment of its natural perfection. Human thought has duration, succession, a beginning and an end—qualities that depend on the movements of the corporeal organs and which follow the rules of local movement. Although Descartes and Malebranche after him claimed that the human mind is capable of detachment from the body, Desgabets rejected this, since the human mind is not like an angel’s but requires continual commerce with the body and its senses for all its operations.

One further issue concerning Descartes’s general account of the nature of the mind-body union, which Desgabets raised in order to dispel, concerns the common complaint that the Cartesian view fails to account for the interaction of material and immaterial substances. Desgabets did not regard this as a true problem because he thought that the question demanded the impossible—an explanation of how the organized body and reasonable soul, which are in fact made for each other, can exercise a mutual commerce. He likened this to asking an artisan to explain how the convex surface of a peg can possibly fill that of a concave hole. It is akin to asking why extension is the essence of body, or why thought is the essence of mind. It’s just the way God made the world.

What could be explained, according to Desgabets, is the way in which the mind and body are united and dependent upon one another. He found an analogue in the nature of the body-body relation: two bodies are united when their superficies touch and their movements take on a mutual dependence. Similarly, two minds are united when their thoughts and wills agree and depend on one another. The union of mind and body is not by touch, nor by agreement of thoughts, but by the dependence that exists between certain thoughts and certain movements such that one in fact follows from the other. The union of the mind and body in man is so strict that it founds a species of communication for their commerce, in virtue of which our thoughts are said to have duration, succession, etc., without themselves being corporeal. The union and its interaction cannot be further reduced in explanation. In short, the essence of man, who is composed of mind and body, is the union of mind and body, and the only legitimate questions which concern this union relate to how, given the union, the mind determines the body and the body determines the mind, which is an empirical question, known through experience not reason.

Desgabets’s thesis concerning the indefectibility of created substances, which underlies his metaphysics, is perhaps his most original if not radical philosophical contribution (Schmaltz, 2002; Easton, 2005; Gatto, 2017). Gatto argues that this thesis is the key to understanding Desgabets’s peculiar development of Descartes’s philosophy (Gatto, 2017). In a letter from Desgabets to Malebranche, we learn that he had begun the Treatise on the Indefectibility of Substances, as early as 1649 (Letter from Desgabets, Sept. 1674, Malebranche, 1958–84, vol. II: 85). It was Desgabets’s view that substances, in their essence and existence, are eternal, indivisible, immutable, and indestructible, which is to say, indefectible. While the modes of substance can undergo change, the essence of substance and its existence cannot. According to Desgabets, the indestructibility, eternality, and indivisibility of substances follow from the fact that God created substances by a free and indifferent will. Once the world was created, it could not be uncreated. Thus, the key to understanding Desgabets’s indefectibility thesis lies not only in his analysis of the Cartesian doctrine of substance, but in his interpretation of Descartes’s notoriously opaque doctrine of the free creation of the eternal truths, discussed in a later section, under “Truth.”

We can see Desgabets adoption of the new Cartesian philosophy in his adherence to the core Cartesian metaphysics of dualism, mechanism, and union, and his critique of the Scholastic doctrines. However, his development of the doctrine of matter in the Eucharist controversy, his development of the interaction of mind and body as essential for all operations of the human mind, his development of the doctrine of indefectibility especially with respect to matter, and his defense of the “Creation Doctrine” led to many controversies in his day. Each of these, particularly the metaphysics of the human being as a substantial union of mind and matter whose interaction underlies all our thoughts has some interesting epistemological consequences. It is not surprising that Desgabets was known for his spirit of reform and earned Regis’s title as “one of the greatest metaphysicians of our century.”

3. Epistemology

In Desgabets’s estimation, Descartes’s truly great discovery was his identification of the true nature of sensible qualities (OPD 5: 164). As Desgabets understood it, sensible qualities “… are nothing else in objects but the local dispositions of the small parts from which result the sensations that we call heat, sound, light, etc.” (OPD 2: 17). Moreover, sensible qualities qua modes of the mind have no resemblance or similarity to the modes or accidents of matter. Sensible qualities are states or modes of the human mind having only a causal relation to the specific local movements of our sensory organs, which in turn, are the effects of the local movements produced by the arrangements and local dispositions of parts of matter. Unfortunately, the ontological status of these qualities becomes less clear when they are considered as qualities in objects. In this context, for both Descartes and Desgabets, sensible qualities are “various dispositions” in objects. Since Descartes clearly held that sensible qualties are not the forms of material things but rather modes of the mind, the only sense in which sensible qualites could be “in” the various dispositions of objects is in the causal sense, that is, as their effects. While the status and nature of these dispositions in Descartes’s account has been a subject of much debate, it is clear that he distinguished between such qualities as light, colour, smell, taste, sound and touch, which are sensed or perceived qualities, and other qualities, such as size, shape and motion, which are found in all bodies. Descartes wrote that the former qualities are dispositions which depend on size, shape and motion. So, it would seem that for Descartes, secondary qualities are sensible qualities bearing no resemblance to qualities of matter, while primary qualities are qualities belonging to physical objects.

The importance of this discovery and its interpretation in Desgabets’s thought is paramount, since he believed that because of it, the way had been opened at last to lay the foundations of a true philosophy. Based on Descartes’s conception of matter, and his consequent discovery of the true nature of sensible qualities, Desgabets concluded that our perception of sensible qualities and sensible objects does not constitute knowledge of the true state of exterior things. In fact, sensible qualities and objects considered in relation to their being as modes of the mind are not the true objects of knowledge or of science, since they are only modal beings subject to change. In this, Descartes would concur. But Desgabets went on to argue that all (true) knowledge depends on the senses, and hence on our perception of these sensible qualities and objects; this is a point of great contention in Descartes scholarship, and one of much significance and growing contention in understanding Desgabets’s marriage of Cartesianism and empiricism. The story is a somewhat complicated and intricate, and scholars disagree about the nature of the empiricism. There is a long tradition of interpreting Desgabets as an empiricist from Victor Cousin (1852), and Francisque Bouillier (1868), to Genevieve Rodis-Lewis (1981, 1993), Patricia Easton and Thomas Lennon (1992), Tad Schmaltz (2002a; 2002b) and Sean Allen-Hermenson (2008). Monte Cook (2008) has raised an important challenge to the empiricist reading, questioning whether the senses provide any real content to our ideas. Despite the ongoing disagreements, there is consensus that Desgabets held that the eternal truths are contingent not necessary, rejected hyperbolic doubt and pure intellection, and insisted on the necessary role of sensible signs in the formation of all ideas. Each of these positions leans away from Descartes in varying degrees and while perhaps not a Lockean-type empiricism can be seen as an attempt to develop a position somewhere in between, a kind of Cartesian empiricism.

Desgabets claimed that the corporeal form of all particular bodies results from an assemblage of the local dispositions of matter, and that these dispositions of matter in turn come from extended matter. Thus, in the same way that sensible qualities are nothing outside us but the local dispositions of matter, sensible objects are nothing outside us but assemblages of local dispositions of matter. If sensible qualities such as heat, colour and light are really modes of the mind which have no resemblance to the modes or accidents of matter that cause them then, for the same reason, sensible bodies such as earth, water and animals must also be modes of the mind that have no resemblance to the assemblages of local dispositions of matter that cause them. This is a simple but perspicuous consequence of the Cartesian doctrine of sensible qualities and its conception of matter. It treats particular bodies as assemblages of local dispositions of matter, and it treats sensible bodies as our grasp of those assemblages. Hence, sensible bodies are beings of the mind which are merely caused by assemblages of local dispositions of matter. The analogy between sensible qualities such as heat, light etc., and sensible bodies such as earth, water, animals etc., is meant to be an exact one. Just as sensible qualities are the immediate effects of local dispositions of matter acting upon the senses, sensible bodies are the immediate effects of assemblages of local dispositions of matter acting upon the senses.

Another important consequence of the true nature of sensible qualities is that the senses are not the source of error. This is a theme found in Descartes that depends on an important distinction between the scope of the two basic operations of the mind—that of the intellect and that of the will. The functions of assenting and dissenting are performed only by the will, while those of perception and conception are performed by the senses and intellect. For Desgabets, as for Descartes, simple conception is always true and conforms to its object, while error is a product of precipitous judgement. But unlike Descartes, Desgabets concluded that everything that is conceived of is a simple conception, not just God, soul and body. For Desgabets, a thing truly conceived, actually exists. Errors and so-called beings of reason which are said not to exist outside our conceptions, are not really conceptions, and are “… nothing but a false judgement which extends itself beyond perception. Likewise the failure that is often attributed to the senses is equally nothing but a precipitous judgement by which one says that the senses do not know” (OPD 6: 227). According to Desgabets, after having distinguished simple ideas from judgement in the Third Meditation, Descartes erred gravely in placing chimeras and other such beings of reason among the number of objects of simple conception. It was this that led to Descartes’s fundamental error—the reversal of the basic truth that the first operation of the mind has only real things for its object. By including chimerical beings among the objects of conception Descartes opened the door to the possibility of thoughts without true objects. But, judgement or the extension of the will beyond the domain of what is conceived is the true source of chimeras and error (OPD 4: 103).

All conceptions conform to their object, and error consists in the will forming a judgement beyond conception. On this point, Desgabets’s account of error looks very much like that found in Descartes. However, in Desgabets, the domain of simple conception is less restricted, as is the proper function of the senses. The senses not only serve to determine what is good or harmful in life, but they also serve in knowing the nature of things. However, we often form false judgements of the true nature of the movements experienced by the senses because of their role in preserving life (OPD 6: 228). On Desgabets’s account, it is because the senses serve to promote the preservation of our life by telling us immediately which particular bodies are harmful or profitable that they can not also provide immediate knowledge of the true nature of these movements that impinge upon us. If the senses were such that they gave us immediate knowledge of the true nature of the movements impinging upon them, then they could not tell us at the same time what particular bodies are good or harmful to us. Thoughts are successive, and so the senses, in order to preserve life by warding off immediate and unexpected dangers, must be able to respond first and foremost to the preservation value of a particular object.

This does not mean that the senses cannot access the true nature of things as well. In fact, for Desgabets, since all knowledge comes from the senses, the function of knowing the essences of things is a necessary role served by the senses. Recall that the true nature of particular objects consists in the local dispositions of parts of matter which produce the course of the movements we experience. These movements are the first and sole contact we have with the material world, and so the senses present, in some form, not only the existence of a given object, but first and foremost, the value of that object in relation to our survival. We only reach knowledge of the true nature of material objects by considering their being in relation to their substance. In order to achieve this, we must abstract from all relations of time, and only then see it as it is in itself. What the senses offer us is knowledge of matter in its various divisions, shapes, sizes, etc., that is, as matter exists at a certain time and place. Thus, what Desgabets seemed to have assumed was that the reason we so often err with regard to the true nature of these movements is that we judge precipitously, or too quickly, before the mind has had a chance to conceive of material substance as it is in itself, independent of any temporal or spatial ties. Worth noting is that Desgabets’s explanation for the mind’s natural tendency to judge precipitously derives from the other function of the senses, namely, to immediately grasp the preservation value of a given object.

But what on Desgabets’s account is the difference between a simple conception and a precipitous judgement? What is the criterion for distinguishing one from the other? In his Supplément, he offers the example of imaginary space. When we speak of imaginary space, many are persuaded that it does not include any judgement on their part, but if one looks closely, one sees that the simple object of conception here is space and extension with its perceived dimensions from which we form a judgement concerning its imaginary nature. Similarly, when someone approaches fire and has the sensation of heat, pain or pleasure, he may be persuaded that the heat he feels is in the fire just as he perceives it, since this sensation is known to him clearly. But, he has erred because of a tacit judgement. His conception of the fire and of the heat, as well as of his intervening judgement are all the immediate and true objects of his thought. These all qualify as simple conceptions in so far as they relate to their true object. But, that the heat is in the fire by which it is claimed that the heat in us resembles that of the fire, is a tacit judgement which is false. In this sense, the illusions that are attributed to the senses always involve false judgement. It is a genuine question to ask about a baton partially submerged in water whether it is straight or curved, but whether the baton, straightness, curvature etc., are real things, is not. Simple conceptions are the mind’s grasp of things as they are in themselves, which is to say, in relation to their essence as extended substances, or as thinking minds. Space, as an attribute of matter, is extended in three dimensions, and sensations, as attributes of the mind, are perceptions not qualities of material objects.

This explains what Desgabets meant by his claim that all simple conceptions always have an existent object outside the understanding, since simple conceptions are, in virtue of their relation to substances, of things which actually exist. It is only when one judges of things outside one’s conception that one is erroneously said to conceive something which does not exist. The task in the search after truth, then, is to separate precipitous judgements from judgements based only on what is simply, and hence, actually conceived.

Desgabets drew yet another, final consequence from Descartes’s discovery of the true nature of sensible qualities (and bodies). This consquence bears directly on our ability to see the right path to a true physics which was hitherto impossible. The true physics is one that recognizes that “everything that happens in matter by the different movements and modes of its parts, belongs to mathematics and mechanics, which have all of this for their object” (OPD 5: 166). The object of the true physics is not the substantial forms of the Scholastics, but matter whose essence is extension, and its modes which are nothing else but various divisions and groupings of its parts. Thus, the natural object of the physcists is the same as the solid of the mathematician. The solid of the mathematicians, according to Desgabets, consists in a magnitude that has three dimensions, i.e., length, width, and thickness while the natural body of the physicist consists in a solid substance extended in three dimensions. This is the crowning statement of Desgabets’s metaphysical view that the physical world is really a single object or substance whose parts, under various divisions, shapes and arrangements, form all the appearances in the “grand theatre of nature” (OPD 5: 166).

This, of course, does not make the world, or its particular inhabitants any less real (or any more phenomenal) in Desgabets’s view. Quite to the contrary, Desgabets thought that the foundation he had laid out supports the natural realist in each of us. The individuation of matter into sensible objects is a mode of thought in so far as the mind gives particular objects (local assemblages of dispositions of matter) their extrinsic form, but that such conceived or known objects actually exist outside the understanding by an intrinsic form, as modes or states of matter.

In Part 1, chapter three of the Supplément, Desgabets explicitly examines Descartes’s rejection of the empiricist motto, that all knowledge comes from the senses. While Desgabets rejects the Scholastic rendering of the motto, he is equally critical of Descartes’s precipitous rejection of it. According to Desgabets, the proper sense of the empiricist motto is that all thoughts originate by the senses [a sensu] rather than in the senses [in sensu], and what reaches the intellect is not what is found in the senses. As Lennon nicely puts it, “For him things are directly perceived and an idea is the means by which, and not in which, a thing is perceived” (Lennon, 1998, p. 353). The soul must always be in commerce with the senses, and although our thoughts depend on the corporeal traces in the brain for their source or origin, it does not follow that our ideas must be corporeal, or even similar to corporeal things. The very fact that all of our thoughts have a beginning, duration, cessation, and sucession proves that they depend on motion, and motion is only communicated through the senses. This is why he modifies the empiricist motto from: nihil est in intellectu quin prius fuerit in sensu, to a sensu.

It is not surprising then, that Desgabets argued against Descartes’s “pretention” that he could detach himself from all commerce with the senses, which sets the rationalist tone of the Meditations. Of course, Descartes saw this detachment as desirable because he thought it was in virtue of it that he could defend the certainty of human knowledge. He thought that the soul is known more clearly than the body because we, as thinking things, are intimately tied to the immaterial, thinking substance, which is our soul. The body, on the other hand, is part of material not immaterial substance, and so is not known immediately. It is because of this that Descartes erroneously took the cogito to be the foundation of certainty in human knowledge, and our knowledge of body to be less clear and less immediate. However, according to Desgabets, this is where Descartes goes terribly astray. Had Descartes reflected more deeply on the nature of the mind-body union, he would have seen that our ideas of body and mind are equally clear, and equally evident. For, the soul of man is not an immaterial substance, but a result of the union of mind and body, and all our ideas, even of the soul, equally depend upon the operation of the senses. From here, the new foundation of certainty can be seen to be the principle of intentionality, that to think is to think of something. Clarity and distinctness, according to Desgabets, tells us when we have grasped something truthfully, but the intentionality of thought grounds clarity and distinctness.

According to Desgabets, it is undeniable that man is a being who reasons, draws consequences, does not see things indivisibly, who has thoughts in succession which begin, continue, and finish, and who often experiences doubt and conjecture. Such doubting, discursive reasoning and succession of thought prove that all thought is tied to the body since duration and successive extension are nothing but the local movements of the body (OPD 7: 299). A pure thought, the kind that Descartes (and Malebranche after him) envisioned for metaphysical reasoning, would have no beginning, duration, end, or succession. In short, such a thought would be indivisible, and hence unthinkable by the human mind. Both Descartes and Malebranche rejected the empiricist thesis because they erroneously thought that it would commit them to the materialist thesis that thoughts and the soul are material. This led them to adopt the intellectualist thesis regarding the mind’s perception of metaphysical essences. However, Desgabets saw a third option, one which is founded on the mind-body union and the sensory basis of all knowledge, and one which founds the proper sense of the empiricist motto, that all ideas originate by the senses.

Desgabets, having declared that all thoughts depend on movement, was especially concerned to defend his empiricist thesis against charges of materialism. Since movement is a mode belonging to body, many tended to conclude that if minds depend on movement, then minds must have something corporeal in them. How could it be that our thoughts, which have something corporeal in them, namely, movement, are not themselves corporeal? And yet, this is exactly what Desgabets argued. He believed that thoughts have something corporeal in their being without themselves being corporeal—in the same way that every object in our thought has a beginning, continuation, and end without these objects having duration in themselves. While things really have duration, it is only extrinsically and by thought, “the same way a pole is divided into ten feet when one imagines the ten feet” (OPD 7: 299).

At first glance, Desgabets’s analogy between attributing a corporeal nature to thoughts and attributing a duration or division to things serves more to confuse than clarify. But if we draw on his earlier point about the true nature of individual bodies, we can make some sense of it. Recall that individual bodies are real in that they result from the division of matter by motion into assemblages of local dispositions of parts of matter. Bodies then act upon our sensory organs which in turn are received as ideas in the mind. But the individuation of perception into sensible ideas of bodies is essentially an operation performed by the mind, even though it has its foundation in the local dispositions of matter itself. For example, our perception of a ten foot pole is the effect of a specific assemblage of local dispositions of matter acting upon our sensory organs at a certain time and the mind’s division of that sensible body into ten feet. The local disposition itself is not intrinsically a pole, or ten feet long, but it is so extrinsically, that is, by thought. Similarly, thoughts themselves are not intrinsically extended or subject to movement, but they are so extrinsically, that is, as an effect of the operations of the sensory organs of the body. In other words, just as the local movements of matter individuate thought extrinsically giving the mind individual thoughts, the thought of immaterial substance individuates matter extrinsically thereby giving it perceptions of individual bodies. The mind-body union, and the essential intentionality which results from it, create the mutual dependence of the operations of mind and matter without requiring that mind be material or matter be immaterial.

This is at the heart of Desgabets’s “fundamental truth,” that for the proper use of reason we must recognize that all our ideas or simple conceptions have a real object outside of it, which is in itself what is represented by thought, and which actually contains the degree of being that one sees there. If individual bodies and sensible objects are modal beings in the sense claimed by Desgabets then there is no cleavage between object and object known because they are one and the same thing. What is represented to our thought is the real object of knowledge, namely, material and spiritual substance, but what we sense are these substances as they exist in time, or in other words, as they exist at a given time by thought in virtue of the particular local dispositions of matter.

4. Truth

According to Desgabets, Descartes’s fine doctrine concerning the creation of the eternal truths, is the foundation of the true (Cartesian) philosophy. He claimed that had Descartes attended consistently to this doctrine, he would have avoided all error. Due to its importance and opaqueness in Desgabets’s writings, the “Creation Doctrine” has generated a great deal of examination and debate, most recently stimulated by Beaude’s and Rodis-Lewis’s publication of Desgabets’s philosophical writings (Desgabets, 1981). Rodis Lewis (1981) and Lennon (1998) set the stage for the dialectic of the debates in the period. Schmaltz (2002), Cook (2005), Faye (2005), and Easton (2009) variously argue for the importance of the doctrine in Desgabets’s development of the Cartesian philosophy, and its philosophical significance. Gatto (2017) presents a nice synthesis of the literature, and sorts out the complicated reception and role of Descartes’s doctrine, particularly for Desgabets. Despite the controversies surrounding the interpretation and significance of this doctrine, there are some points of agreement. As Desgabets understood it, it requires that God be equally the author of all created things, in their being and their essence. It requires that there be no essence without existence, which is to say, that there can be no purely possible beings either in the human mind as Descartes allowed, or in God’s mind, as Malebranche argued. The notion that such truths are in some way prior to God’s creation of the world, existing as purely possible essences separate from actual existence, involves a separation of essence from existence, and supposes that essence is something actually separable and conceivable without existence.

Truth, which exists only by the relation of conformity of thought to its object, is contingent in that it depends on God’s will in his free creation of the universe. Truth is eternal in its independence from time or temporal variations, and it is immutable in that once God wills the world, things never change in respect to their substance but only in respect to their modes of being. Although we must wait to know what things God actually created, we are guaranteed of the truth of our ideas since it is the object itself that determines what we perceive. Truth is necessary in that God gives all objects He creates an irrevocable being, but it is contingent in relation to His absolute and unlimited power. God is the equal author of the essence and the existence of things He created, He “… gave them their essence and their existence which are equally contingent, and which once received, are nevertheless possessed by them irrevocably” (OPD 6: 249). Desgabets’s voluntarism, then, is a qualified one, for though the eternal truths depend upon God for their existence as their primary cause, they are no less indefectible, that is, they are unchangeable in their substantial being.

The tenets that Desgabets drew from the Creation Doctrine show us where Desgabets parts ways with Descartes on many points. For example, Descartes erroneously concludes in Meditation V that essences, such as the true and immutable nature of a triangle, can exist separately from material existence as a purely possible being. According to Desgabets’s strict adherence to the Creation Doctrine, “… objects precede truth in the order of nature,” such that, “… it is impossible that there be a triangle separate from its existence, or that the whole be greater than its part if there is no whole or parts, which is to say in a word, that our principle is found yet more true, and it is impossible to think of nothing” (OPD 6: 232). The Creation Doctrine also grounds Desgabets’s treatment of the senses as the foundation of all knowledge, and his view that the substances are indefectible. Although at times elusive, the unity of Desgabets’s thought can be seen in his defense of the Creation Doctrine.

To conclude, when we view Desgabets’s work as a whole, there is no doubt that what he viewed as a revision or perfection of the Cartesian philosophy others have argued are a fundamental departure. In his favor, he never strayed from the Cartesian metaphysics of substance dualism, substance-mode ontology, mind-body union and interaction, and the view that extension is the essence of matter and thought the essence of mind. He remained loyal to the Cartesian physics against the atomists. Moreover, and perhaps heretically to some, he strongly rejected the rationalist epistemology which often dominates in Descartes, and argued that Descartes’s own principles favor a sensory foundation for knowledge.


Primary Texts

  • Cordemoy, Gérauld de, 1968, Oeuvres philosophiques, eds. Pierre Clair & François Girbal, Paris: Presses Universitaires de France. [This work includes letter written by Desgabets (1666) in which he argued against the atomist thesis of Cordemoy.]
  • –––, 1666, Discernement du corps et de l’âme, Paris.
  • Desgabets, Robert, 1668, “Discourse de la communication ou transfusion du sang,” published with, “Lettre ècrite à M. Sorbière,” by J. B. Denis, Paris. [This is a scientific piece in which Desgabets described an apparatus and procedure for blood transfusion of his own invention.]
  • –––, 1671, Considérations sur l’état présent de la controverse touchant le Très Saint-Sacrement de l’autel, published anonymously, Holland. [This is the work that stirred a great deal of controversy for Cartesians, which is not surprising given the theologically sensitive nature of the thesis that the body of Christ is actually present (extended) in the host.]
  • –––, 1675, Critique de la Critique de la Recherche de la vérité, Paris.
  • –––, 1983, Oeuvres philosophiques inédites, Analecta Cartesiana 2, ed., J. Beaude with introduction by G. Rodis-Lewis, Amsterdam: Quadratures.
  • Malebranche, N., 1958–84, Œuvres complètes de Malebranche, A. Robinet (ed.), 20 vols. Paris: J. Vrin.
  • Régis, Pierre-Sylvain, 1704, L’usage de la raison et de la foi, Paris.

Selected Studies and Critical Discussions

  • Allen-Hermanson, S., 2008, “Desgabets: Rationalist or Cartesian Empiricist?,” in Topics in Early Modern Philosophy, Jon Miller (ed.), Studies in the History of Philosophy of Mind, 9: 57–85.
  • Andriaenssen, Han Thomas, 2015, “The Radical Cartesianism of Robert Desgabets and The Scholastic Heritage,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 23(1): 46–68.
  • Armogathe, J.-R., 1977, Theologia Cartesiana: L’Explication physique de l’Euchariste chez Descartes et dom Desgabets, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.
  • Beaude, Joseph, 1974, “Desgabets et son oeuvre,” Revue de sythèse, 95: 7–17.
  • –––, 1979, “Cartésianisme et anticartésianisme de Desgabets,” Studia Cartesiana 1, Amsterdam: Quadratures, pp. 1–24.
  • –––, 1980, “Le Guide de la raison naturelle dans l’oeuvre de Desgabets,” Recherches sur le XVIIe siècle IV, Paris: Centre National de la Recherche scientifique.
  • Bouillier, F., 1868, L’Histoire de la philosophie cartésienne, Paris, 3rd ed.
  • Cook, Monte, 2008, “Desgabets As a Cartesian Empiricist,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 46(4): 501–516.
  • –––, 2005, “Desgabets on the Creation of Eternal Truths,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 43(1): 21–36.
  • –––, 2002, “Robert Desgabets’s Representation Principle,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 40(2): 189–200.
  • Cousin, Victor, 1852, Fragments de philosophie cartésienne, Paris: Didier; reprinted 1970, Geneva: Slatkine Reprints. [Volume III includes selections from unpublished manuscripts which contain discussions by Retz, Malebranche, and Corbinelli of Desgabets’s revision and extension of Descartes’s philosophy.]
  • Easton, Patricia, 2005, “Desgabets’s Indefectibility Thesis — a Step Too Far?”, in Receptions of Descartes, Tad M. Schmaltz (ed.), pp. 27–41, London: Routledge.
  • Faye, Emmanuel, 2005, “The Cartesianism of Desgabets and Arnauld and the Problem of the Eternal Truths”, in Daniel Garber (ed.), Oxford Studies in Early Modern Philosophy (Volume II), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 193–209.
  • Gatto, Alfred, 2017, “La Puissance Épuisée. Robert Desgabets et les Vérités Éternelles,” in Recherches Philosophiques, Toulouse: Revue de la Faculté de Philosophie de l’institute Catholique, pp. 129–152.
  • Hill, Jonathan, 2011, “Berkeley’s Missing Argument: The Sceptical Attack on Intentionality,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 19(1): 47–77.
  • Lemaire, Paul, 1901, Le Cartésianisme chez les Bénédictins: Dom Robert Desgabets son système, son influence et son école, Paris: Alcan.
  • Lennon, Thomas M, and Easton, Patricia A, 1992, The Cartesian Empiricism of François Bayle, New York: Garland.
  • –––, 1998, “The Cartesian Dialectic of Creation,” in M. Ayers and D. Garber (eds.), The Cambridge History of Seventeenth Century Philosophy, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 1994, “The Problem of Individuation among the Cartesians” in K. F. Barber, & J. J. E. Gracia (eds.), Individuation and Identity in Early Modern Philosophy, Albany: SUNY Press.
  • Miller, Timothy, 2008, “Desgabets on Cartesian Minds,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 16(4): 723–745.
  • Prost, Jean, 1907, Essai sur l’atomisme et l’occasionalisme dans la philosophie cartésienne, Paris. [This work includes useful material on Desgabets’s critique of Cordemoy’s atomism, and his rejection of occasionalism.]
  • Robinet, André, 1974, “Dom Robert Desgabets, le conflit philosophique avec Malebranche et son l’oeuvre métaphysique,” Journée Desgabets, Revue de synthèse, 95: 65–83. (“Dom Robert Desgabets, his Philosophical Conflict with Malebranche and His Metaphysical Work.”) (This artical examines Desgabets’s influence on Malebranche which is found in Malebranche’s views on occasionalism, the non-materiality of thoughts, and the nature of the eternal truths.)
  • Rodis-Lewis, Géneviève, 1993, “Der Cartesianismus in Frankreich,” Grundriss der Geschichte der Philosophie, Die Philosophie des 17. Jahrhunderts, Band II, Basel/Struttgart, pp. 398–445.
  • –––, 1981, “Polémiques sur la création des possibles et sur l’impossible dans l’école cartésienne.” Studia Cartesiana 2, Amsterdam: Quadratures, pp. 105–123.
  • –––, 1974, “L’écrit de Desgabets sur la transfusion du sang et sa place dans les polémiques contemporaines,” Journée de Desgabets Revue de synthèse, 95: 31–64.
  • Schmaltz, Tad M., 2017, Early Modern Cartesianisms: Dutch and French Constructions, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2002a, Radical Cartesianism: The French Reception of Descartes, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2002b, “The Cartesian Refutation of Idealism”, British Journal for the History of Philosophy, 10(4): 513–540.
  • –––, 1999, “What Has Cartesianism To Do with Jansenism?”, Journal of the History of Ideas, 60(1): 37–56.
  • Scribano, Emanuela, 2003, “Foucher and the Dilemmas of Representation: A ‘Modern’ Problem?” in Gianni Paganini (ed.), The Return of Scepticism from Hobbes and Descartes to Bayle, Dordrecht: Kluwer, 197–212.
  • Watson, Richard A., 1982, “Transubstantiation among the Cartesians,” in T. M. Lennon, J. M. Nicholas, and J. W. Davis (eds.), Problems of Cartesianism, Kingston and Montreal: McGill-Queens University Press, pp. 127-148.
  • –––, 1987, The Breakdown of Cartesian Metaphysics, Atlantic Highlands, NJ: Humanities Press.
  • –––, 1966, The Downfall of Cartesianism 1673–1712, The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff.

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