Notes to John Dewey
1. On Dewey’s reaction to Peirce’s classes, see Dykhuizen 1973: 30–31.
2. “To biology is due the conception of organism”, Dewey wrote. In his view, it was leading psychology to recognize
mental life as an organic unitary process developing according to the laws of all life, and not a theatre for the exhibition of independent autonomous faculties…[or] isolated, atomic sensations and ideas. (“The New Psychology”, 1884, EW1: 56)
3. “The idea of environment”, Dewey wrote,
is a necessity to the idea of organism, and with the conception of environment comes the impossibility of considering psychical life as an individual, isolated thing developing in a vacuum [but must also draw upon the nascent] sciences of the origin and development of the various spheres of man’s activity. (“The New Psychology”, 1884, EW1: 56–57)
4. Thus, Dewey proposed to leave behind the reflex arc’s patchwork of stimuli-responses for the more flexible notion of circuits, the continual reconstitution and adjustment of organisms-in-environments. Begin, he argued, not with the specious “stimulus” (e.g., “seeing”), but with acts or “sensori-motor coordinations”, e.g., seeing-for-reaching (“The Reflex Arc”, 1896, EW5: 100). The “response” which follows is also thickened; rather than just “reaching” it is reaching-guided-by-seeing. Acts occurs in and through an environment, one which presents both surprises and problems productive of growth.
5. Whitehead labeled this error the “Fallacy of Misplaced Concreteness”. [see entry on Alfred North Whitehead].
6. “Any impulse may become organized into almost any disposition according to the way it interacts with surroundings. Fear may become abject cowardice, prudent caution, reverence for superiors or respect for equals” (HNC, MW14: 69).
7. Earlier figures such as Hume used habit to explain how impressions eventually lead to complicated things and events. But while Hume resigned to call habit a “mysterious tie”, Dewey pointed to the advances of science to assert that “the development of biological knowledge has now done away with the ‘mysterious’ quality of the tie” (LTI, LW12: 244).
8. On experience, post-EN, see “The Inclusive Philosophic Idea” (1928, LW3), “Qualitative Thought” (1930c, LW5), “Context and Thought” (1931, LW6), “Time and Individuality” (1940b, LW14), Logic: The Theory of Inquiry (1938c, LW12), “Experience, Knowledge and Value: A Rejoinder” (1939c, LW14), “Experience and Existence: A Comment” (1949, LW16).
9. Retaining “experience” as term central to his philosophy was risky for Dewey, as it already had a range of meanings ensconced in western philosophy. He chose this path rather than go down the (Whiteheadian or Heideggerian) path of neologisms. The challenge for Dewey’s readers is to avoid falling back into older, habitual connotations; indeed, Dewey quite often intends something radically different, even converse, to those older senses. Alas, the term caused no end of confusion for Dewey; in 1951, in an early draft of a new introduction to EN, he expressed a desire to substitute “culture” for “experience” because of, he said,
my growing realization that the historical obstacles which prevented understanding of my use of “experience” are, for all practical purposes, insurmountable.
However, he added,
I still believe that on theoretical, as distinct from historical, grounds there is much to be said in favor of using “experience” to designate the inclusive subject-matter which characteristically “modern” (post-medieval) philosophy breaks up into the dualisms of subject and object, mind and the world, psychological and physical. If “experience” is to designate the inclusive subject-matter it must designate both what is experienced and the ways of experiencing it. (EN, LW1: 361–62)
Dewey also discussed substituting the phrases “life-behavior” or “life-activities” for experience. See “Experience and Existence: A Comment” (1949, LW16: 386–87).
10. For decades, Rorty rebuked Dewey for his notion of "experience," claiming it was both too vague and also superfluous to his criticisms of the tradition and instrumentalist theory of knowledge. In Rorty’s view, Dewey invented an intermediary between organism and environment, and lapsed into the very foundationalist habits he decried; experience was, Rorty said, a fifth wheel, a thing-in-itself made to battle dualisms (see Rorty 1995: 219 n.10; 1977 [1982: 79–80]). Toward the end of his own life, Rorty’s distaste reached a zenith: “I regard [Dewey’s theory of experience] as the worst part of Dewey. I’d be glad if he had never written Experience and Nature” (Rorty 2006: 20). Rorty’s student and leading neopragmatist Robert Brandom has also denounced the term.
11. See Democracy and Education:
Mere activity does not constitute experience….Experience as trying involves change, but change is meaningless transition unless it is consciously connected with the return wave of consequences which flow from it. When an activity is continued into the undergoing of consequences, when the change made by action is reflected back into a change made in us, the mere flux is loaded with significance. We learn something. (DE, MW9: 146)
12. Other texts explicating this crucial distinction include “The Postulate of Immediate Empiricism” (1905, MW3), Experience and Nature (LW1, especially 26–27); “Qualitative Thought” (1930, LW5, especially 211–12); and Logic: The Theory of Inquiry, LW12, especially 74–75). Dewey is not denying the existence of objects as known; he is denying that all that exists must exist as known:
Things that are had in experience exist prior to reflection and its eventuation in an object of knowledge; but the latter, as such, is a deliberately effected re-arrangement or re-disposition, by means of overt operations, of such antecedent existences. (1930, “In Reply to Some Criticisms”, LW5: 212)
13. Dewey’s name for this method varies; he calls it, alternately, the “experiential”, “empirical”, and “denotative” method, among others.
14. As Browning puts it, “bedrock” is meant to
emphasize the fact that there is nothing more basic or more radical in [any philosopher’s] philosophical systems than this, nothing in their metaphysics, their political philosophy, their epistemology, their methodology, and so on. (Browning 1998: 74)
15. “Postulate of Immediate Empiricism” (1905, MW3) rejected both the idea of a reality-in-itself and knowing as affording special access to reality, “The Subject-matter of Metaphysical Inquiry” (1915, MW8) rejected any metaphysics concerned with extra-natural or ultimate causes, but created room for one describing “irreducible traits found in any an every subject of scientific inquiry” (1915, MW8: 4), and Essays in Experimental Logic’s “Introduction” (1916, MW10) detailed the “primary character of non-reflectional experience” and how the “intellectual element is set in a context which is non-cognitive”. This context, called a “situation”, enlarges as a central metaphysical term in later work. Situations have both structure and are “saturated with a pervasive quality” (1916, MW10: 322, 323).
16. In some very obvious ways, Dewey’s is a metaphysics of process. Events, growth, transformation, and change are central, and Dewey clearly repudiates object or substance-oriented approaches. But because he also insists on the method of experience, any “sizing up” of reality will be done from a particular standpoint that is personal, cultural, and historical. Thus, it is incorrect to say, simply, that Dewey “inverts” traditional metaphysics by substituting “events” for “objects”, since the primary “sin” of metaphysics is the assumption of a “God’s-eye view” on reality and, almost inevitably, a reductionistic approach to everything subsumed for explanation.
17. Thomas Alexander proposes that EN covers traits such as
situation, precarious/stable, qualitative immediacy, relational mediation, interaction or transaction (exemplified in communication), selectivity or individuality, continuity and emergence, field (fringe to focus, exemplified in consciousness), realization or the consummatory (exemplified in art), and value (intelligent conduct). (Alexander forthcoming; see also Myers forthcoming)
18. See also “Context and Thought”, where Dewey wrote,
Philosophy is criticism; criticism of the influential beliefs that underlie culture; a criticism which traces the beliefs to their generating conditions as far as may be, which tracks them to their results, which considers the mutual compatibility of the elements of the total structure of beliefs. Such an examination terminates, whether so intended or not, in a projection of them into a new perspective which leads to new surveys of possibilities. (1931, LW6: 19)
On Dewey’s metaphysics as “ground map” see Sleeper 1986 and 1992, Boisvert 1988 and 1998a, Fesmire 2015, and Garrison 2005. See also Ortega y Gasset 1966 :
Metaphysics is not a science; it is a construction of the world, and this making a world out of what surrounds you is human life. The world, the universe, is not given to man; what is given to him is his circumstances, his surroundings, with their numberless contents. (1969: 121)
19. Reaction to Experience and Nature came from a variety of critics (George Santayana, Morris Cohen, William E. Hocking) who attacked the proposed relation between “experience” and “nature”. Because they perceived EN as framing all non-human nature through the lens of human experience, Dewey was charged with conflating the immediacy of human experience with the way things are in the natural world, outside of human observations and problems. His was an anthropocentric naturalism, which, by exaggerating the “dominance of the foreground” lacked true “natural piety” and failed to regard nature on its own accord (see Santayana 1928, LW3: 367–384).
20. Dewey seemed to be taking two, opposed approaches to reality: on one hand, nature and human nature were to be understood via the empirical sciences. It was the relations involved and not the immediate qualities which gave rise to knowledge. On the other hand, the natural world was to be understood via “experience”. It was the qualities immediately before mind’s self-conscious and rational system responsible for constructing scientific concepts and even the sciences themselves. Was Dewey a materialistic naturalist or objective idealist? Critics saw him as waffling. Moreover, they wondered how Dewey could claim that a single experienced event could consist in both qualities (immediate, unique) and relations (mediated, repeatable)?
21. Bernstein claimed that Dewey’s theory harbored two irreconcilable strains, a “metaphysical strain”, which talked about all existences, and a “phenomenological strain”, which talked about experience. Bernstein argued that Dewey failed to provide a sufficient robust discussion of the principle of continuity, proposed by Dewey as bringing together the experiential and the natural. Thus, for Bernstein, there exists “a deep crack, a basic discontinuity that cuts through his naturalism” (Bernstein 1961: 6). In my view, Thomas Alexander responds successfully to Bernstein’s (and others’) critique in his discussion of Dewey’s “generic traits of existence”. Alexander wrote,
The quest…for the generic traits of existence only makes sense in the context of a culture which has already developed habits of inquiry, reflection and speculation and encountered the problematic questions such pursuits raise…..Even the most abstract reflective enterprises cannot transcend the world or those beings who are reflecting….Dewey seeks here what might be called a transcendental or hermeneutic exploration of reflective experience. What is revealed in the objects of all reflective experience (“theories”) is nothing less than that they have at each and ever moment presupposed the larger world which acts as their ground, their origin, their material and their true end. (Alexander 1987: 89–90)
This response basically rehearses Dewey’s proposal for a new starting point for philosophy, and reflective thought more generally. In other words, the solution to Bernstein’s criticism is already present in Dewey’s “denotative method”.
22. The term “instrumentalism” carries some historical baggage. Some critics complained that Dewey’s “instrumentalism” implied a cheapening of mental reflection — a dismissal of the activity of contemplation, or the reduction of reflection to a primitive means-end calculus, typically for the purpose of economic ends. It is hoped that the account here helps set those impressions aside, again.
23. See Dewey’s 1912 “Contributions to A Cyclopedia of Education.”
[Instrumentalism] falls in line with the growing influence of the theory of evolution, asserting that reality itself is inherently and not merely accidentally and externally in process of continuous transition and transformation, and it connects the theory of knowledge and of logic with this basic fact. It connects with historic spiritual philosophies in its emphasis upon life, and upon biological and dynamic conceptions as more fundamental than purely physical and mathematical ideas. While claiming to be strictly empirical in method, it gives to thought and thought relations (universals) a primary and constructive function which sensational empiricism denied them, and thus claims to have included and explained the factor that historic rationalisms have stood for. In somewhat similar fashion, it claims to mediate between realistic and idealistic theories of knowledge. It holds to reality, prior to cognitive operations and not constructed by these operations, to which knowing, in order to be successful, must adapt itself. (1912, MW7: 328)
24. In “The Fixation of Belief” Peirce investigated the nature of knowing as part of a biological framework, arguing that reflective inquiry arises when organisms confront obstacles, whether these are disruptions of habit or the frustration of unmet needs. The initial phase preceding inquiry is named “doubt”, and the phase of satisfactory resolution, “belief”.
25. James’ pride in the Chicago School pleased Dewey greatly. Writing privately to James in 1903, Dewey says, “I have simply been rendering back in logical vocabulary what was already your own” (Perry 1935: 308–309).
26. Dewey wrote,
When experience is aligned with the life-process and sensations are seen to be points of readjustment, the alleged atomism of sensations totally disappears. With this disappearance is abolished the need for a synthetic faculty of super-empirical reason to connect them. (RIP, MW12: 131–2)
27. About the study of knowledge, Dewey wrote,
We are trying to know knowledge….The procedure which I have tried to follow, no matter with what obscurity and confusion, is to begin with cases of knowledge and to analyze them to discover why and how they are knowledges. Why not take the best authenticated cases of faithful reports which are available, compare them with the sufficiently numerous cases of reports ascertained to be unfaithful and doubtful, and see what we find? (“Realism without Monism or Dualism”, MW13: 60)
28. Dewey places special emphasis on problem formulation, and argued it is too often underestimated.
The way in which the problem is conceived decides what specific suggestions are entertained and which are dismissed; what data are selected and which rejected; it is the criterion for relevancy and irrelevancy of hypotheses and conceptual structures. (LTI, LW12: 112)
29. Again, this stage is crucial for its ability to return us to problems: Dewey wrote,
As philosophers, our disagreements as to conclusions are trivial compared with our disagreement as to problems. To see the problem another sees, in the same perspective and at the same angle—that amounts to something. Agreement in solutions is in comparison perfunctory. To experience the same problem another feels—that perhaps is agreement. (“Beliefs and Existences”, 1905 Presidential Address American Philosophical Association, in MW3: 99)
30. In “Philosophy and Civilization”, Dewey wrote,
The life of all thought is to effect a junction at some point of the new and the old, of deep-sunk customs and unconscious dispositions, that are brought to the light of attention by some conflict with newly emerging directions of activity. (LW3: 6)
31. “Only by wrestling with the conditions of the problem at first hand, seeking and finding his own way out, does [the student] think. When the parent or teacher has provided the conditions which stimulate thinking and has taken a sympathetic attitude toward the activities of the learner by entering into a common or conjoint experience, all has been done which a second party can do to instigate learning” (DE, MW9: 167).
32. About their teaching at the Laboratory School, two colleagues wrote:
Like Alice, [the teacher] must step with her children behind the looking glass and in this imaginative land she must see all things with their eyes and limited by their experience; but, in time of need, she must be able to recover her trained vision and from the realistic point of view of an adult supply the guide posts of knowledge and the skills of method. (Katherine Camp Mayhew and Anna Camp Edwards, 1936, The Dewey School, p. 312; cited in Westbrook 1991: 101)
33. One proposal of Dewey’s for integrating school and society organized pedagogy around community-based “occupational projects” (such as creating a meal, beginning from the growing of the basic ingredients, traveling to stores to purchase tools, etc.) Such “occupational projects”, not to be confused with vocational education, directly involved students with experimental inquiry and the need to “take an active share in the personal building up of his own problems and to participate in methods of solving them” (“Democracy in Education”, MW3: 237).
34. Dewey preferred to speak of “intelligence” rather than “reason”, not least because of philosophy’s propensity to set reason against desire, emotion, and passion. Richard Bernstein comments,
[Dewey] preferred to speak about intelligence and intelligent action. Intelligence is not the name of a special faculty. Rather, it designates a cluster of habits and dispositions that includes attentiveness to details, imagination, and passionate commitment. What is most essential for Dewey is the embodiment of intelligence in everyday practices. (Bernstein 2010: 85)
35. A reasonable starting list of Dewey’s principal ethical writings would include his Ethics (1908, MW5, revised 1932, LW7, co-authored with James H. Tufts) as well as Human Nature and Conduct (1922, HNC, MW14) and Theory of Valuation (1939, LW13); the essay “Three Independent Factors in Morals” (1930, TIF, LW5: 279–88) is also very significant. Dewey’s writings cover a range of ethical approaches which cover descriptive ethics, metaethics, normative ethics, and applied ethics. Perhaps most distinctive among his efforts is his theory of moral experience.
36. Dewey offered no comprehensive, situation-independent, theory about permanent values or goods. He thought that expecting permanent solutions to ongoing and novel moral perplexities was regressive and unscientific. In the case of values, as well as in the case of actions, the proper response to a perplexity is inquiry, which can reconsider and reconstruct goods, values, and ends (E-rev, LW7: 164). Dewey did distinguish immediate experiences of value and reflective judgments about value — but was quick to insist that one must not confuse the first (a had enjoyment of a value) with the second (a reflective endorsement of it) (QC, LW4: 207–08). In brief, there is no intuitive way to permanently identify an “is” from an “ought” because each instance always manifests in a specific, problematic situation. In such situations, the best course is intelligent inquiry combining a radically empirical attention to the present with the best past understanding about what has already been discovered to be valuable. Dewey wrote,
In short, a truly moral (or right) act is one which is intelligent in an emphatic and peculiar sense; it is a reasonable act. It is not merely one which is thought of, and thought of as good, at the moment of action, but one which will continue to be thought of as “good” in the most alert and persistent reflection. (E, MW5: 278–79)
37. In morals, Dewey wrote,
The end is….the active process of transforming the existent situation. Not perfection as a final goal, but the ever-enduring process of perfecting, maturing, refining is the aim in living. Honesty, industry, temperance, justice, like health, wealth and learning, are not goods to be possessed as they would be if they expressed fixed ends to be attained. They are directions of change in the quality of experience. Growth itself is the only moral “end”. (RIP, MW12: 181)
38. Dewey, along with his colleague G.H. Mead, developed a conception of the self as social. A cumulative process of socialization, involving many activities but especially discourse contributes to and constitutes who we are as individuals. Dewey wrote,
Cooperation, in all kinds of enterprises, interchange of services and goods, participation in social arts, associations for various purposes, institutions of blood, family, government, and religion, all add enormously to the individual’s power. On the other hand, as he enters into these relations and becomes a “member” of all these bodies he inevitably undergoes a transformation in his interests. Psychologically the process is one of building up a “social” self. Imitation and suggestion, sympathy and affection, common purpose and common interest, are the aids in building such a self. (E, MW5: 16; see also 388).
39. The ethical traditions’ approach to conflict was, for Dewey, a crucial (and damning) commonality between them.
Whatever may be the differences which separate moral theories, all postulate one single principle as an explanation of moral life. Under such conditions, it is not possible to have either uncertainty or conflict: morally speaking, the conflict is only specious and apparent. Conflict is, in effect, between good and evil, justice and injustice, duty and caprice, virtue and vice, and is not an inherent part of the good, the obligatory, the virtuous. (TIF, LW5: 280)
40. Dewey, recall, took aim at this fundamental metaphysical prejudice (equating what is real with what is certain) in EN. His naturalism accepts that existence (not just subjective perception) really is a mixture of the “precarious” and “stable”. Insofar as we are natural actors in a natural world, this is also where ethical theory should start rather than trying to purify out a single chief value or end. In HNC, Dewey wrote,
Potentially conduct is one hundred per cent of our acts. Hence we must decline to admit theories which identify morals with the purification of motives, edifying character, pursuing remote and elusive perfection, obeying supernatural command, acknowledging the authority of duty. Such notions have a dual bad effect. First they get in the way of observation of conditions and consequences. They divert thought into side issues. Secondly, while they confer a morbid exaggerated quality upon things which are viewed under the aspect of morality, they release the larger part of the acts of life from serious, that is moral, survey. Anxious solicitude for the few acts which are deemed moral is accompanied by edicts of exemption and baths of immunity for most acts. A moral moratorium prevails for everyday affairs. (HNC, MW14: 194)
41. Dewey wrote that improving ethics as a process meant improving
the ability to make delicate distinctions, to perceive aspects of good and of evil not previously noticed, to take into account the fact that doubt and the need for choice impinge at every turn. (TIF, LW5: 280)
By advancing in these empirical ways, Dewey noted, theory goes beyond mere conceptual analysis or exhortation and reveals alternatives and their consequences. Theory serves as “an instrument for rendering deliberation more effective and hence choice more intelligent” (E-rev, LW7: 316).
42. On the sources germane to ethical theory, see “Ethics” (MW3: 41), E-rev (LW7: 179–180). Dewey rarely fails to keep some of the elements of past philosophies. Philosophers such as Plato, Hume, and Kant (to name three) reward inquiry with their ability to
reveal the complexity of moral situations…[so as] to bring to light some phase of [our] moral life demanding reflective attention, and which, save for it, might have remained hidden. (E-rev, LW7: 180)
43. On dramatic rehearsal, Dewey wrote,
We give way, in our mind, to some impulse; we try, in our mind, some plan….[W]e find ourselves in imagination in the presence of the consequences that would follow; and as we then like and approve, or dislike and disapprove, these consequences, we find the original impulse or plan good or bad. Deliberation is dramatic and active, not mathematical and impersonal. (E, MW5: 292, 293)
44. As he laid out in his psychology, education, and ethical writings, political (and economic) individuals are not ontologically prior to social groups but exist in and through transactions with them. “Assured and integrated individuality is the product of definite social relationships and publicly acknowledged functions” (ION, LW5: 67). While everyone has private thoughts and experiences, these are not proofs against the sociality inherent in individual experience for it is “only in social groups does a person have a chance to develop individuality” (“Individuality in Education”, MW15: 176). Nevertheless, Dewey is on guard against the absorption of the individual into the larger social collective, which he sees as destructive of individuals-as-as such. Against domineering social systems, Dewey wrote,
Individuality is inexpugnable because it is a manner of distinctive sensitivity, selection, choice, response and utilization of conditions. For this reason, if for no other, it is impossible to develop integrated individuality by any all-embracing system or program. (ION, LW5: 121)
45. Dewey wrote,
[E]very generation has to accomplish democracy over again for itself; that its very nature, its essence, is something that cannot be handed on from one person or one generation to another, but has to be worked out in terms of needs, problems and conditions of the social life of which, as the years go by, we are a part, a social life that is changing with extreme rapidity from year to year. (“Democracy and Education in the World of Today”, 1938a, LW13: 299)
46. Dewey wrote:
Democracy is the faith that the process of experience is more important than any special result attained, so that special results achieved are of ultimate value only as they are used to enrich and order the ongoing process. Since the process of experience is capable of being educative, faith in democracy is all one with faith in experience and education. All ends and values that are cut off from the ongoing process become arrests, fixations. They strive to fixate what has been gained instead of using it to open the road and point the way to new and better experiences. (“Creative Democracy”, 1939b, LW14: 229)
Dewey’s trust in the average person’s experience was a point he vigorously debated with, especially, Walter Lippmann (See PP and Lippmann 1922, 1925).
47. In 1930, Dewey writes of a profound crisis engulfing modern persons, the “lost individual” of his famous chapter in Individualism (ION, LW5: 66–76). A number of impingements — mass production and consumption, the hegemony of business institutions, exponential increases of information produced by journalism, e.g. — were speeding up the pace of life, fomenting economic insecurity, and undermining “the loyalties which once held individuals, which gave them support, direction and unity of outlook on life” (ION, LW5: 66). Writing just after the Great Depression, Dewey diagnosed these corrosive conditions as “an acute maladjustment between individuals and [their] social conditions”. “Where fears abound”, he wrote, “courageous and robust individuality is undermined” (ION, LW5: 68, 66–67).
48. Early colonists’ opposition to government power had backfired, Dewey argued, because merely calling for restrain (“negative liberty”) had elevated the “wants and endeavors of private individuals seeking personal gain to the place of supreme authority in social life” (“Authority and Social Change”, LW11: 136). Thus, liberalism,
in the very act of asserting that it stood completely and loyally for the principle of individual freedom, was really engaged in justifying the activities of a new form of concentrated [economic power, which]…has consistently and persistently denied effective freedom to the economically underpowered and underprivileged. (“Authority”, LW11: 136)
See also “Freedom” (LW11: 247, 248).
49. A renascent liberalism would be flexible, hypothetical, and consistently oriented toward empirical inquiries about presently experienced problems (“A Liberal Speaks Out for Liberalism”, LW11: 287). Liberalism would serve a “mediating function” to help social actions in effecting “a working connection between old habits, customs, institutions, beliefs, and new conditions” (LSA, LW11: 37).
50. Dewey wrote,
A right is never a claim to a wholesale, indefinite activity, but to a defined activity; to one carried on, that is, under certain conditions….The individual is free; yes, that is his right. But he is free to act only according to certain regular and established conditions. That is the obligation imposed upon him. He has a right to use public roads, but he is obliged to turn in a certain way. He has a right to use his property, but he is obliged to pay taxes, to pay debts, not to harm others in its use, and so on. (E, MW5: 394)
51. The whole passage is worth citing. Dewey wrote,
Art is the living and concrete proof that man is capable of restoring consciously, and thus on the plane of meaning, the union of sense, need, impulse and action characteristic of the live creature. The intervention of consciousness adds regulation, power of selection, and re-disposition. Thus it varies the arts in ways without end. But its intervention also leads in time to the idea of art as a conscious idea—the greatest intellectual achievement in the history of humanity. (AE, LW10: 31)
52. Regarding ontology, Dewey’s anti-essentialist answer to “What is art?” is that as experience, art is not simply locatable in an object, or event, or subject. Rather, “art” denotes the interaction of (a) making (artist activity), (b) an event or thing (song, painting, etc.) and (c) an appreciator (listener, viewer, etc.). He distinguishes (b) as “art products” (the physical object, e.g.) but says that “the real work of art” is (a)+(b)+(c): “the building up of an integral experience out of the interaction of organic and environmental conditions and energies” (AE, LW10: 70; see also 167, 218, 223). Regarding interpretation and criticism, their function complements the experiential definition of art; they are situational and fallible, never seeking final, definitive judgments about a work’s meaning or value. Their aim is to widen and deepen aesthetic experience. “The function of criticism”, Dewey wrote,
is the reeducation of perception of works of art; it is an auxiliary in the process, a difficult process, of learning to see and hear….The way to help [someone seeking to understand art] is through the expansion of his own experience by the work of art to which criticism is subsidiary. (AE, LW10: 328)
53. In Dewey’s terminology, “an” or “consummatory” experience is conscious, deeply meaningful, and integrated as a whole. Its character is unique enough that we recognize it as distinct and special. The opposite kind of experience he called “anesthetic”, and it is marked by a dispersed, inchoate, or even hum-drum quality (AE, LW10: 42, 47).
54. As with psychology, education, morality, and other subject matters, Dewey looked to organic sources to understand art’s functions and effects. Art engages our physical, sensory, and psychic abilities, and what we call an “aesthetic experience” is the result of an organism-environment transaction. “In a growing life”, Dewey wrote,
the recovery [of unison with the environment] is never mere return to a prior state, for it is enriched by the state of disparity and resistance through which it has successfully passed. (AE, LW10: 19)
These facts, he says, “reach to the roots of the esthetic in experience”, for when life is able to survive and grow,
there is an overcoming of factors of opposition and conflict; there is a transformation of them into differentiated aspects of a higher powered and more significant life. (AE, LW10: 20)
Aesthetic concepts and fine-grained meanings are rooted, then, in the organism’s rhythmic and ongoing adjustments of sense. This supplies aesthetics with a natural basis and sets the task for a theory of art: explain how aesthetic phenomena (including artworks) are implicit in everyday experience, and how they might be expanded.
55. Dewey’s examples press these connections. One can find the same kind of aesthetic experience in a museum’s painting, Dewey says, by looking to experience,
in the raw…in the events and scenes that hold the attentive eye and ear of man, arousing his interest and affording him enjoyment as he looks and listens: the sights that hold the crowd—the fire-engine rushing by; the machines excavating enormous holes in the earth; the human-fly climbing the steeple-side; the men perched high in air on girders, throwing and catching red-hot bolts. (AE, LW10: 10–11)
56. Dewey rejected “militant atheism” for its dogmatic assurance that humans were alone in an alien and hostile world; such a view lacked “natural piety”, a felt sensitivity to one’s place in the larger environment. All could cultivate this kind of piety and it is necessary, Dewey argued, for moral growth (ACF, LW9: 18).
57. Dewey’s views about religious experience echo others about aesthetic experience, where experiences possessing uniquely qualitative characters become entangled with outmoded conceptual structures and institutions (museum, church, etc.). Emancipating such experiences could, Dewey thought, allow them to inform (and transform) more of everyday life (See ACF, LW9: 8 ff.).
58. These changes, Dewey wrote,
relate not to this and that want in relation to this and that condition of our surroundings, but pertain to our being in its entirety. Because of their scope, this modification of ourselves is enduring. It lasts through any amount of vicissitude of circumstances, internal and external. There is a composing and harmonizing of the various elements of our being such that, in spite of changes in the special conditions that surround us, these conditions are also arranged, settled, in relation to us. (ACF, LW9: 12–13)
59. Dewey wrote,
The things in civilization we most prize are not of ourselves. They exist by grace of the doings and sufferings of the continuous human community in which we are a link. Ours is the responsibility of conserving, transmitting, rectifying and expanding the heritage of values we have received that those who come after us may receive it more solid and secure, more widely accessible and more generously shared than we have received it. Here are all the elements for a religious faith that shall not be confined to sect, class, or race. (ACF, LW9: 57–58)