Notes to Disability: Health, Well-Being, and Personal Relationships

1. Scanlon also expresses doubts that well-being is a coherent concept or a “master value”. Others have expressed similar doubts about the adequacy of any single concept of well-being to serve all the purposes for which “well-being” is employed, most recently Campbell (2014). But these doubts do not preclude a discussion of substantive theories of well-being, even if they cannot be encompassed by a single concept.

2. Some disability scholars regard value-neutral accounts as legitimizing prejudice, by concealing the suspect values that inform the classification of diseases and disabilities behind a veneer of objectivity (Amundson 2000). They regard the scientific pretensions of the classifications schemes as conveying the impression that there is something objectively wrong about disabilities and those who have them. The concern about masking prejudice may have more credibility in practice (for example, homosexuality was classified as a disorder until the 1970s) than in principle—the biological criteria for the classifications provide a basis, at least in theory, for checking and correcting prejudice. The concern that value-neutral accounts treat disabilities as falling short of a norm, and thus objectively deficient, while true in some sense, fails to take the claim of value-neutrality seriously—a judgment of biological dysfunction or atypicality implies nothing about the goodness or desirability of the condition.

3. Wachbroit (1998) points out that injury, also a cause of pain, death and disability, should also be distinguished from disease, which Boorse does not do.

4. Note that “disease process” in this sense include some states we would not ordinarily call “diseases”, for example internal bleeding as a result of traumatic injury.

5. The distinction is also complicated by the fact that, like diseases, many disabilities are associated with an increased risk of, or vulnerability to, pain, death, and further disability. Sensory and motor impairments may increase the risk of accidental injury, for example, although reliable data is scarce and assumptions about increased risk disputed. Yet any increased vulnerability is likely to be more heavily mediated by the environment in the case of disability than disease—the fuller the accommodation for sensory and motor impairments, the less the risk of injury associated with them.

Copyright © 2016 by
David Wasserman <>
Adrienne Asch
Jeffrey Blustein <>
Daniel Putnam <>

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