Doctrine of Double Effect

First published Wed Jul 28, 2004; substantive revision Mon Jul 17, 2023

The doctrine (or principle) of double effect is often invoked to explain the permissibility of an action that causes a serious harm, such as the death of a human being, as a side effect of promoting some good end. According to the principle of double effect, sometimes it is permissible to cause a harm as an unintended and merely foreseen side effect (or “double effect”) of bringing about a good result even though it would not be permissible to cause such a harm as a means to bringing about the same good end.

1. Formulations of the principle of double effect

Thomas Aquinas is credited with introducing the principle of double effect in his discussion of the permissibility of self-defense in the Summa Theologica (II-II, Qu. 64, Art.7). Killing one’s assailant is justified, he argues, provided one does not intend to kill him. In contrast, Augustine had earlier maintained that killing in self-defense was not permissible, arguing that “private self-defense can only proceed from some degree of inordinate self-love.” Aquinas observes that “Nothing hinders one act from having two effects, only one of which is intended, while the other is beside the intention. … Accordingly, the act of self-defense may have two effects: one, the saving of one’s life; the other, the slaying of the aggressor.” As Aquinas’s discussion continues, a justification is provided that rests on characterizing the defensive action as a means to a goal that is justified: “Therefore, this act, since one’s intention is to save one’s own life, is not unlawful, seeing that it is natural to everything to keep itself in being as far as possible.” However, Aquinas observes, the permissibility of self-defense is not unconditional: “And yet, though proceeding from a good intention, an act may be rendered unlawful if it be out of proportion to the end. Wherefore, if a man in self-defense uses more than necessary violence, it will be unlawful, whereas, if he repel force with moderation, his defense will be lawful.”

The passage can be interpreted as formulating a prohibition on apportioning one’s efforts with killing as the goal guiding one’s actions, which would lead one to act with greater viciousness than pursuing the goal of self-defense would require.

Later versions of the double effect principle all emphasize the distinction between causing a morally grave harm as a side effect of pursuing a good end and causing a morally grave harm as a means of pursuing a good end. We can summarize this by noting that for certain categories of morally grave actions, for example, causing the death of a human being, the principle of double effect combines the claim that it can be morally permissible to cause a death incidentally as a side effect of pursuing a good end with a general prohibition on causing the death of an innocent human being for the sake of a good end. The prohibition is absolute in traditional Catholic applications of the principle. Two traditional formulations appear below.

The New Catholic Encyclopedia provides four conditions for the application of the principle of double effect:

  1. The act itself must be morally good or at least indifferent.
  2. The agent may not positively will the bad effect but may permit it. If he could attain the good effect without the bad effect he should do so. The bad effect is sometimes said to be indirectly voluntary.
  3. The good effect must flow from the action at least as immediately (in the order of causality, though not necessarily in the order of time) as the bad effect. In other words the good effect must be produced directly by the action, not by the bad effect. Otherwise the agent would be using a bad means to a good end, which is never allowed.
  4. The good effect must be sufficiently desirable to compensate for the allowing of the bad effect (see Connell, 1021).

The conditions provided by Joseph Mangan include the explicit requirement that the bad effect not be intended:

A person may licitly perform an action that he foresees will produce a good effect and a bad effect provided that four conditions are verified at one and the same time:

  1. that the action in itself from its very object be good or at least indifferent;
  2. that the good effect and not the evil effect be intended;
  3. that the good effect be not produced by means of the evil effect;
  4. that there be a proportionately grave reason for permitting the evil effect (Mangan 1949, p. 43).

In both of these accounts, the fourth condition, the proportionality condition is usually understood to involve determining if the extent of the harm is adequately offset by the magnitude of the proposed benefit.

Peter Cataldo formulates the first condition in a way that focuses on the “moral object” of the act:

The moral object of the act must be good or at least not be intrinsically immoral (Cataldo 2022, 3).

Cataldo also reports that the Catholic moral tradition provides useful clarification of the fourth “proportionality” condition by recognizing five different dimensions of assessment: “the degree of badness of the effect; the degree of dependence of the bad effect on the act; the proximity of the effect to the bad act; the degree of certainty that the bad effect will occur; and the degree of obligation to prevent the bad act” (Cataldo 2022, 9. fn. 12).

It is reasonable to assume that agents who regret causing harm will be disposed to avoid causing the harm or to minimize how much of it they cause. This assumption could be made explicit as an additional condition on permissibly causing unintended harm:

  1. that agents attempt to minimize the foreseen harm and consider less harmful alternatives.

Michael Walzer (1977) has convincingly argued that agents who cause harm as a foreseen side effect of promoting a good end must be willing to accept additional risk or to forego some benefit in order to minimize how much harm they cause. Whether harm has been minimized will depend on the agent’s current circumstances and the options available.

Double effect might also be part of a secular and non-absolutist view according to which a justification adequate for causing a certain harm as a side effect of pursuing a good end might not be adequate for causing that harm as a means to the same good end under the same circumstances.

2. Applications

Many morally reflective people have been persuaded that something along the lines of double effect must be correct. No doubt this is because at least some of the examples cited as illustrations of DE have considerable intuitive appeal.

Terror bomber vs Tactical bomber: The terror bomber aims to bring about civilian deaths in order to weaken the resolve of the enemy: when his bombs kill civilians this is a consequence that he intends. The tactical bomber aims at military targets while foreseeing that bombing such targets will cause civilian deaths. When his bombs kill civilians this is a foreseen but unintended consequence of his actions. Even if it is equally certain that the two bombers will cause the same number of civilian deaths, terror bombing is impermissible while tactical bombing is permissible.

Euthanasia vs Pain relief that hastens death: A doctor who intends to hasten the death of a terminally ill patient by injecting a large dose of morphine would act impermissibly because he intends to bring about the patient’s death. However, a doctor who intended to relieve the patient’s pain with that same dose and merely foresaw the hastening of the patient’s death would act permissibly. (The mistaken assumption that the use of opioid drugs for pain relief tends to hasten death is discussed below in section 5.1.)

Abortion vs Hysterectomy: A doctor who believed that abortion was wrong, even in order to save the mother’s life, might nevertheless consistently believe that it would be permissible to perform a hysterectomy on a pregnant woman with cancer. In carrying out the hysterectomy, the doctor would aim to save the woman’s life while merely foreseeing the death of the fetus. Performing an abortion, by contrast, would involve intending to kill the fetus as a means to saving the mother.

Pre-emptive Killing vs Active Self-defense: To kill a person whom you know to be plotting to kill you would be impermissible because it would be a case of intentional killing; however, to strike in self-defense against an aggressor is permissible, even if one foresees that the blow by which one defends oneself will be fatal.

Suicide vs Heroic Shielding: Sacrificing one’s own life in order to save the lives of others can be distinguished from suicide by characterizing the agent’s intention: a soldier who throws himself on a live grenade intends to shield others from its blast and merely foresees his own death; by contrast, a person who commits suicide intends to bring his or her own life to an end.

The Trolley Problems, Pushing a Bystander onto a Track to stop the trolley vs Diverting a Trolley onto a track with one person away from a track with five: You are a bystander standing near a switch watching a runaway trolley barrel down a track on which five people who cannot escape are positioned. Pushing another bystander onto the track to stop the trolley would be wrong, many believe. However, many believe that it would be permissible to turn a switch and divert the trolley onto a different track on which one person who cannot escape is positioned (examples from Thomson, 1985, based on examples in Foot 1967).

3. Misinterpretations

Does the principle of double effect play the important explanatory role that has been claimed for it? To consider this question, one must be careful to clarify just what the principle is supposed to explain. Three misinterpretations of the principle’s force or range of application are common.

First, the Doctrine of Double Effect does not claim that the fact that a harm was foreseen and not intended by an agent is sufficient to explain the permissibility of causing it. Applications of double effect always presuppose that some kind of proportionality condition has been satisfied and plausible accounts of double effect require agents to minimize harms brought about as side effects. Classifying civilian casualties during wartime as merely foreseen but unintended side effects of pursuing a military objective does not show that the agents were not morally responsible for these consequences or that they were permissibly brought about. Quite obviously, a physician’s justification for administering drugs to relieve a patient’s pain while foreseeing the hastening of death as a side effect does not depend only on the fact that the physician foresees but does not intend the hastening of death; that explanation could not justify treating the pain of kidney stones with a lethal dose of morphine.

A second misinterpretation is fostered by applications of double effect that contrast the foreseen harms that one permissibly allows to occur with intended harms that one impermissibly causes by acting to promote a good end. The distinction between causing and allowing can be distinguished from the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences of acting (see Doing vs. Allowing Harm).

A third misinterpretation of double effect bases the impermissibility of causing harm as a means to a good end on the fact that it is wrongful in itself to intend to cause harm. There are many circumstances in which agents may cause harms as a means to a good end and in such cases, producing a harm as a means to a good end is compatible with having an appropriate attitude toward the harm. Surgeons may amputate limbs to save lives while regretting the damage, the disfigurement, and the disability that their actions will cause. A dentist may apologetically probe while instructing her patient “tell me where it hurts”. This is why plausible accounts of double effect insist on the importance of the proportionality condition and the requirement to minimize harm and to seek less harmful alternatives: it is directed at agents who aim at good ends and seek guidance about what they may do to promote them.

4. Criticisms

4.1 Consequentialist Objections

Those who defend the principle of double effect often assume that their opponents deny that an agent’s intentions, motives, and attitudes are important factors in determining the permissibility of a course of action. If the permissibility of an action depended only on the consequences of the action, or only on the foreseen or foreseeable consequences of the action, then the distinction that grounds the principle of double effect would not have the moral significance claimed for it (see the related entry on consequentialism). Some opponents of the principle of double effect do indeed deny that the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences ever has any kind of moral significance.

Nevertheless, many criticisms of the principle of double effect do not proceed from consequentialist assumptions or skepticism about the importance and moral significance of distinguishing between what an agent intends and what an agent merely foresees. Instead, critics ask whether the principle adequately codifies the moral intuitions at play in the cases that have been taken to be illustrations of it.

4.2 The Problem of Closeness

One important line of criticism is known as the “problem of closeness”: it is difficult to distinguish between grave harms that are regretfully foreseen as side effects of the agent’s means and grave harms that are so close to the agent’s means that it seems that they must be (regretfully) intended as part of the agent’s means. In the Abortion vs Hysterectomy example, it is hard to see why the death of the fetus would not be a regretfully foreseen side effect of saving the mother’s life in both cases (Boyle 1991). Or, alternatively, it is hard to see why the death of the fetus would not be regretfully intended as part of the physician’s means of saving the mother’s life in both cases (Davis 1984, 110). Those who wish to apply double effect to this example must provide principled grounds for distinguishing between the cases in this way; no clear resolution of this problem has emerged (a summary of proposals is discussed by Dana Nelkin and Samuel Rickless 2015).

4.3 The Side Effect Effect

Are we more inclined to call a harmful result a merely foreseen side effect when we believe that it is permissibly brought about, while also being more inclined to describe a harmful result as something that was intended as part of the agent’s means when we believe that it is impermissibly brought about? If so, there will be an association between permissible harms that are classified as side effects and impermissibly caused harms that are classified as results brought about intentionally, but this association cannot be explained by the principle of double effect. Research by Joshua Knobe (2003, 2006) has demonstrated that the ways in which we distinguish between results that are intended or brought about intentionally and those that are mere side effects may be influenced by normative judgments in such a way as to bias our descriptions: we are more likely to say a result was brought about intentionally when we disapprove of it. This was first pointed out by Gilbert Harman (1976), but is now often referred to as “The Knobe Effect” or “The Side Effect Effect”. Suppose that an agent decided to swerve a runaway trolley away from a track with a rare wildflower on it and onto a track with one track workman on it. Would you say that the agent intended to cause the track workman’s death in order to spare the wildflower? If you would also say that the bystander who switches the trolley away from the track with five track workmen on it and onto a track with one track workman on it foresees the death of the one as a side effect of saving the five, but does not intend it, then your judgments exemplify the Side Effect Effect. If you believe that it is permissible to swerve the trolley onto the one to save five but not permissible to swerve the trolley onto the one to save the wildflower, then this moral judgment influences whether the death of the one is intended or a merely foreseen side effect. Does the distinction between intended and merely foreseen consequences of action relied upon by the principle of double effect fail to serve as an evaluatively neutral basis for moral judgments? If so, it might guide and explain how actions are described without being a reliable guide to evaluating actions.

4.4 Direct and Indirect Agency

Warren Quinn has proposed that what is valuable and correct about applications of double effect could be formulated as involving a distinction between direct and indirect agency. On his view, double effect “distinguishes between agency in which harm comes to some victims, at least in part, from the agent’s deliberately involving them in something in order to further his purpose precisely by way of their being so involved (agency in which they figure as intentional objects), and harmful agency in which either nothing is in that way intended for the victims or what is so intended does not contribute to their harm” (1989, p. 343; see also Nelkin and Rickless, 2014). Quinn explains that “direct agency requires neither that harm itself be useful nor that what is useful be causally connected in some especially close way with the harm it helps bring about” (1989, p. 344). He acknowledges that “some cases of harming that the doctrine intuitively speaks against are arguably not cases of intentional harming, precisely because neither the harm itself (nor anything itself causally very close to it) is intended” (1991, p. 511).

Quinn’s reformulation of double effect is not absolutist in character. He observes that a result brought about through direct agency might not be impermissible; instead it would require more offsetting benefit than the same result brought about through indirect agency in similar circumstances.

Quinn’s proposal would effectively broaden the category of results that count as the more problematic form of direct agency in causing harm. As a result, if we believe that some forms of direct agency that involve causing death are permissible, we will have to seek some other explanation than double effect’s claim that the harms are indirect or merely foreseen. The soldier who throws himself on the grenade in order to shield his fellow soldiers from the force of an explosion has directly involved himself in the protective action. Shelly Kagan (1999, 145) points out that if someone else were to shove the soldier on the grenade we would certainly say that that the harm to the soldier was intended by the person who did the shoving, even if the shoving was intended to promote the goal of saving the lives of others. Equally, we should say that it is intended in this case – not as a goal or as an end pursued for its own sake but as a means to an end. The same kind of argument can be made for cases of killing in self-defense when overwhelming and lethal force is used. If these are cases of permissible direct agency, and if Quinn is right that the distinction between direct and indirect agency explains the intuitive appeal of double effect’s contrast between intended means and foreseen side effects, then these cases cast doubt on the claim that double effect explains why the life-saving actions in the Hysterectomy, Heroic Shielding and Self-defense examples are permissible.

4.5 Does double effect provide an adequate explanation of the trolley cases?

It seems clear to many people that if one were to switch the trolley from a track with five people to a track with only one, the harm to the one person would not be intended as part of one’s means of diverting the trolley from the five to save their lives and would therefore count as a foreseen side effect of swerving the trolley. Quinn’s proposal would not count it as a case of direct agency. These considerations alone do not show that it is justified to switch the trolley. Double effect might seem to explain the contrasting impermissibility of pushing someone onto the track in front of the speeding trolley in order to stop it in order to protect five people who cannot escape on the track ahead. In both scenarios, a person would be killed as part of one’s plan for saving the five. Because of this, the difference in permissibility might seem to depend on whether the death of that person is a means to saving the five or a side effect of doing so.

Discussions of the Trolley Problem and the relevance of the principle of double effect to explaining our intuition that it is permissible to swerve the trolley can be divided into three groups. First, there are those who take the paired intuitions in the Trolley Problem as proof of the fundamental role of the distinction between intended means and foreseen side effects in an implicit principle guiding moral judgment (Mikhail, 2011). Second, some argue that it would be wrong for a bystander to switch the trolley (Thomson, 2008, contradicting Thomson 1976 and 1985) and suggest that people’s willingness to view it as permissible is a result of inadequate reflection. This group would include those who uphold an absolutist version of the principle of double effect and deny that it provides a permission to swerve the trolley (Anscombe, 1982). Third, one could reject the claim that the principle of double effect could explain the permissibility of switching the trolley (McIntyre, 2001), while remaining neutral about what verdict to render about such artificial cases.

Can our intuitions about the Trolley Problem be generalized to other cases? Autonomous vehicles might be equipped with algorithms that treat the alleged permissibility of swerving the trolley away from the five and onto the one as an important precedent. Avoiding dangerous collisions with other vehicles by swerving onto sidewalks where pedestrians may or may not be be present might be viewed as ethically similar to swerving the trolley. Or, as Patrick Lin suggests (2016, 76–7), an autonomous car driving on a cliffside roadway that encounters a school bus with many passengers that has moved into its lane as it rounds a sharp corner, might decide to sacrifice itself and its passengers to avoid the more dangerous collision with a school bus and the greater predicted loss of life. This should make us all consider whether the highly abstract and context-less trolley problem elicits reliable moral judgments that can be used as a precedent in programming autonomous vehicles (see also discussion of the trolley problem and autonomous vehicles in Nyholm and Smids 2016). You, as the Bystander at the Switch, have no special positive duty toward the five that requires you to assist them, and you have no special negative duty toward the one that requires you not to harm him. What duties does an autonomous vehicle have to its driver, other drivers, and nearby pedestrians? Have drivers assumed a risk simply by driving that pedestrians have not assumed by using a sidewalk? Should the algorithms promote ethical concerns or the interests of drivers? Who would buy an autonomous vehicle that would always sacrifice its passengers to prevent greater loss of life?

4.6 Does Double Effect Explain the Permissibility of Risky Rescues and Rescue by Reducing the Extent of Harm?

Proponents of double effect have argued that agents may cause certain and serious harm or run the risk of causing serious harm when they are trying to prevent even greater harm that would otherwise be certain to occur. In such cases, the harm or the risk of harm is described as foreseen by the agent but not intended. Dangerous surgery undertaken to save a life is one example (Anscombe 1982; Boyle 1991; Uniacke 1998). Uniacke mentions that the distinction between intended and foreseen effects can also be applied to acts of justifiable risk-taking in which the good effect and the bad effect are “incompatible outcomes”, noting that a parent might justifiably throw a child out of a burning building in an attempt to save its life (1998, s. 3). The parent intends to prevent certain death, while foreseeing that the rescue might cause death.

Could it be claimed that the rescuing agents foresaw a risk of causing harm as a side effect of their attempt at rescue but did not intend to risk harm to those they were trying to rescue? Proponents of double effect claim that the physician foresaw but did not intend that the patient might not survive risky surgery, that the parent foresaw but did not intend that the child could be killed by the fall, and that the soldier foresaw but did not intend to cause his own death (Uniacke 1998). But this justification is incomplete for two reasons. First, emphasizing that the risk of causing death is foreseen by the rescuer but not intended by the rescuer implicitly compares the rescuer’s motives with the motives of agents who aimed to cause death as an end, out of malice, callousness, or some other wrongful motive. But double effect speaks only about the contrast between harming as a side effect of promoting a good end and harming as part of one’s means of promoting a good end. Second, this justification fails to distinguish between intending to impose a risk of death on a person by acting in a certain way and intending to cause death. These agents certainly did not intend to cause death, but they did intend to impose a risk of death on a person by acting in a certain way.

The physician who undertakes dangerous surgery in a patient who would otherwise face certain death is attempting to reduce the risk of harm to the patient. Undertaking the risky surgery constitutes the physician’s means of lowering the patient’s risk of death. The surgery is chosen because it imposes a lower risk of death on the patient than what the patient faced without it. The surgeon intended to impose a (lower) risk of death on the patient by undertaking the risky surgery. Given that fact, it is not true that the surgeon did not intend to impose a risk of harm. Imposing a (lower) risk of harm in order to prevent a greater harm is exactly what the agent intended to do. This was not a foreseen side effect of action, this was what constituted the physician’s attempt to save the patient’s life.

Similarly, the soldier who throws himself on a grenade is attempting to reduce the extent of the harm that the explosion will cause by attempting to absorb the force of the explosion with his body. The heroic action is chosen because it imposes a very high risk of harm to himself, thereby lowering the risk of harm to others nearby. Such rescues seem to be cases in which agents act permissibly when they choose to impose a risk of death on someone as their means of lowering that person’s risk of death (surgery, burning building) or as their means of lowering the risk of harm to others nearby (self-sacrifice). This involves imposing a risk of harm on a person in order to promote a good end. It seems that the agents do intend to impose a risk of harm on the person they involve: that is their means to the good end. If this is permissible, double effect does not have the resources to explain why it is permissible, since it is harmful – but justifiably harmful – direct agency. These cases satisfy Warren Quinn’s definition of direct agency as agency in which “harm comes to some victims, at least in part, from the agent’s deliberately involving them in something in order to further his purpose precisely by way of their being so involved (agency in which they figure as intentional objects),” and they clearly do not satisfy the definition of harmful indirect agency as agency “in which either nothing is in that way intended for the victims or what is so intended does not contribute to their harm” (1989, p. 343). If the risky surgery is unsuccessful and the patient dies, the surgeon cannot say that what was intended, dangerous but potentially life-saving surgery, did not contribute to the harm.

4.7 The Role of Conventions and Norms in Warfare

The contrast between the Terror Bomber and the Tactical Bomber is often viewed as the least controversial pair of examples illustrating the distinction between intention and foresight that underlies the principle of double effect. The judgment that the Terror Bomber acts impermissibly and the Tactical Bomber acts permissibly is widely affirmed. Terror bombing was engaged in by both sides in World War II (see Douglas Lackey (1989) for a thoughtful historical account of the decision process engaged in by Allied decision-makers and the controversy it generated at the time). The view that terror bombing is always impermissible would condemn the kind of incendiary bombing carried out by Allied forces in Germany and Japan.

The common judgment that tactical bombing is permissible provided that it is proportionate also deserves more scrutiny than it usually receives when it is taken to be justified by the principle of double effect. How much of an obligation do military strategists have to avoid harm to civilian populations? This is a substantive issue about the conventions that constrain military decision-making and the principles that underlie these conventions. Many relevant considerations depend on judgments that are far outside the ambit of Double Effect. For example, the Rules of Customary International Humanitarian Law displayed on the website of the International Committee of the Red Cross prohibit attacks targeting civilians. They also include protections designed to minimize harm to civilians:

Rule 15. Precautions in Attack In the conduct of military operations, constant care must be taken to spare the civilian population, civilians and civilian objects. All feasible precautions must be taken to avoid, and in any event to minimize, incidental loss of civilian life, injury to civilians and damage to civilian objects.

Rule 20. Advance Warning Each party to the conflict must give effective advance warning of attacks which may affect the civilian population, unless circumstances do not permit.

Rule 24. Removal of Civilians and Civilian Objects from the Vicinity of Military Objectives Each party to the conflict must, to the extent feasible, remove civilian persons and objects under its control from the vicinity of military objectives.

These considerations suggest that the principle of double effect does not contain, even when the principle of proportionality is included as part of its content, a sufficient condition of permissibility for bombardment that affects civilian populations. The example so frequently invoked by philosophers concerning the permissibility of tactical bombing in which civilian deaths are foreseen never mentions a duty to warn or remove civilians.

5. End of Life Decision-Making

5.1 Pain Relief in Palliative Care

The principle of double effect is often mentioned in discussions of what is known as palliative care, medical care for patients with terminal illness in need of pain relief. Double effect is cited as a justification for the view that it is permissible to administer opioid drugs to relieve the suffering of a terminally ill patient, foreseeing that the hastening of death will occur as a side effect. Double effect reasoning in this context seems to express the compassionate view that physicians may not intend to cause the death of a patient, but may accept that actions intended to relieve pain might hasten death. Three assumptions often operate in the background of these discussions:

  1. It would be impermissible to administer an opioid drug in a dose high enough to hasten the patient’s death in order to cut short the suffering of a terminally ill patient in the process of dying.
  2. The side effect of hastening death is an inevitable or at least likely result of the administration of an opioid drug in order to relieve the pain of a terminally ill patient.
  3. The hastening of death is a not unwelcome side effect of providing pain relief in the context of palliative care.

If the first assumption is not made, double effect has no explanatory role to play. Those who appeal to double effect in this context must also assume that it would be impermissible to hasten the death intentionally of a terminally ill patient whom one was treating with opioids for pain in order to shorten the process of dying. If one believes that this is permissible, then double effect is not needed to explain its permissibility.

The second assumption is false. Physicians and researchers have insisted repeatedly that it is a myth that opioids administered for pain relief can be expected to hasten death (Sykes and Thorns, 2003 provide a review of a large number of studies supporting this claim). There is no research that substantiates the claim that opioid drugs administered appropriately and carefully titrated are likely to depress respiration. In a survey of research bearing on this issue, Susan Anderson Fohr (1998) concludes: “It is important to emphasize that there is no debate among specialists in palliative care and pain control on this issue. There is a broad consensus that when used appropriately, respiratory depression from opioid analgesics is a rarely occurring side effect. The belief that palliative care hastens death is counter to the experience of physicians with the most experience in this area.” The mistaken belief that pain relief will have the side effect of hastening death may have the unfortunate effect of leading physicians, patients, and the patients’ families to under-treat pain because they are apprehensive about causing this allegedly inevitable side effect.

The third claim – that the hastening of death is not unwelcome in these circumstances – ignores the role of the patient and the patient’s medical proxy in assessing whether hastening death is a desirable result. It represents the physician’s role as one that does not require consultation with the patient or the patient’s proxy or attention to advance directives for guidance. If hastening the death of a patient with a terminal condition is desirable according to the patient or the patient’s proxy, then many thoughtful people would view the first assumption to be false: it would be permissible to intend to relieve pain while also intending to hasten the death of a terminally ill patient (see Allmark, Cobb, Liddle, and Todd 2010; Kamm 1999; Quinn 1989, 343, n.17; McIntyre 2004). On the other hand, if the hastening of death is not desirable according to the patient or the patient’s proxy, it is not permissible to hasten death in the course of treating pain, especially since hastening death is neither likely nor inevitable when treating pain. Patients receiving palliative care whose pain can be adequately treated with opioid drugs may well value additional days, hours or minutes of life as they look forward to meetings with family members. A physician’s duty of compassion does not override the patient’s preferences in such a weighty matter. The apparently compassionate assumption that the hastening of death is a desirable result when a patient is being treated for pain is unduly paternalistic in this context.

Note that if the physician views the hastening of death as something that would be good for the patient, and the patient or the patient’s proxy agrees, then even a secular version of double effect does not apply to this situation: the hastening of death would be a benefit for the patient, not a harm. As the discussion in Section 1 (Formulations) has shown, any plausible formulation of double effect would require agents to seek to minimize or avoid the merely foreseen harms that they cause as side effects. On this point, popular understandings of double effect reasoning at the end of life, with the third assumption in place, diverge from what the principle assumes: the popular understanding of double effect might involve the assumption that hastening death is a merciful act and not a harm to be avoided.

Note that a variety of substantive medical and ethical judgments provide the justificatory context for this example: the patient is terminally ill, there is an urgent need to relieve pain and suffering, death is imminent, and we can now add that the condition that the patient or the patient’s proxy consents. The consent of the patient or the patient’s proxy is not naturally classified as a concern with proportionality, understood as the physician’s weighing of harms and benefits.

5.2 Terminal Sedation

In a U.S. Supreme Court decision that rejected arguments for permitting patients with terminal illness to request assistance from a physician in ending their lives (Vacco et al. v. Quill et al., 117 S.Ct. 2293 (1997), Chief Justice William Rehnquist, writing for the majority, invoked double effect not only as a justification for the administration of pain-relieving drugs that might hasten death but also as a justification for the practice known as terminal sedation or continuous sedation. This occurs when patients with terminal conditions who experience intractable pain that cannot be treated effectively with opioid or other analgesic drugs are treated with sedative drugs (which do not typically have analgesic properties) in order to induce unconsciousness. Artificial hydration and nutrition are not provided for patients sedated for these reasons in the context of palliative care at the end of life. If death is not already imminent for such a deeply sedated patient, dehydration and starvation will make it inevitable. In such cases, withholding life-sustaining treatment does in fact hasten death, intentionally but justifiably. Prolonging the process of dying for a continuously sedated patient, in whom sedation was initiated to deal with intractable pain, does not benefit the patient.

In some cases, the patient’s right to refuse life-sustaining treatment, as expressed directly by the patient or through a proxy or an advance directive, is the justification for withholding artificial hydration and nutrition during terminal sedation. If a dying patient views hastening death as a good to be pursued, then double effect’s presumption that death is a harm that a physician may not intend to bring about is at odds with the preferences of a patient who rejects artificial hydration and nutrition in order to hasten death.

Timothy E. Quill, M.D., Rebecca Dresser, J.D, and Dan W. Brock, Ph.D. argue that double effect, if applied consistently, would rule out the practice of terminal sedation. “Unlike the use of high-dose opioids to relieve pain, with death as a possible but undesired side effect, terminal sedation inevitably causes death, which in many cases is what the patient desires. Although the overall goal of terminal sedation is to relieve otherwise uncontrollable suffering, life-prolonging therapies are withdrawn with the intent of hastening death. Terminal sedation would thus not be permitted under the rule of double effect, even though it is usually considered acceptable according to current legal and medical ethical standards” (Quill, Dresser and Brock, 1997; see also Quill, Lo and Brock 1997).

The belief that doctors can cite double effect reasoning to justify actions that hasten death tends to obscure rather than clarify these important issues in palliative care. A single principle is no substitute for the professional expertise of palliative care specialists who seek to ensure a patient’s comfort at the end of life by using a variety of forms of care while respecting the patient’s right to refuse even life-sustaining treatment. Standardized forms that invite patients with advanced chronic illnesses to specify in advance their Medical (or Physician) Orders regarding Life-Sustaining Treatment (MOLST or POLST form) allow patients to request or to reject various treatments that would extend their lives while also opting for forms of medical care that will promote their comfort in dying (Bomba 2011). A physician providing palliative care with the goal of promoting the patient’s comfort might provide pain relief, supplemental oxygen or artificial hydration to a patient with the goal of increasing their comfort, even when these treatments also have the effect of extending life and prolonging the process of dying. The issues are complex and cannot be resolved with a single principle that endorses a single remedy. The compassionate ethos that the traditional application of double effect is often understood to express is a central commitment of palliative care, but the considerations to be taken into account go beyond what could be explained by the principle of double effect.

6. One principle or many loosely related exceptions to a general prohibition on causing grave harms?

It is not at all clear that all of the examples that double effect has been invoked to justify can be explained by a single principle, since there may be a variety of considerations that bear on the permissibility of causing grave harms in particular contexts. Perhaps all of these cases have in common the feature that the agent acts to promote a good end in a permissible manner and regrets any harms that are involved. For some proponents of double effect, these facts are enough to show that the harms that are caused should be described as merely foreseen side effects.

Critics of the use of double effect as an explanatory principle point out that the proportionality condition is vague and too general, requiring only that the good effect outweigh the foreseen bad effect or that there be sufficient reason for causing the bad effect. These critics add that when substantive principles that explain the permissibility of causing the kind of harm in question are explicitly formulated, these principles are doing all of the justificatory work (Davis 1984; McIntyre 2001). These substantive considerations are not derived from double effect and in some cases do not support the traditional applications of double effect. If this criticism is correct, then perhaps the cases that have traditionally been cited as applications of the principle of double effect are united only by the fact that each is an exception to the general prohibition on causing the death of a human being.

The historical origins of the principle of double effect as a tenet of Catholic casuistry might explain the appearance that there is a single principle with diverse applications. If one were to assume that it is absolutely prohibited to cause the death of a human being, then it would be impermissible to kill an aggressor in self-defense, to sacrifice one’s life to protect others, to hasten death as a side effect of administering sedation for intractable pain, to endanger non-combatants in warfare, to undertake risky surgery to save a patient’s life, to perform a hysterectomy on a pregnant woman in order to save her life, or to swerve the trolley. However, if one were to assume instead that what is absolutely prohibited is to cause the death of a human being intentionally, then these cases can be viewed as cases in which one might permissibly cause death regretfully viewing the death as a “merely foreseen side effect” of pursuing a good end.

However, as we have seen, it is hard to make sense of the idea that the soldier who throws himself on a grenade does not view his self-sacrifice as a means of protecting his fellow soldiers, or that the physician who performs a hysterectomy on a pregnant woman does not see the removal of the fetus as part of the life-saving procedure. It is true that we could emphasize the soldier’s motive by talking about what he intended: that his intention was not to cause his own death but to protect the lives of his fellow soldiers, or that the physician who performs a hysterectomy on a pregnant woman to save her life did not intend to kill the child, only to remove a cancerous uterus containing a fetus. But in the same way we could say of someone who ended her life: her intention was not to kill herself but to bring her suffering to an end; and of someone who killed an enemy he suspected of plotting against him that the did not intend to kill the enemy but instead intended to insure his own future security. This way of speaking amounts to saying that the harm that the agent caused was chosen as a means to the agent’s end and was not pursued for its own sake. But double effect is supposed to condemn, not to justify, grave harms intended as a means to a good end.

Some have developed this kind of criticism by arguing that the appeal of the principle of double effect is, fundamentally, illusory: an agent’s intentions are not relevant to the permissibility of an action in the way that the proponents of the principle of double effect would claim, though an agent’s intentions are relevant to moral assessments of the way in which the agent deliberated (see McCarthy 2002; Scanlon 2008). That an agent intended to bring about a certain harm does not make an otherwise permissible action impermissible, but it can explain what is morally faulty about the agent’s reasoning in pursuing that line of action.


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