Notes to Diagrams

1. The most recent diagram conference Diagrams 2018, nicely illustrates the scale of interdisciplinary research of the topic.

2. It is an interesting question why this has been the case. The possibility of being misled by diagrams and their limited expressive power have been considered as major reasons for their rejection. Mark Greaves (2002) explores the philosophical and historical roots for the adoption or rejection of diagrams in logical and geometric proofs, and concludes that whether a diagrammatic system is invented, or accepted, is a reflection of whether the inventor, or user, accepts a certain metaphysics.

3. Note that, however natural this convention may sound, this is still an arbitrary convention. For example, Lambert and Englebretsen’s systems visualize individuals as points and sets as lines (Lambert 1764; Englebretsen 1992).

4. For more details, see Hammer and Shin (1998).

5. Such problems have been studied under the banner of “Topological Inference ” and are nearly all NP hard (Grigni et al. 1995; Lemon & Pratt 1997; Lemon 2001).

6. Now Ian Pratt-Hartmann.

7. As a practical instance of Helly’s Theorem.

8. For more recent logical study on this issue, refer to papers by Aiello and van Benthem, Fisler, and Lemon, in Barker-Plummer et al. (2002).

9. The name of the program is CDEG (Computerized Diagrammatic Elementary Geometry). See Miller 2007. As the lines and circles of FG diagrams do not have the metric properties of Euclidean lines and circles, the ranges of mathematical possibilities FG diagrams realize do not line up with ranges of possible configurations in Euclidean geometry. There are, in particular, FG diagrams whose topological relationships cannot be realized by a Euclidean configuration. Determining whether an FG diagram has this property is a decidable, though NP-hard, problem. See Miller 2006.

10. If one is interested solely in how information from diagrams is situated logically in Euclid’s proofs according to the Eu approach, diagrams need not formalized directly as symbols. One can instead represent the information directly extracted from diagrams in sentential form. This is what is done with the formal system E, presented in Avigad et al. 2009. The system is complete with respect to modern axiomatizations of elementary Euclidean geometry. Diagrammatic inference in the system is captured in the system via a notion of direct diagrammatic consequence. Deciding whether something is a direct diagrammatic consequence in E is a polynomial time problem.

11. For example: Reasoning with Diagrammatic Representations: 1992 AAAI Spring Symposium; Cognitive and Computational Models of Spatial Representation: 1996 AAAI Spring Symposium; Reasoning with Diagrammatic Representations II: 1997 AAAI Fall Symposium; and Formalizing Reasoning with Visual and Diagrammatic Representations: 1998 AAAI Fall Symposium. See also Narayanan (1993).

12. The following conferences are good evidence for this effort: VISUAL ’98: Visualization Issues in Formal Methods (Lisbon); International Roundtable Conference on Visual and Spatial Reasoning in Design (MIT, 1999); and Theories of Visual Languages—Track of VL ’99: 1999 IEEE Symposium on Visual Languages.

13. See Aristotle On the Soul and On the Memory and Recollection.

14. Block 1981 is one of the best collections of important papers on this debate, and Block (1983) presents a succinct summary of this controversy and raises insightful philosophical questions about the debate. Chapters 1–4 of Tye 1991 are a good overview of both cognitive scientists’ and philosophers’ various positions on this issue.

Copyright © 2018 by
Sun-Joo Shin <>
Oliver Lemon
John Mumma <>

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