The topic of divine freedom concerns the extent to which a divine being — in particular, the supreme divine being, God — can be free. Two preliminary questions play a central role in framing the discussion of divine freedom. I: Apart from freedom, what properties are held to be essential to God? II: What conception(s) of freedom govern the inquiry? Discussions of divine freedom typically concern the traditional conception of God as a being who is essentially omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good, and eternal. With respect to the second question, there are two conceptions of freedom common in philosophical discussion: the compatibilist conception and the libertarian conception. The topic of divine freedom concerns the question of whether God, as traditionally conceived, can enjoy whatever sort and degree of freedom required for moral responsibility, thankfulness, and praise. But when it is asked, “Can God be Free?” it is important to specify what it is about which God might be thought to act freely. Since God is essentially omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good, and eternal, it is clear that God is not free to weaken himself, to become ignorant, to do something evil, or to destroy himself. But it does seem important that God be free with respect to bringing about any one of a number of possible worlds, as well as free to bring about no world at all. What if, however, among possible worlds there is one that is the best? Is God then free to create any world other than the best? This question has been a center of controversy for centuries. In considering this question and others it will be helpful to consider the views of some important philosophers who have contributed significantly to the literature on the topic of divine freedom. The philosophers whose views will be considered most fully are Leibniz and Samuel Clarke. These two are particularly important because, in addition to being very able philosophers, they engaged each other in the controversy between the compatibilist's and the libertarian view of freedom. In the justly famous Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, Leibniz championed compatibilism, while Clarke represented the libertarian cause. In addition to Leibniz and Clarke, some important 20th century contributions on this topic by Thomas Morris and Robert Adams will also be discussed.
- 1. The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence and the Principle of Sufficient Reason
- 2. Leibniz's Problem with Divine Freedom: the necessity of God's choosing what is Best.
- 3. Clarke's Problem with Divine Freedom: the power to choose otherwise is required for freedom.
- 4. Can God be Free with respect to causing his own nature?
- 5. Alternatives to creating the Best Possible World.
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
1. The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence and the Principle of Sufficient Reason
In 1715 a series of written exchanges began between Gottfried Leibniz and Samuel Clarke. Halted by Leibniz's death in 1716, the series was edited and published by Clarke in 1717. (See Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, 1956 ). [References to the Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence will be incorporated in the text as L-C, followed by the appropriate page number in Alexander's edition.]
Clarke and Leibniz agreed that human reason can demonstrate that there necessarily exists an essentially omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being who has freely created the world. But their accounts of divine freedom were profoundly different. It is helpful, therefore, to highlight their differences over divine freedom and to consider whether either conception of divine freedom can be reconciled with the absolute perfection of the creator. Thecentral issue is whether either conception of divine freedom can be fully reconciled with the requirement imposed by God's perfect goodness, (in Clarke's words) “the necessity of always doing what is best.”
An important issue in the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence concerns the Principle of Sufficient Reason (PSR), particularly its implications for how we must understand divine and human freedom. In his second letter Leibniz advances the principle and pronounces on its implications for theology and metaphysics. “Now, by that single principle, viz. that there ought to be a sufficient reason why things should be so, and not otherwise, one may demonstrate the being of a God, and all the other parts of metaphysics or natural theology” (L-C, 16). Leibniz elsewhere expresses PSR more fully as the principle “…that no fact can be real or existent, no statement true, unless there be a sufficient reason why it is so and not otherwise,…” (1714, paragraph 32). He illustrates PSR by citing the example of Archimedes who observed that if there be a perfect balance, and if equal weights are hung on the two ends of that balance, the balance will not move. Why? Leibniz answers: “It is because no reason can be given, why one side should weigh down, rather than another” (L-C, 16). It was perhaps unfortunate for Leibniz to use this example. For it enabled Clarke to charge him with treating an agent no differently from a balance: just as the balance cannot move without a greater weight on one side, and must move downward on the side with the greater weight, so the agent cannot choose without some motive to choose, and must choose in accordance with the strongest motive. But, Clarke argues, this is to deny the agent any power to act in the absence of a motive, and to deny the agent any power to act in opposition to the strongest motive. It is, in Clarke's view, to deny that there are any genuine agents at all. For it is the nature of an agent to have the power to act or not act. A balance has no such power; it is simply acted upon by whatever weights are placed upon it. As Clarke concludes in his fifth and final reply:
There is no similitude between a balance being moved by weights or impulse, and a mind moving itself, or acting upon the view of certain motives. The difference is, that the one is entirely passive; which is being subject to absolute necessity: the other not only is acted upon, but acts also; which is the essence of liberty (L-C, 97).
Clarke's rejection of any “similitude” between the movements of a balance and the acts of an agent is closely connected to his disagreement with Leibniz over PSR. In his response to the second letter Clarke appears to accept PSR. Thus he says: “It is very true, that nothing is, without a sufficient reason why it is, and why it is thus rather than otherwise” (L-C, 20). Clearly, if when writing “nothing is” Clarke means to include any fact or truth whatever, then he cannot consistently go on, as he does, to exempt certain facts or truths from the necessity of having a sufficient reason. Leibniz may have read Clarke's “nothing is” as encompassing any fact or truth whatever, which would approach Leibniz's own understanding of PSR. If so, this would explain why in his third letter Leibniz complains that although Clarke grants him this important principle, “he grants it only in words, and in reality denies it. Which shows that he does not fully perceive the strength of it” (L-C, 25). However, despite his statement “nothing is without a sufficient reason why it is,” it is clear that Clarke cannot have intended to agree with Leibniz that every fact or truth has a sufficient reason. Nor could he have agreed that every contingent fact or truth has a sufficient reason. For he immediately goes on to say that “this sufficient reason is oft-times no other, than the mere will of God,” citing as an example God's volition to create this system of matter in one particular place within absolute space, rather than in some other place in absolute space. There is simply nothing to recommend one particular place in absolute space over another. Hence, in this case there can be no other reason than the mere will of God. (Presumably, Clarke would say that God had a sufficient reason to create this system of matter in some place or other in absolute space, but He did not have a sufficient reason to create it in this particular place.) In his third letter Leibniz cites this case as just the sort of thing that PSR rules out as impossible. On his understanding of PSR there can be no situations at all in which a choice has been made without a sufficient reason for making that particular choice. To think otherwise is to suppose an exception to PSR. (Leibniz does allow that there are many human acts that appear to lack a sufficient reason. There are acts for which we cannot find a sufficient motive. For example, no motive is apparent for why an agent stepped over the threshold with his left foot rather than his right. But he supposed in all such cases there is some unconscious perception or passion that provides the sufficient reason.) It is clear that Clarke allows for such exceptions.
A deeper and more important disagreement concerning PSR is also reflected in Clarke's reaction to Leibniz's analogy between the sufficient reason for the balance to move and the sufficient reason for an agent to do one thing rather than another. For Clarke agrees with Leibniz that often enough the agent has a sufficient reason for her action. So, he allows that PSR is satisfied for a vast array of human and divine acts. What he denies is that the sufficient reason for the agent doing one thing rather than another operates on the agent in the way in which the heavier weight operates on the balance. Clearly, the heavier weight on one side of the balance is a determining cause of the movement of the balance. Given the circumstances and the placement of that weight on the one side of the balance, nothing else could happen than what did happen, it was necessary that the balance move as it did. But to suppose that the reason or motive that is the sufficient reason for the agent to do one thing rather than another is a determining cause of the agent's act is to deny any power on the agent's part to perform or not perform that particular act. It is to render the agent's act necessary and to deny the agent's freedom of will. Thus, for Clarke, a reason or motive may be the sufficient reason for the agent's action. But, unlike the weight in the balance that is the determining cause of the movement of the balance, the reason or motive is not the determining cause of the agent's act. As he puts it elsewhere:
Occasions indeed they (reasons and motives) may be, and are, upon which that substance in man, wherein the self-moving principle resides, freely exerts its active power. But it is the self-moving principle, and not at all the reason or motive, which is the physical or efficient cause of action. When we say, in vulgar speech, that motives or reason determine a man; it is not but a figure or metaphor. It is the man that freely determines himself to act (1978. IV. 723).
What we've seen is that Clarke's conception of what it is to be a free agent requires first that the agent may act in some particular way even in the absence of his having a sufficient reason to act in that particular way. Thus, there are exceptions to PSR. Second, we've seen that when the agent has a sufficient reason to do a particular act and freely does that act, the sufficient reason or motive is not a determining cause of the agent's act. At the time of the act the agent had the power not to perform that act. So, on Clarke's libertarian view there is a profound difference between the sufficient reason for the balance moving in a particular way and the sufficient reason for an agent's free act. In the first case the sufficient reason is a determining cause, in the second it is not. Leibniz, however, sees no need to suppose there are exceptions to PSR and no need to treat the motive for the agent's free act as anything other than a determining cause of that act.
2. Leibniz's problem with Divine Freedom: the necessity of God's choosing what is Best.
With this background in place, we can now look at the problem of divine perfection and freedom and then consider the very different solutions proposed by Clarke and Leibniz to that problem. Following Leibniz, we can imagine God considering a variety of worlds he might create. One might be a world in which there are no conscious creatures at all, a world composed solely of dead matter. (Of course, given that the actual world includes everything that exists, including God, the world in question is here being considered apart from God.) Another might be a world composed (at some stage in its history) of living, conscious creatures whose lives are meaningful, morally good, and happy. If we imagine God making a choice between these two worlds, it seems evident that he would create the latter. Surely, a world with conscious creatures living morally good, satisfying lives is, other things being equal, a very good world, and better than a world consisting of nothing but dull bits of matter swirling endlessly in a void. And isn't it absolutely certain that an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being would create the better world if he could? But if we pursue this line of thought, problems begin to emerge. Assume, as seems evident, that the second world is the better world. If God were limited to these two worlds, he would face three choices: creating the inferior world, creating the superior world, creating no world at all. For God to decide to create no world over creating a world that is, all things considered, a very good world, would be for God to do less than the best that he can do. If so, it seems that God's perfect goodness would require him to create the very good world. But if God's perfect goodness requires him to create the very good world, rather than creating the inferior world or not creating a world at all, what are we to make of that part of the idea of God that declares that he created the world freely? To say that God freely created the good world seems to imply that he was free not to do so, that he could have created the inferior world, or refrained from creating either world. But if his perfect goodness requires him to create the good world, how is it possible that he was free to create the inferior world or not to create any world? This is a simple way of picturing the problem of divine perfection and divine freedom.
Initially, one may be tempted to solve this problem by viewing God's perfect goodness (which includes his absolute moral perfection) as analogous to our goodness. A morally good person may actually do the very best action available to her while being free not to do it, or free to do something bad instead. Of course, had she freely done the bad thing, she would have exhibited some sort of moral failing. But the mere fact that she was free to have done the bad thing doesn't impugn whatever degree of moral goodness she possesses. So why should God's perfect goodness preclude his being free to create a less good world, or even a bad world? Had he done that, he would have ceased being the morally perfect being he is, just as the morally good person would have diminished somewhat her moral goodness had she freely done the wrong thing.
This solution fails because, although a human person can become less good or even bad, God cannot become less than absolutely perfect. Although we may achieve a certain degree of moral virtue in our lives, we can lose it and sink back into being the morally mediocre persons we perhaps once were. This is because it is not part of our very nature to be at a certain level of goodness. According to the historically dominant view in Western religions, however, God, by his very nature, is omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good. He cannot become weak, ignorant, or ignoble. Just as the number two is necessarily even, God is necessarily supreme in power, goodness, and knowledge. He is not some infant deity who by earnest striving slowly acquired these perfections and, like us, can diminish his goodness by intentionally acting badly. He necessarily has these perfections from all eternity, and he cannot divest himself of them anymore than the number two can cease to be even. God's perfections are constituents of his nature, not acquired characteristics. So, while we may be free to lose our degree of goodness by using our freedom to pursue the bad, God is not free to lose his perfections by using his freedom to pursue the bad. Indeed, he is not free to pursue the bad. For if he were free to pursue the bad, then he could become less perfect than he is. And that is simply impossible.
The problem of divine perfection and freedom was particularly acute for Leibniz. Since God necessarily exists and is necessarily omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good, it seems he would necessarily be drawn to create the best. If this be so, then when God surveyed all the possible worlds, he must have chosen the best, with the result that the actual world is the best of all possible worlds. Leibniz embraced the conclusion of this reasoning: the actual world is the best of all possible worlds. But how then could God be free in choosing to create the best? As a first step in the direction of answering this question, it should be noted that two different views of divine freedom have emerged in western thought. According to the first view, God is free in creating a world or in acting within the world he has created provided nothing outside of him determines him to create the world he creates or determines him to act in a particular way in the world he has created. According to the second view, God is free in creating or acting within his creation provided it was in his power not to create what he did or not to act within his creation as he did.
The first of these two views has the advantage of establishing beyond question that God possesses freedom from external forces with respect to his selection of a world to create. For given that he is omnipotent and the creator of all things other than himself, it is evident that nothing outside of him determines him to create whatever he does create. And given that whatever he creates is within his control, it would seem that he is completely at liberty to act as he sees fit within the world he has created. So, the fact that nothing outside of God determines him to create or act as he does clearly shows that God is an autonomous agent; he is self-determining in the sense that his actions are the result of decisions that are determined only by his own nature. But is this sufficient to establish that God is genuinely free? It is generally believed that a human being may not be free in performing a certain action even when it is clear that the person was not determined to perform that action by external forces. Perhaps the person was in the grip of some internal passion or irresistible impulse that necessitated the performance of that action, overcoming the person's judgment that the action was wrong or unwise. With respect to human beings, the defender of the first view of divine freedom can agree that the mere absence of determining external agents or forces is not sufficient for an individual's action to be free. But in the case of God, as opposed to humans, the defender can argue that it is sufficient. For in God there is no possibility of his passions overcoming the judgment of reason. As Leibniz remarks:
the Stoics said that only the wise man is free; and one's mind is indeed not free when it is possessed by a great passion, for then one cannot will as one should, i.e. with proper deliberation. It is in that way that God alone is perfectly free, and the created minds are free only in proportion as they are above passion. (1982, 175).
The chief objection to this view of divine freedom is that it doesn't sufficiently recognize the importance of agents having control over their free acts. An action was performed freely only if the agent was free to perform the action and free not to perform it. It must have been up to the agent whether to perform or not perform that act. If some external force or internal passion was beyond the control of the agent, and the agent's action was inevitable given that external force or internal passion, then the agent did not act freely in performing that action. Since God is a purely rational being and not subject to uncontrollable passions that sometimes compel human agents to act, it is tempting to conclude that God enjoys perfect freedom of action. But this will be so only if there are no other features in God that both necessitate his actions and are not within his control. Because human agents are generally thought to have the power to act against the counsel of reason, we credit their acts due to reason — as opposed to those acts due to irresistible impulses — as acts they perform freely. For we believe they were free to reject the counsel of reason and act otherwise. But what if God cannot reject the counsel of his reason as to what action to perform? A human agent who is morally good and rational may yet have — or previously had — the power to refrain from acting as his goodness and reason direct. But can this be true of God? And, if it cannot be, how can we then say that God acts freely?
Leibniz was well aware of the problem posed by the fact that God's choice of the best is necessary, given that he is necessarily omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good. In fact, his most well-known solution to the problem of divine perfection and freedom recognizes that if God's choice of the best is absolutely necessary then God is not free with respect to creation. In his Theodicy and in his correspondence with Clarke, he is careful to distinguish absolute necessity, hypothetical necessity, and moral necessity, arguing that it is morally necessary but not absolutely necessary that God chose to create the best world. To determine whether Leibniz can solve the problem of divine perfection and freedom it is important to examine his distinction between moral and absolute necessity and to determine whether he succeeds in escaping the charge that on his view of things it is absolutely necessary that God chooses to create the best.
In discussing this matter it will be helpful to consider the following argument:
- If God exists and is omnipotent, perfectly wise and good, then he chooses to create the best of all possible worlds. [That Leibniz is committed to (1) follows from (a) his view that God is determined by the best, and (b) his view that among possible worlds there is a unique best world.]
- God exists and is omnipotent, perfectly wise, and perfectly good.
[Leibniz endorses the Ontological Argument which purports to be a
proof of (2).]
- God chooses to create the best of all possible worlds.
Leibniz must deny that (3) is absolutely necessary. For whatever is absolutely necessary cannot logically be otherwise. Hence, if (3) is absolutely necessary, it would be logically impossible for God to choose to create any world other than the best. It would not be a contingent matter that God chooses to create the best. Nor, of course, could God be free in choosing to create the best.
Leibniz contends that God's choosing to create the best is morally necessary, not absolutely necessary.
God is bound by a moral necessity, to make things in such a manner that there can be nothing better: otherwise … he would not himself be satisfied with his work, he would blame himself for its imperfection; and that conflicts with the supreme felicity of the divine nature. (1710, 201)
What is it for it to be morally necessary for God to choose to create the best of all possible worlds? It seems clear that its meaning is such that if God were to choose to create less than the best it would logically follow that he is lacking in wisdom, goodness or power. Indeed, Leibniz says that “to do less good than one could is to be lacking in wisdom or in goodness”, that the most perfect understanding “cannot fail to act in the most perfect way, and consequently to choose the best” (1710, 201). Consider again proposition (1) in the above argument. What Leibniz says about moral necessity implies that (1) is itself absolutely necessary. For he clearly holds that from the fact that a being does less good than it could it logically follows that the being in question is lacking in wisdom or goodness. And one cannot hold this without being committed to holding that the consequent of (1) logically follows from the antecedent of (1). [Actually, the consequent of (1) logically follows from the antecedent of (1) only if it is absolutely necessary that there is a best possible world. Leibniz does think it is absolutely necessary that there is a unique best among possible worlds.] That is, Leibniz is committed to holding that (1) is a hypothetical necessity. An if — then proposition is a hypothetical necessity provided the consequent logically follows from the antecedent. Of course, the mere fact that a particular consequent logically follows from a certain antecedent — as, for example, ‘John is unmarried’ logically follows from ‘John is a bachelor’ — is insufficient to render the consequent absolutely necessary. It is not logically impossible for ‘John is unmarried’ to be false. So, although his asserting the moral necessity of God's choosing to create the best commits Leibniz to the absolute necessity of the hypothetical proposition (1), in itself this commitment still leaves him free to deny that God's choosing to create the best is absolutely necessary. Two further points show that he cannot escape the conclusion that God's choosing to create the best is absolutely necessary. First, proposition (2) [God exists and is omnipotent, perfectly wise, and perfectly good.], the antecedent of (1), is itself absolutely necessary. We've already noted that both Clarke and Leibniz are committed to the view that (2) is not a contingent truth; it is absolutely necessary. Second, it is a rule of logic that if a hypothetical proposition is itself absolutely necessary, and its antecedent is also absolutely necessary, then its consequent must be absolutely necessary as well. Thus, if both (1) and (2) are absolutely necessary, (3) must be absolutely necessary as well. Since Leibniz is committed to the view that both (1) and (2) are absolutely necessary, it appears that his view commits him to the view that (3) is absolutely necessary. [The early Leibniz toyed with denying the logical rule that what logically follows from what is absolutely necessary is itself absolutely necessary. See Adams, 1994, Ch.1.]
Before turning to Clarke's attempt to solve the problem of divine perfection and freedom, we should note that Leibniz often insists that the act of will must be free in the sense of not being necessitated by the motives that give rise to it. His often repeated remark on this matter is that motives “incline without necessitating” (L-C, 57). This view appears to conflict with the view I have ascribed to him: that the strongest motive in the agent determines the agent to choose as he does. It suggests instead that the agent had the power to will otherwise even though the motive and circumstances be unchanged. For, as he says, the motives don't necessitate but only incline the agent to will as he does. But this seems not to be what he means by his phrase “motives incline without necessitating”. On his view, motives and circumstances necessitate the act of will in the sense that it is logically or causally impossible that those motives and circumstances should obtain and the act of will not occur. Leibniz's claim that they don't necessitate the act of will means only that the act of will itself is not thereby rendered something that is absolutely necessary. [For a more extended account of this interpretation of Leibniz's dictum, “motives incline but do not necessitate,” see Parkinson, 1970, 50-53.] That is, he is simply noting that even though there be a necessary connection between the motive and the act of will, this does not mean that the act of will cannot itself be contingent. As we saw above, God's being omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good necessitates God's choice of the best. However, the fact that there is a necessary connection between his being perfect and his choice of the best does not imply that his choice of the best is itself absolutely necessary. Leibniz registers this point (in a somewhat misleading fashion) by saying that God's motives “incline without necessitating” his choice of the best. We should not be misled by this phrase into thinking that he holds that the connection between his being perfect and his choice of the best is anything less than absolutely necessary. And when we then note that God's being perfect is absolutely necessary, the logical rule dictates the conclusion that his choice of the best is itself absolutely necessary. This being so, we can conclude that God's choice to create the best is not free; it is absolutely necessary.
3. Clarke's Problem with Divine Freedom: the power to choose otherwise is required for freedom.
In contrast to Locke, who characterized freedom as the power to carry out the action that we choose (will) to do, leaving the choice (volition) itself to be causally necessitated by the agent's motives, Clarke locates freedom squarely at the level of the choice to act or not act. “… the essence of liberty consists in [a person's] having a continual power of choosing whether he shall act or whether he shall forbear acting” (1738, 101). The implication of Clarke's view is that freedom (liberty) would be impossible should a person's choices be causally necessitated by his motives or desires. For if a person's choice to act is causally necessitated by earlier states of his body or mind, then at the time of that choice it was not in the agent's power to choose to not act. It is for Clarke a secondary matter whether the agent is able to carry out his choice. Indeed, Clarke goes so far as to declare that a prisoner in chains is free to will to leave or will to stay. That he cannot successfully execute his choice doesn't rob him of the power to choose (Presumable, he would allow that one who knows he is in chains may well see the pointlessness of choosing to leave and, therefore, not exercise his power so to choose.) Of course, since God is omnipotent, his power to carry out the action he chooses to do is unlimited. But our question is whether God has it in his power to choose to refrain from following what he knows to be the best course of action. Should he lack that power, it follows from Clarke's conception of freedom that God does not freely choose the best course of action. In fact, it would follow for Clarke that in this instance God is totally passive and not an agent at all. It would also follow for Clarke that it would make no sense to praise or thank God for choosing the best course of action. We must now see how Clarke endeavors to avoid the absolute necessity of God's choosing in accordance with his knowledge of what is the best course of action.
Clarke's overall view is clear enough. He distinguishes between the intellect (understanding) and the will. It is the function of the understanding to determine what course of action to pursue. It is the function of the will (the power we have to will this or that) to initiate the action specified by the understanding. It is one thing, however, to arrive through deliberation at the judgment that doing a certain thing is best, and quite another thing to choose (will) to do that thing. Since such a judgment terminates the process of deliberation about what to do, Clarke and others referred to it as “the last judgment of the understanding.” It is the judgment that terminates deliberation and is followed by the act of will to perform (or not perform) the action specified in the judgment. Often enough, our motives and desires are sufficiently clear and strong to causally necessitate the judgment as to what to do. No other judgment is possible in the circumstances. In short, there may be no freedom at all with respect to the judgment as to what action to perform. On Clarke's view, freedom enters only when the will chooses to act or not act in accordance with the judgment of the understanding. Thus, when there is a best course of action for God to perform, his judgment that it is the best course to pursue is, Clarke tells us, absolutely necessary. But God's choice to act in accordance with what his understanding approves is completely free; he always has the power to choose otherwise.
God always discerns and approves what is just and good, necessarily, and cannot do otherwise: But he always acts or does what is just and good freely; that is, having at the same time a full natural or physical power of acting differently. (1978. IV, 717)
It is instructive to contrast Clarke's view of freedom with a stream of thought in Christian theology, dating back at least to Augustine, according to which the saints in heaven are perfected to the degree that they not only do not sin, they no longer are able to sin, a perfection that is found in God and the angels. In our earthly state we have the freedom to turn from the good and do evil, but in the life to come we shall have a superior sort of freedom, a freedom that does not include the ability to do evil. Thus Augustine says:
For the first freedom of will which man received when he was created upright consisted in an ability not to sin, but also in an ability to sin; whereas this last freedom of will shall be superior, inasmuch as it shall not be able to sin. This, indeed, shall not be a natural ability, but the gift of God. For it is one thing to be God, another thing to be a partaker of God. God by nature cannot sin, but the partaker of God receives this inability from God. (1948, Bk. 12, Ch. 30)
In his book, A Philosophical Inquiry Concerning Human Liberty, Anthony Collins had appealed to this stream of thought in support of his view that freedom does not require any power to choose or do otherwise. Clarke wrote a rather devastating response to Collins's book. In the course of his response to Collins we find the following remark:
Neither saints, nor angels, nor God himself, have in any degree the less liberty upon account of the perfection of their nature: Because between the physical power of action and the perfection of judgment which is not action (which two things this author constantly confounds) there is no connection. God judges what is right, and approves what is good, by a physical necessity of nature; in which physical necessity, all notion of action is necessarily excluded. But doing what is good is wholly owing to an active principle, in which is essentially included the notion of liberty. (1978. IV, 731)
Clearly, Clarke rejects this stream of thought in Christian theology. He allows that the saints in heaven no longer have any desire to sin and take no delight in it. Indeed, it may be absolutely certain that with purified desires and a perfected judgment they will always freely do what is right. (See 1738, 124) And this will be an enormous difference from life on earth where we are often tempted to sin by bad desires and faulty judgment. But what cannot be is that the saints or the angels, or God for that matter, cease to have the ability or power to choose to do other than what is right. For then they would not be free in choosing and doing what is right. To lose the power to choose otherwise is to lose the power to choose freely. And if one loses that power one ceases to be an agent at all.
We can begin to get at the difficulty in Clarke's view of divine freedom by considering God's perfections and their implications for whether he can freely choose to do evil. Clarke readily sees that were a perfectly good, omniscient being to freely choose to do some evil deed, it would thereby cease to be perfectly good. And it would cease to be perfectly good even if, as could not happen in God's case, it were prevented from carrying out the evil deed it chose to do. For the free choice to do evil is itself inconsistent with continuing to be a perfectly good, omniscient being. A being who freely chooses to do what it knows to be an evil deed thereby ceases to be a perfectly good being. So, if God were to freely choose to do an evil deed, he would cease to be perfectly good. In short, it is not logically possible for God both to freely choose to do evil and to continue to be perfectly good. Now, since Clarke holds with Leibniz that God necessarily exists and necessarily is omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good, we can advance to the simpler conclusion that it is not logically possible for God to freely chose to do evil. It is not logically possible because it is inconsistent with what is logically necessary: the existence of a being (God) who is necessarily omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good.
An essential attribute of a being is an attribute that the being necessarily possesses. Clarke holds that the moral perfections of the deity are essential aspects of the divine nature. “… justice, goodness, and all the other moral attributes of God are as essential to the divine nature as the natural attributes of eternity, infinity, and the like” (1738, 120).
Consider now the question: Does God ever freely choose not to do evil? I think we can see that Clarke's own views commit him to a negative answer to this question. For God chooses freely not to do something only if it is in his power to choose to do that thing — choosing freely, Clarke insists, logically requires the power to choose otherwise. But it cannot be in anyone's power to make a certain choice if it is logically impossible that the person make that choice. (If there is no possible world in which a person makes a certain choice, it cannot be that the person, nevertheless, has it within his power to make that choice.) Therefore, since it is logically impossible for God to choose to do evil, it is not in God's power to choose to do evil. And since it is not in God's power to choose to do evil, it cannot be that God's choice not to do evil is a free choice. If God chooses not to do evil, he so chooses of necessity, not freely. And this being so, it makes no sense for us to thank God, or to be grateful to him, for choosing not to do evil. He could not have chosen otherwise.
Since the claim that God does not freely choose not to do evil is rather central to the examination of Clarke's views on divine perfection and freedom, it is useful to consider another argument in support of it.
- If p logically implies q, and q is false, it is in an agent's power to bring it about that p only if it is in that agent's power to bring about that q. [For a defense of this principle see Hasker, 96-115.]
- That God chooses to do evil logically implies that God is not perfectly good.
- It is false that God is not perfectly good.
- If it is in God's power to bring it about that he chooses to do evil then it is in his power to bring it about that he is not perfectly good. (from 1, 2, and 3)
- It is not in God's power to bring it about that he is not perfectly
- It is not in God's power to choose to do evil.
- If God chooses not to do evil, God chooses not to do evil of necessity, not freely.
Before examining two attempts by Clarke to avoid any limitations on the scope of divine liberty, consider whether it is in God's power to choose contrary to what he judges to be best. Clearly, God cannot choose to do evil. But to choose contrary to what is judged to be best is evil or morally wrong only if choosing to do what is judged to be best is morally obligatory. To claim that it is morally obligatory ignores the real possibility that choosing what is best is supererogatory, beyond the call of duty. There are choices which are good to make but not required as our duty. It would be a mistake, therefore, to infer God's inability to choose to act contrary to what he judges to be best from his inability to choose to do evil. Nevertheless, it does seem to be logically impossible for perfect goodness to choose to act contrary to what is best. And this seems to be Clarke's own view of the matter. Thus he declares “that though God is a most perfectly free agent, yet he cannot but do always what is best and wisest in the whole” (1738, 120-121). To choose otherwise, he thinks, is to act contrary to perfect wisdom and goodness.
How does Clarke endeavor to avoid the conclusion that God's perfect goodness precludes his being free in many of his choices? His general approach to this difficulty is to distinguish two sorts of necessities: moral and physical. If one state or event physically necessitates another state or event, then the second state or event cannot occur freely. Thus he would say that hanging a greater weight on the left end of an accurate balance physically necessitates the downward movement on the left side of the balance. Here, even if the balance were endowed with consciousness, there would be no possibility of the balance freely moving downward on the left. For the balance has no power to do other than move downwards on the left side. To illustrate the other sort of necessity, he offers the example of God's promising that on a given day he will not destroy the world. The promise morally necessitates God's refraining from destroying the worldon that particular day. But, says Clarke, it would be absurd to think that God therefore lacked the physical power on that day to destroy the world.
God's performing his promise is always consequent upon his making it: Yet there is no connection between them, as between cause and effect: For, not the promise of God, but his active power, is the alone physical or efficient cause of the performance (1978. IV, 9).
God's refraining from destroying the world on that day is both morally necessary and free. For he both retains the physical power to destroy the world on that day and also cannot (morally speaking) break his promise.
The trouble with this solution is that it doesn't focus on the particular act of choosing to break his promise. If we accept, as it seems we must in God's case, that it is logically impossible for God to choose to break his solemn promise, then it follows that it is not in God's power to break his solemn promise. Indeed, for God to choose to break his solemn promise is for God to divest himself of his absolute perfection. And, clearly, it is not logically possible for God to cease to be absolutely perfect.
In a revealing passage Clarke appears to recognize that there are some choices that do not lie within God's power because they logically imply the destruction of his essential perfections. He begins the passage by noting that there are necessary relations among things, relations that God eternally knows. By this he means that some states of things are necessarily better than other states of things. (For example, there being innocent beings who do not suffer eternally is necessarily better than there being innocent beings who do suffer eternally.) By knowing these necessary relations, God knows the choices required by his perfect wisdom and goodness. Noting that God cannot but choose to act always according to this knowledge, he continues:
It being as truly impossible for such a free agent, who is absolutely incapable of being deceived or depraved, to choose, by acting contrary to these laws, to destroy its own perfections; as for necessary existence to be able to destroy its own being (1738, 122).
He then draws the obvious conclusion.
From hence it follows, that though God is both perfectly free and infinitely powerful, yet he cannot possibly do any thing that is evil. The reason of this also is evident. Because, as it is manifest infinite power cannot extend to natural contradictions, which imply a destruction of that very power by which they must be supposed to be elected; so neither can it extend to moral contradictions, which imply a destruction of some other attributes, as necessarily belonging to the divine nature as power. I have already shown that justice, goodness and truth are necessarily in God; even as necessarily as power, understanding, and knowledge of the nature of things. It is therefore as impossible and contradictory to suppose his will should choose to do any thing contrary to justice, goodness, or truth; as that his power should be able to do any thing inconsistent with power (1738, 122).
The conclusion implied by these remarks is that God's liberty is curtailed by his perfect goodness. If choosing to do something rules out his being perfectly good, then it is not in his power to choose to do that thing. He necessarily, not freely, chooses not to do that thing. This is the conclusion stated above. Clarke, however, rejects this conclusion, insisting instead that God's liberty is not in the least diminished.
It is no diminution of power not to be able to do things which are no object of power. And it is in like manner no diminution either of power or liberty to have such a perfect and unalterable rectitude of will as never possibly to choose to do anything inconsistent with that rectitude (1738, 122).
Our final question is whether Clarke can successfully defend this response. As is clear, the response depends on an analogy between being perfectly powerful (omnipotent) and being perfectly free. His argument can be understood as follows. There are some things God cannot do. He cannot make a square circle. Nor can he choose to do evil. In the first case, his making a square circle is impossible because the idea of a square circle is contradictory. In the second case, the contradiction is in the idea of a perfectly good being choosing to do evil. Since a contradiction is involved in each case, God's power is held to extend neither to making a square circle nor to choosing to do evil. For God's power extends only to what is not contradictory for a maximally perfect being to do. Clarke then claims that the fact that God's power does not extend to making a square circle or choosing to do evil does not imply any diminution of power. And by analogy he infers that it does not imply any diminution of liberty in God.
Suppose we agree that God's inability to choose to do evil is not a diminution of power. Can it also be true that his inability to choose to do evil is no diminution of freedom? No. For on Clarke's account of the nature of freedom, the power to choose otherwise is necessary for a choice to be free. Therefore, if it is not in God's power to choose to do evil, God does not freely choose not to do evil. And if it is not in God's power to choose to act contrary to what is best, God does not freely choose to do what is best. Perhaps Clarke can save God's omnipotence by saying that his power does not extend to acts inconsistent with any of his essential attributes. But this won't leave his perfect freedom intact. So long as he lacks the power to choose to do evil, he lacks freedom in choosing not to do evil. And so long as he lacks the power to choose contrary to what is best, he lacks freedom in choosing to do what is best. It won't matter whether this lack of power results from a deficiency in his power or from the fact that his power does not extend to such choices. Clarke might be able to patch this up by changing his account of the nature of freedom: declaring instead that one chooses freely just in case one has the power to choose otherwise provided infinite power extends to the choice to do otherwise. This move will avoid the immediate conclusion that God does not freely choose to do the best. For Clarke holds that God's infinite power does not extend to choosing contrary to what he knows to be best. But since God's choosing to do what is best is absolutely necessary for God, we are left with no reason at all to insist that his choice is really free. Nor are we left with any reason to thank God or be grateful to him for choosing and acting in accordance with his knowledge of what is best. Thus, Clarke's valiant effort to reconcile God's perfect liberty with his perfect goodness is unsuccessful. [Most of the material in sections 1-3 is taken (with permission) from my essay: “Clarke and Leibniz on Divine Perfection and Freedom,” Enlightenment and Dissent, (Special Issue on Samuel Clarke), No. 16, 1997, 60-82.]
4. Can God be free with respect to causing his own nature?
On the assumption that God (the supremely perfect being) exists and that there is a best, creatable world, it appears that God is neither free not to create a world nor free to create a world less than the best creatable world. Indeed, it appears that God would of necessity create the best of the creatable worlds, leaving us with no basis for thanking him, or praising him for creating the world he does. For given that God exists and that there is a best creatable world, God's “nature” as an omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good being would require him to create that best world. Doing less than the best he can do — create the best world — would be inconsistent with his being the perfect being he is. But what if, strange as it may seem, God is causally responsible for having the perfect nature that he has? What if God creates his nature, and, by virtue of having created it, is thereby causally responsible for his own nature? Such a view, if it were correct, might provide a way out of the problem of divine freedom. For the problem seems to rest on the plausible assumption that no being is, or can be, responsible for having the nature it has. And, given that this assumption is correct, what logically follows from God's possessing the nature (being supremely perfect) he does — i.e, his creating the best possible world — can no more be up to him, something he is responsible for, than is his nature as a supremely perfect being something that is up to him, something he is responsible for. But against this assumption, Thomas Morris (Morris, 1987) has argued that God does create his nature and, therefore, is causally responsible for his nature. Suppose Morris is right: that God is responsible for his own nature. Well then, since God is responsible for his nature, he may then be responsible for what is required by his nature. In short, God may be responsible for his creation of the best world. So, it seems to matter whether God is responsible for having the nature he has.
Of course, in the broad sense of the expression “a person's nature” someone may be responsible for his nature, or at least part of it. A person with a naturally friendly disposition toward strangers may have played a role in developing his “nature” to be friendly toward strangers, and thus may bear some responsibility for his “nature” to be friendly toward others. But no one, it seems, is responsible for being the basic sort of entity one is — a human being, for example. Thus, even God, so it is generally thought, is not causally responsible for his basic nature — his being omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good. Of course, unlike humans, God, if he exists, does not inherit his nature from prior beings. For God is eternal and not generated by other gods. From eternity this uncreated being has been omnipotent, omniscient, and perfectly good. These properties constitute his intrinsic nature. Thus it seems that no one, including God, could be causally responsible for God's having the basic properties that are constitutive of his nature. Against this view, however, Thomas Morris has argued that there is nothing logically or metaphysically objectionable about God's creating, and thereby being causally responsible for, his own basic nature. He does, however, wish to avoid having to claim that God is the cause of himself. As he says, “the very idea of self-causation or self-creation is almost universally characterized as absurd, incoherent, or worse.” What Morris means here is that although it is absurd to think that God causes himself to exist from all eternity, it is not absurd, in his judgment, to suppose that God (1) causes there to be such properties as omnipotence, omniscience, and perfect goodness, and (2) causes himself to eternally possess these properties.
In Morris's proposal, God is said to be the cause of something (his nature) that God cannot possibly exist without. But it may seem impossible for any being to be the cause ofsomething (its nature) which that very being cannot exist without. Therefore, it may seem impossible for God to be causally responsible for his nature. Indeed, (to stress the point again) since God's nature consists of his essential properties, properties he must have in order to exist, it seems absurd to even suggest that God is causally responsible for these properties and for his possession of them. Morris responds to this objection by noting that God necessarily exists and therefore always has his essential properties. So, we should not think that God could exist without his nature and then cause the properties constituting his nature (absolute goodness, absolute power, and absolute knowledge) and cause himself to possess them. Nevertheless, Morris claims that the fact that God can exist only if his nature also exists doesn't preclude God's being causally responsible for his nature. He simply is always causally responsible for these properties and his essential possession of them. As Morris puts it: “It just seems to be that there is nothing logically or metaphysically objectionable about God's creating his own nature ….” (Morris, 48)
Suppose Morris is right about this issue — that God is creatively responsible for the existence of properties, relations, mathematical truths, logical truths, necessary states of affairs, possible states of affairs, etc. Nevertheless, it may still be true that God's causing of his nature was not itself up to God. For, on Morris's view, although God creates the entire framework of reality, it was not up to God whether to create the framework he did or some other framework instead, or even not to create any part of the framework he created. God never had a choice about creating this framework or any part of it for, in Morris's words, “God's creation of the framework of reality is both eternal and necessary — it never was, never will be, and could not have been, other than it is.” (Morris, 170) Clearly, if God's creation of the framework of reality never could have been other than it is, then God never had any choice about creating the framework of reality. He created it of necessity, and not freely.
Morris is very much aware of the difficulty just noted. His response to it is direct and to the point. Referring to God's creation of the framework of reality, he writes:
But there is a sense, a different sense, in which even it can be considered free. It is an activity which is conscious, intentional, and neither constrained nor compelled by anything existing independent of God and his causally efficacious power. The necessity of his creating the framework is not imposed on him from without, but rather is a feature and result of the nature of his own activity itself, which is a function of what he is. (Morris, 170-171)
Morris recognizes, apparently, that the primary sense in which an agent is free in performing an action requires that the agent either (a) could have refrained from performing that action or, at least, (b) could have refrained from causing his decision to perform that action. And it is this sense of being free in performing an action that constitutes a necessary condition for an agent's being morally responsible for an action he performs. (Morris shares the view expressed here: that the libertarian idea of freedom is essential to moral responsibility.)
In the primary sense of ‘being free in performing an action,’ — the sense required for moral responsibility (according to the libertarian view of moral responsibility) — the power not to have caused the decision to act is necessary. For without such power the agent has no control over her performing an action. It is not up to the agent whether she causes or does not cause her decision and subsequent action. And without such power on God's part with respect to his “creation” of the framework of reality, it makes no sense to thank God or praise God for creating that eternal framework. Only in some Pickwickian sense could we view God as “morally responsible” for the creation of the framework of reality. This is not to deny the distinction Morris draws between God and the necessary truths constituting the framework of reality. God is causally active in a way in which a necessary truth such as Clarke's example — there being innocent beings who do not suffer eternally is necessarily better than there being innocent beings who do suffer eternally -is not. But for all Morris says about the matter, God has no choice but to form the thought that there being innocent beings who do not suffer eternally is necessarily better than there being innocent beings who do suffer eternally. And God has no choice but to acknowledge the truth of this thought. Neither of these doings on God's part — having that thought, acknowledging its truth — is any more up to God than it is up to a leaf whether or not it moves when the wind blows against it. Neither the leaf nor God has any choice in the matter.
Morris believes that God can be the cause of his own nature. By this he means that God is both the cause of the properties (omniscience, omnipotence, and perfect goodness) and the cause of God's having those properties. Indeed, Morris holds that God is the cause of all the elements constituting the framework of reality. Furthermore, Morris is well aware that God has no control over either his causing the divine properties or his having those properties. The primary sense in which we say that an agent is free in doing something requires that at the time he did it the agent could have avoided doing what he did or could have avoided causing his decision to do that thing. It is this sense of having control that many philosophers hold to be essential if an agent is to be morally responsible for his decision and action. [I ignore here cases of “derivative responsibility,” where an agent freely and knowingly causes himself to be in a situation where he is caused to will to do X and cannot refrain from willing to do X. In such cases the agent can be said, in a derivative sense, to be morally responsible for what he now must do, for the agent freely put himself in circumstances that he knew would necessitate his act.] And it is because God is not free (in the sense required for moral responsibility) when he performs actions necessitated by his absolute perfections that it makes no sense to thank God or praise him for doing those actions. It is true, however, as Morris points out, that God's having no choice either about creating the framework of reality or about having the properties of absolute power, knowledge, and goodness, does not result from something else imposing this framework and properties upon him. And this seems to distinguish God from the leaf that has no choice about moving when the wind blows. The necessity of the leaf's moving is imposed on it by something else (the wind). The necessity of God's doing what is best is imposed by God's nature, his being perfectly good, something that is internal to God and something that, on Morris's account, God himself causes, but had no choice about causing. So, unlike the leaf's being caused to move by something else (the wind), God, we may say, necessarily does what is best because given his perfect nature he cannot do other than the best. And although God causes his eternal possession of his perfect nature he had no choice about eternally causing himself to be perfect. Consider the question: Does God have any more of a choice about doing what is best than the leaf, were it endowed with consciousness, would have about moving when the wind blows? It is apparent that the answer must be “No.” For each necessarily does what it does as a result of factors over which neither has any control. And that being so, it may be that God is no more morally responsible for choosing to do what is best than the leaf is for moving when the wind blows. But even it this should be so, the view Morris presents is a significant addition to the literature on the problem of divine freedom.
5. Alternatives to creating the best possible world.
In an important and influential essay, Robert Adams argues that even if there is a best creatable world, God need not create it. He supposes that the world God creates contains creatures each of whom is as happy as it is in any possible world in which it exists. Moreover, no creature in this world is so miserable that it would be better had it not existed. Adams then supposes that there is some other possible world with different creatures that exceeds this world in its degree of happiness, a world that God could have created. So, God has created a world with a lesser degree of happiness than he could have. Has God wronged anyone in creating this world? Adams argues that God cannot have wronged the creatures in the other possible world, for merely possible beings don't have rights. Nor can he have wronged the creatures in the world he has created, for their lives could not be made more happy. Adams notes that God would have done something wrong in creating this world were the following principle true.
It is wrong to bring into existence, knowingly, a being less excellent than one could have brought into existence (Adams, 1972, 329).
But this principle, Adams argues, is subject to counter-examples. Parents do no wrong, he points out, when they refrain from taking drugs that would result in an abnormal gene structure in their children, even though taking the drugs would result in children who are superhuman both in intelligence and in prospects for happiness. As opposed to the incorrect principle just cited, Adams does support the more plausible principle:
It is wrong for human beings to cause, knowingly and voluntarily, the procreation of an offspring of human parents which is notably deficient, by comparison with normal human beings, in mental and physical capacity (Adams, 1972, 330).
From these sensible observations concerning what would be right or wrong for humans to do in producing offspring, Adams infers that God would not be doing something wrong in bringing into existence humans who are less excellent than he could have brought into existence. But before we accept this inference, we should note an important difference between God's situation in considering creating human beings and the situation of parents who are considering taking drugs in order to bring into existence children who are superhuman both in intelligence and in prospects for happiness. In the latter case there is an inherited background of existing children who are brought about in normal ways and who establish what is normal with respect to human intelligence and prospects for happiness. Against this established background both of normal ways of producing children and of what is normal in the way of intelligence and prospects of happiness, it is quite sensible to conclude that parents are under no obligation to produce non-normal children who are superhuman both in intelligence and in prospects for happiness. For we cannot help but think that they would be producing beings who would be strangely different, if not estranged, from much of the human race, the humans who are normal both in intelligence and in prospects for happiness. But in creating human creatures it is God himself who establishes what the norm of human intelligence will be and what the prospects for human happiness will be. There is no already existing norm from which God may choose to deviate either by creating beings who are subhuman or superhuman in the way of intelligence and prospects of happiness. Within the limits of what it is to be human it is up to God to set the norm for human intelligence and prospects for happiness. And if we suppose there is a lower and upper limit for human intelligence and happiness, the question is whether God would be doing something wrong in creating humans whose prospects for intelligence and happiness are rather low, or in the middle, given that he could have created other humans with prospects for a considerably higher level of intelligence and happiness. We grant that God may not have wronged the humans he did create, since, as Adams supposes, they could not have been created with any greater prospects for a good and happy life. But it remains difficult to see how God would be justified in creating creatures whose prospects for a good life are known by him to be mediocre in comparison with other creatures of the same species whose prospects for a good life are known by him to be much greater — given that this knowledge is all that is relevant to God's decision about which creatures to create. In my judgment, Adams's analogy fails to address this more serious question and, by implication, fails to address the serious question of whether God would be obligated to create the best world.
Suppose, however, that we set aside whatever disagreements we may have with Adams on these points and accept the conclusion of his reasoning. Suppose, that is, that we agree with Adams that God is not morally obligated to create the best world that he can, that it would be morally permissible for God to create the best world he can, but also morally permissible for God to create any of a number of other good worlds of the sort Adams describes. If so, can't we conclude that there is no unresolvable conflict between God's being essentially morally perfect and his enjoying a significant degree of genuine freedom? For it now appears that God's moral perfection does not require him to create the best world. In short, he is free to create (or not create) any of a number of good worlds.
As forceful and persuasive as Adams's arguments may be, I don't think they yield the conclusion that God's perfect goodness leaves God free to create less than the best world that he can create. What Adams's arguments show, at best, is that God's moral perfection imposes no moral obligation on God to create the best world he can. His arguments establish, at best, that God need not be doing anything morally wrong in creating some world other than the best world. But this isn't quite the same thing as showing that God's perfect goodness does not render it necessary that he create the best world he can. For, even conceding the points Adams makes, there still may be an inconsistency in a morally perfect being creating some world other than the best world he can create. The point here is this. One being may be morally better than another even though it is not better by virtue of the performance of some obligation that the other failed to perform. It may be morally better by virtue of performing some supererogatory act — a good act beyond the call of duty — that the other being could have but did not perform. Analogously, a being who creates a better world than another being may be morally better, even though the being who creates the inferior world does not thereby do anything wrong. Following Philip Quinn, I'm inclined to think that if an all-powerful, all-knowing being creates some world other than the best world it can create, then it is possible there should exist a being morally better than it is. Quinn remarks: “An omnipotent moral agent can actualize any actualizable world. If he actualizes one than which there is a morally better, he does not do the best he can, morally speaking, and so it is possible that there is an agent morally better than he is, namely an omnipotent moral agent who actualizes one of those morally better worlds” (Quinn, 213). (We should note that my version of Quinn's principle is presented in terms of the overall goodness of a world, not just its moral goodness. Thus, my version of the principle states that if an omniscient being creates a world when there is a better world it could create, then it would be possible for there to be a being morally better than it. I do not, as Quinn does, focus solely on the moral status of a world. For some good states of affairs include nonmoral goods such as happiness, as well as moral goods such as the exercise of virtue. It could be, however, that the difference is merely terminological, for Quinn may hold that the moral status of a world depends on both the moral and nonmoral good the world contains.) For it would be possible for there to be an omnipotent being who creates the best world that the first being could create but did not. Shouldn't we then conclude that if an essentially all-powerful, all-knowing, perfectly good being creates any world at all, it must create the best world it can? For although a being may do no wrong in creating less than the best it can create, a being whose nature is to be perfectly good is not such that it is possible for there to be a being morally better than it. If, however, a being were to create a world when there is a better world it could create, then it would be possible for there to be a being morally better than it.
The heart of Adams's essay, however, proposes a reason for rejecting the view we have just stated: that if a being were to create a world when there is a better world it could create, then it would be possible for there to be a being morally better than it. For that view implies, in Adams's words, that “the creator's choice of an inferior world must manifest a defect of character.” And his response to this objection is that “God's choice of a less excellent world could be accounted for in terms of His grace, which is considered a virtue rather than a defect of character in Judeo-Christian ethics” (Adams, 1972, 318-319). It is Adams's understanding of the Judeo-Christian view of grace that lies at the core of his objection to the Liebnizian view that the most perfect being “cannot fail to act in the most perfect way, and consequently to choose the best.” So, any answer to Adams's view that God need not choose to create the best world must take into account his view that the Judeo-Christian view of grace implies that God may create a world less than the best.
Adams's defines the concept of grace as “a disposition to love which is not dependent on the merit of the person loved” (Adams, 1972, 324). Given this definition and given two worlds, W1 and W2, that differ in that the persons in W1 are happier and more disposed to behave morally than are the persons in W2, with the result, let us suppose, that W1 is a better world than W2, it is clear that a gracious God would not love the persons in W1 more than the persons in W2. Or, at the very least, it is clear that were God to love the persons in W1 more than the persons in W2 it would not be because they are morally better and/or happier. As Adams remarks: “The gracious person loves without worrying about whether the person he loves is worthy of his love” (Adams, 1972, 324). So, by virtue of his grace, either God would love all persons to an equal degree or the fact that he might love one person more than another would have nothing to do with the fact that the one has a greater degree of merit or excellence than another. As Adams puts it: “the gracious person sees what is valuable in the person he loves, and does not worry about whether it is more or less valuable than what could be found in someone else he might have loved” (Adams, 1972, 324). And he tells us that in the Judeo-Christian tradition grace is held to be “a virtue which God does have and men ought to have” (Adams, 1972, 324).
Given that grace is as Adams has defined it and that grace is a virtue God possesses, what may we infer about the world God creates? Can we infer with Leibniz that if there is a best world God must create that world? It is difficult to know what to say here. All that we've learned from Adams thus far is that it would be something other than love that would motivate God to choose the best world, or any other world for that matter. For since grace is a disposition to love without regard to merit, God will be unable to select one world over another if all he has to go on is his grace. His grace (love toward creatures independent of their degree of merit) will leave him free to create any world that has creatures able to do moral good or evil, regardless of how good or bad they may be in that world. So, if God has a reason to choose one creaturely world over another — rather than blindly picking one out of the hat, so to speak — that reason will have little or nothing to do with his grace. For given the doctrine of grace, God's love for creatures is not based on the quality (moral, religious, etc.) of the lives they lead; and it is difficult to see what else about their lives it could be based on. In fact, the implication of the Judeo-Christian doctrine of grace for God's selection of a world to create seems to be entirely negative — rather than giving a reason why he might select a particular creaturely world, or rule out other creaturely worlds, it simply tells us that if God creates a world with creatures, his love of the creatures in that world cannot be his reason for creating it. For his love for creatures is entirely independent of who they are and the kind of lives they lead. To base his love on who they are and the kinds of lives they lead would be to take those persons and their lives as more deserving of his love than other persons and their lives.
What we've seen thus far is that God's grace — his love of creatures without respect to their merit — cannot provide God with a reason to create the best world, or any particular world less than the best. And what this means is that whatever reason God has for choosing to create one creaturely world over another cannot be found in his gracious love for creatures (For further argument in support of this point see Thomas, 1996.) In what then, given that God has a reason for creating one world over another, would that reason reside? It would reside not in God's gracious love but, I suggest, in his desire to create the very best state of affairs that he can. Having such a desire, I believe, does not preclude gracious love. It does not imply that God cannot or does not equally love the worse creatures along with the best creatures. Let me explain by using an analogy of my own. Loving parents may be disposed to love fully any child that is born to them, regardless of whatever talents that child is capable of developing. But such love is consistent with a preference for a child who will be born whole, without mental or physical impairment, a child who will develop his or her capacities for kindness toward others, who will develop his or her tastes for music, good literature, etc. And in like manner, God will graciously love any creature he might choose to create, not just the best possible creatures. But that does not rule out God's having a preference for creating creatures who will strive as creatures not only to have a good life but also to lead a good life, creatures who will in their own way freely develop themselves into “children of God.” Indeed, although God's gracious love extends to every possible creature, it would be odd to suggest that he, therefore, could have no preference for creating a world with such creatures over a world in which creatures use their freedom to abuse others, use their talents to turn good into evil, and devote their lives to selfish ends. Surely, God's graciously loving all possible creatures is not inconsistent with his having a preference to create a world with creatures who will use their freedom to pursue the best kind of human life. How could he not have such a preference? Furthermore, as I've suggested, if God had no such preference, his gracious love for creatures would give him no reason to select any particular possible world for creation. For his gracious love for each and every creature fails to provide a reason to create one creature rather than another, or to create the creatures in one possible world rather than those in another. So, if God is not reduced to playing dice with respect to selecting a world to create,there must be some basis for his selection over and beyond his gracious love for all creatures, regardless of merit. And that basis, given God's nature as an absolutely perfect being, can only be, as Leibniz and Clarke maintained, to do always what is “best and wisest” to be done. And surely the best and wisest for God to do is to create the best world he can. Moreover, doing so seems to be entirely consistent with God's gracious love of all creatures, regardless of their merit.
Adams, however, flatly rejects the view just described, a view that sees God's gracious love of creatures without respect to merit as entirely consistent with his having an all things considered preference to create the best world he can. After noting that divine grace is love which is not dependent on the merit of the person loved, Adams proceeds to draw the conclusion that although God would be free to create the best creatures, he cannot have as his reason for choosing to create them the fact that they are the best possible creatures.
God's graciousness in creating does not imply that the creatures He has chosen to create must be less excellent than the best possible. It implies, rather, that even if they are the best possible creatures, that is not the ground for His choosing them. And it implies that there is nothing in God's nature or character which would require Him to act on the principle of choosing the best possible creatures to be the object of His creative powers (Adams, 1972, 324).
By my lights, God's disposition to love independent of the merit of the persons loved carries no implication as to what God's reason for creating a particular world may be, other than that his reason cannot be that he loves the beings in this world more (or less) than the beings in other worlds. Moreover, having an all-things considered preference for creating the best world need not be rooted in a greater love for beings who are better than other beings. For, owing to the Principle of Organic Unities (see Moore, pp. 187ff.) the best whole may have some parts that are not the best. Therefore, the best world may contain some human beings who are not better than, or even as good as, their replacements in the closest world to the best world. And God may select creatures to create who will choose to grow morally and spiritually, rather than creatures who will choose not to grow morally and spiritually, and select them for that very reason without his thereby loving the former persons more than the latter, or loving them because of there greater merit. God's grace does rule out choosing to create the best world because he loves its inhabitants more than the inhabitants of some lesser world. But it does not rule out God's choosing to create the best world because he prefers to create the best persons, so long as he does not love them more than he loves the inhabitants of lesser worlds. Adams, of course, must be supposing that if God's reason for creating one world rather than another is the fact that the creatures in the first world are much better than the creatures in the second world, it somehow logically follows that God must love the creatures in the first world more than he loves the creatures in the second. But there is nothing in his presentation of the view that God's love for creatures is independent of their merit that yields this result. It seems, then, that there is no good reason to think that the Judeo-Christian concept of grace rules out the view of Leibniz and Clarke that God must create the best world, provided there is a best world.
Finally, it should be noted that there may be no best possible world. Instead, it may be that for any world there is a better world. Or perhaps there are several equally good worlds than which no world is better. Still another seeming possibility is that there are incommensurate worlds,worlds such that no comparison in terms of better than is possible. Each of these possibilities has implications for the question of divine freedom with respect to creation.
- Adams, Robert (1972). “Must God Create the Best?,” Philosophical Review 81: 317-332.
- Adams, Robert (1994). Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Augustine (1948) [413-427]. The City of God, tr. M.. Dods. New York: Random House.
- Bergmann, Michael and Cover, Jan (2006). “ Divine Responsibility without Divine Freedom,” Faith and Philosophy, 23/4: 381-408.
- Blumenthal, D. (1975). “Is the Best Possible World Possible?,” Philosophical Review 84: 163-77.
- Brown, Robert F. (1991). “God's Ability to Will Moral Evil,” Faith and Philosophy 8: 3-20.
- Chisholm, Roderick M. “The Defeat of Good and Evil,” in The Problem of Evil, ed. by Marilyn Adams and Robert Adams. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990.
- Clarke, Samuel (1738) . A Demonstration of the Being and Attributes of God. Ninth edition. Printed by W. Botham for John and Paul Knapton.
- Clarke, Samuel (1978) . Works: British Philosophers and Theologians of the 17th and 18 Centuries, Volumes I-IV. New York: Garland Press.
- Clarke, Samuel and Leibniz, Gottfried (1956) . The Leibniz-Clarke Correspondence, ed. H. G. Alexander. Manchester: Manchester University Press.
- Felt, James W. (1974). “The Temporality of Divine Freedom,” Process Studies, 4/4: 252-262.
- Fischer, John Martin (1994). The Metaphysics of Freedom. Oxford: Blackwell Publishers.
- Flint, Thomas (1998). Divine Providence. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Frankfurt, Harry (1969). “Alternate Possibilities and Moral Responsibility,” Journal of Philosophy 66, 829-839.
- Garcia, L. L. (1992). “Divine Freedom and Creation,” The Philosophical Quarterly 42: 191-213.
- Grover, Steven (1988). “Why Only the Best is Good Enough,” Analysis 48: 224.
- Guleserian, Theodore (1983). “God and Possible Worlds: The Modal Problem of Evil,” Nous 7: 221-238.
- Guleserian, Theodore (1996). “Can God Change His Mind?,” Faith and Philosophy 13: 329-351.
- Hasker, William (1984). “Must God Do His Best?,” International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 16: 213-223.
- Hasker, William (1989). God, Time, and Knowledge. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Helm, Paul (1988). Eternal God. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Howard-Snyder, Daniel and Frances (1994). “How an Unsurpassable Being Can Create a Surpassable World,” Faith and Philosophy 11: 260-68.
- Howard-Snyder, Daniel and Frances (1996). “The Real Problem of No Best World,” Faith and Philosophy 13: 422-425.
- Kane, R. (1976). “Nature, Plentitude and Sufficient Reason,” American Philosophical Quarterly 13: 23-31.
- Kretzmann, N. (1990). “A General Problem of Creation,” in Scott MacDonald (ed.) Being and Goodness. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Kretzmann, N. (1990). “A Particular Problem of Creation,” in Scott MacDonald (ed.) Being and Goodness. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Langtry, Bruce (1996). “God and the Best,” Faith and Philosophy 13: 311-327.
- Leibniz, Gottfried (1982) . New Essays on Human Understanding, abridged edition, trans. & ed. P. Remnant and J. Bennett. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Leibniz, Gottfried (1985) . Theodicy. LaSalle, IL: Open Court.
- Leibniz, Gottfried (1951) . “Monadology,” in Philip P. Wiener (ed.) Leibniz Selections. New York: Charles Scribner's Sons.
- Lovejoy, Arthur O. 1963. The Great Chain of Being. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.
- Mann, W. E. (1990). “The Best of all Possible Worlds,” in Scott MacDonald (ed.) Being and Goodness. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Menssen, Sandra and Sullivan, Thomas (1995). “Must God Create?,” Faith and Philosophy 3: 321-341.
- Moore, G. E. (1903). Principia Ethica. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
- Morris, Thomas V. (1987). Anselmian Explorations. Notre Dame, Indiana: University of Notre Dame Press.
- Morris, Thomas V. (1993). “Perfection and Creation,” in Eleonore Stump (ed.) Reasoned Faith. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Morriston, W. (1985). “Is God Significantly Free,” Faith and Philosophy 2: 257-263.
- Parkinson G. H. R. (1970). Leibniz on Human Freedom. WiesBaden: Franz Steiner Verlag, 1970.
- Peloquin, John. (2005). The Free Will Dilemma: On Human and Divine Freedom and the Existence of God, The Dualist, 12: 1-19.
- Plantinga, Alvin (1974). The Nature of Necessity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Plantinga, Alvin (1980). Does God Have a Nature? Milwaukee: Marquette University Press.
- Quinn, Philip L. “God, Moral Perfection, and Possible Worlds,” in God: The Contemporary Discussion, ed. Frederick Sontag and M. Darrol Bryant (New York: The Rose of Sharon Press, Inc., 1982) 197-213.
- Raz, Joseph (1986). The Morality of Freedom. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Reichenbach, Bruce (1979). “Must god Create the Best Possible World?,” International Philosophical Quarterly, 19: 208.
- Reichenbach, Bruce. (1982) Evil and a Good God. New York: Fordham University Press.
- Reid, Thomas (1895). Essays on the Active Powers of Man, ed. B. Brody. Cambridge: MIT Press.
- Resnick, Lawrence (1973). “God and the Best Possible World,” American Philosophical Quarterly 10: 313-17.
- Rowe, W. L. (1991). Thomas Reid on Freedom and Morality, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Rowe, W. L. (1993). “The Problem of Divine Perfection and Freedom,” in Eleonore Stump (ed.) Reasoned Faith. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Rowe, W. L. (1994). “The Problem of No Best World,” Faith and Philosophy 11: 269-71.
- Rowe, W. L. (1997). “Clarke and Leibniz on Divine Perfection and Freedom,” Enlightenment and Dissent 16: 60-82. (Special Issue on Samuel Clarke).
- Rowe, W. L. (2004). Can God Be Free, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Yandell, K. (1988). “Divine Necessity and Divine Goodness” in T. Morris (ed.) Divine and Human Action. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Schellenberg, J. L. (2007), The Wisdom To Doubt, Ithaca: Cornell University Press.
- Sennett, James (1994). “Is God Essentially God,” Religious Studies 30: 295-303.
- Stump, Eleonore (1996). “Persons: Identification and Freedom,” Philosophical Topics 24, 183-214.
- Stump, Eleonore (1997). “Aquinas's Account of Freedom: Intellect and Will,” The Monist 80, 576-597.
- Stump, Eleonore (2000). “The Direct Argument for Incompatibilism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research: 459-466.
- Stump, Eleonore (2000). “Transfer Principles and Moral Responsibility” (with John Martin Fischer), Philosophical Perspectives, 14 (2000) 47-55.
- Swinburne, Richard (1977). The Coherence of Theism. Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Swinburne, Richard (1974). “Duty and the Will of God,” Canadian Journal of Philosophy 4: 213-227.
- Talbott, Thomas (1988). “On the Divine Nature and the Nature of Divine Freedom,” Faith and Philosophy 5: 3-24.
- Van Inwagen, Peter (1983). An Essay on Free Will. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Van Inwagen, Peter (2000). “Free Will Remains a Mystery,” Philosophical Perspectives 14: 1-19.
- Wainwright, William (1995). Reason and the Heart. Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
- Wainwright, William (1996). “Jonathan Edwards, William Rowe, and the Necessity of Creation,” in Jeff Jordan and Daniel Howard-Snyder (eds.) Faith, Freedom, and Rationality. Boston: Rowman & Littlefield.
- Ward, Keith (1982). Rational Theology and the Creativity of God. Oxford: Oxford University Press.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- The Determinism and Freedom Philosophy Website, edited by Ted Honderich, University College London
[Please contact the author with other suggestions]