Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions
Descartes on the Emotions
- 1. Introduction
- 2. The Project of Theodicy and the Function of the Passions
- 3. Passions, Medicine and Freedom
- 4. The Passions and the Nature of Mind-Body Union
- 5. The Definition of the Passions of the Soul
- 6. The Classification of the Passions
- 7. Wonder and Generosity
- 8. The Remedy for the Passions
- 9. The Influence of the Imagination
- 10. Influences on Later Authors
Descartes starts his Passions of the Soul (1649) by lamenting the sorry state of ancient writings on the passions, and declaring that “I shall be obliged to write just as if I were considering a topic that no one had dealt with before me” (AT XI 328, CSM I 328). It is true that he rejects aspects of Aquinas’s views and explicitly tasks those cruel philosophers who “require their sage to be insensible” (whom he identifies as the “Cynics,” then considered to represent a particularly austere form of Stoicism). But he also adopts many features of previous accounts. For instance, he uses the Stoic and Galenist notion of animal spirits (tailored to his own mechanistic physics), cites Vives on the physiology of laughter (AT XI 422, CSM I 372), and shows numerous, if rarely acknowledged, debts to Montaigne, Lipsius, and Suarez. Perhaps most notably, he adopts “passion” as his preferred vocabulary, contrasting it with action in a way that harks back to Aristotle.
2. The Project of Theodicy and the Function of the Passions
Much of the context for Descartes’s approach to the passions lies in his Meditations on First Philosophy (1641) (see also the corresponding sections of the 1644 Principles of Philosophy). As part of a general defense of God’s goodness in the face of seeming shortcomings in our nature, the Sixth Meditation seeks to justify the way in which we are equipped to respond to the outside world by experiencing sensations, appetites, and passions. Descartes has already argued that these confused, bodily-based perceptions are the source of much theoretical error, since they tempt us to attribute properties of our sensation to the extended world. Such errors, however, are not merely careless slips; sensations, appetities, and passions are so intrinsically confused that they provide material for error. They are thus ‘materially false’ perceptions. The hazards they present for theoretical knowledge, however, are merely the flip side to their practical functionality: sensations, appetites, and passions provide guides for maneuvering our bodies through the world, and ultimately for preserving the mind-body union that constitutes the human being. But practical efficiency comes at the cost of some fallibility. Under non-standard conditions (e.g., when we suffer from illness, or body parts go missing), our signposts may lead us astray. This is because they are generated by purely mechanical laws, according to a machine design that under normal circumstances allows them to serve certain ends, as is the case with a well-built watch. Thus, bodily-based perceptions are explained functionally: they are justified by way of their purposes, but how they serve those ends requires resort to strictly mechanical causation. The functional character, as well as the confusion, of these perceptions seems founded on their mixed ontological status: they are modes, yet “must not be referred either to the mind alone or to the body alone” (Principles, AT VIII 23, CSM I 209; for a range of interpretations, see Hoffman 1990, Brown 2006, Schickel 2011, and further below). Although the Meditations concentrates on our disposition to experience sense qualia, which normally mark qualities and differences between qualities of external things in relation to us, Descartes’s defense may work better for the appetites and passions. For these perceptions seem to have a built-in evaluative component that is directly related to their purposiveness (see Schmitter 2007). Later works address this feature of the passions explicitly.
3. Passions, Medicine and Freedom
The relation between the emotions and health is the topic of the correspondence between Descartes and Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia in 1643 and 1645. Starting with a letter of 6 May 1643 (AT III 660, Shapiro 2007 61–2), Elisabeth queries Descartes on how such metaphysically disparate things as mind and body can act on each other, to which Descartes responds by emphasizing that the mind and body form a genuine union. But by 1645, their discussion shifts to whether the mind can control the body, particularly its passions. Descartes diagnoses a “low grade fever” from which Elisabeth has been suffering as caused by sadness or melancholy, and recommends the familiarly Stoic-sounding remedy of reading Seneca, while reflecting on her mind and its ability to master bodily-based passions. Elisabeth takes exception to this suggestion, remarking that her “body imbued with a large part of the weaknesses of my sex … is afflicted very easily by the afflictions of the soul” (Elisabeth to Descartes, 24 May 1645, AT IV 208, Shapiro 2007 88). Despite the reference to her particular weakness, her point is general: there are certain bodily conditions – illness, weakness, stress, or just a “touch of the vapors” – that interfere with the mental activities of reasoning and willing, make us more prone to the passions, and thereby compromise our ability to apply the cure Descartes has recommended. Elisabeth here raises an important issue for the kind of neo-Stoic view Descartes advances in their correspondence: even if some people manage resolutely to overcome the passions and achieve happiness, is it possible to do so “without the assistance of that which does not depend absolutely on the will”? (Elisabeth to Descartes, 16 August 1645, AT IV 269, Shapiro 2007 100.) This question haunts many other early modern treatments of the emotions, and Spinoza in particular, adopts views that seem very close to Elisabeth’s concerns.
4. The Passions and the Nature of Mind-Body Union
As the correspondence with Elisabeth shows, the topic of the passions tends to arise in close proximity to that of mind-body union. Indeed, the Sixth Meditation explicitly introduces the union in order to explain the material falsity characteristic of our sense-perception, appetites and passions, while emphasizing that they manifest our embodiment: through them, nature teaches that “I am not merely present in my body as a sailor is present in a ship, but that I am very closely joined and, as it were intermingled with it, so that I and the body form a unit” (AT VII 81; CSM II 56). Later, the exchange with Elisabeth about interaction and the conduct of our embodied lives prompts Descartes to make his first attempt at a general characterization of the passions of the soul (see Descartes to Elisabeth, 6 October 1645, AT IV 310-11, Shapiro 2007 118-9).For these reasons, some commentators have looked to the passions to help explain how the union of mind and body is constituted.
But it is by no means clear what Descartes means by mind-body union, and in particular, what sort of metaphysical status the union has. When Princess Elisabeth quizzes him to explain the mechanics of interaction, Descartes replies by insisting that our understanding of interaction depends on the notion of union, which he identifies as one of the three “primitive notions,” along with that of the mind and that of the body, enabling all our knowledge (Descartes to Elisabeth, 21 May 1643, AT III 665, Shapiro 2007 65). In his rather exasperated correspondence with Regius, Descartes maintains in no uncertain terms that mind and body form an ens per se, that is, a genuine entity in itself, rather than a merely accidental conglomeration such as the per accidens entity formed out of conjoining me with the tree on which I lean (Descartes to Regius, December 1641, AT III 460, CSMK 200). This echoes the Fourth Replies where he calls mind and body a “unity in its own right” [unum per se] (AT VII 222, CSM II 157). In the replies and many other places, Descartes declares that mind and body form a “substantial union” [unio . . . substantialis], although at the same time he contends we have “a clear and distinct concept of the mind on its own as a complete thing” (AT VII 228, CSM II 160). So, the mind-body union is a unity in the sense that it is an individuable entity with some kind of determinate nature. Does that mean that it counts as a substance – a third kind of substance – albeit a composite one?
Paul Hoffman thinks that it does, and that ‘substance,’ ‘ens per se,’ and ‘complete thing’ are equivalent terms for Descartes (1986, 346, reprinted in 2009, 18; see also Broughton and Mattern 1978, 27). Taking a cue from Descartes’s description of the soul as the “substantial form” of the human body, he considers the full, embodied human being to be a hylomorphic unity, a substance in an Aristotelian sense. Since Descartes admits only the mind as a “true substantial form” (Descartes to Regius, January 1642, AT III 505, CSMK 208), the hylomorphic structure does not apply to substances other than human beings. But that union does give the embodied human a specific nature. And so, admitting this third kind of substance makes room to attribute specific modes to it, modes that would otherwise be tricky to locate, since they seem to modify both mind and body. They are modes of union, or as Hoffman dubs them, “straddling modes” (Hoffman, 1990, reprinted in 2009). The passions are just such straddling modes; they can only be understood as modifications of a being that is both bodily and mental. Hoffman can thereby make sense of important passages in the Passions of the Soul, where Descartes declares that “what is a passion in the soul is usually an action in the body” and identifies them as the “same thing” (AT XI 328, CSM I 328).
By elevating the metaphysical status of embodied humans, Hoffman has a counter to those commentators who maintain that Descartes’s talk of union is nothing more than an obfuscating way of talking about causal interaction (see Wilson 1978, p. 205). But taking the union as a third kind of substance comes with its own costs. In positing the real distinction between mind and body, Descartes cites their very different essences, which give them incompatible, even contradictory features (e.g., indivisible and divisible; see AT VII 85–6, CSM II 59). A composite substance with both natures would seem just the sort of ontological mess that Descartes objects to in scholastic metaphysics (see Comments on a Certain Broadsheet, AT VIIIB 348–9, CSM I 297–8). The Principles of Philosophy puts the demands of Descartes’s basic ontology bluntly: “to each substance there belongs one principal attribute.” Descartes there admits an equivocation in calling mind and body ‘substances’ along with the infinite God, but says nothing about even the possibility of any composite substances (AT VIIIA 24–25, CSM I 210–11; see also Alanen 2003, 62). Moreover, although the Passions of the Soul does identify the passions with bodily actions, it does so in the context of enjoining us to examine “the difference between the soul and the body,” to distinguish what belongs to each as a basic methodological principle (AT XI 328, CSM I 328). There is an explanatory difference between operations of the mind and operations of the body that must be recognized and respected when addressing the passions: there is no separate and irreducible science of the embodied human being.
Perhaps there is some middle ground between Hoffman’s trialist account and a thoroughly deflationary approach to the union. Recently, Deborah Brown and Calvin Normore have argued, for reasons both philosophic and historical, that the “substantial union” is not itself a substance. Drawing from the history of the term unio substantialis and from other places where Descartes talks about mereological wholes that are not substances, they argue that Descartes has the tools to treat the mind-body union as having its own genuine nature, without committing to a trialism of substance (see 2019, Chapter 6, especially pp. 187-200). As such, it can serve as the subject for “unique sensory and affective predicates” (2019, 173). This seems a plausible way to fit ordinary, middle-sized objects into Descartes’s ontology. Still, Descartes himself remains pretty quiet about any general strategy for individuating unities other than his stripped-down ontology of substances, attributes and modes. This is in marked contrast to, e.g., Spinoza, who discusses what it is to be a “singular thing” at length (see Ethics IID7, IIIP6-7, and IVA1). So, there seems some reason for the metaphysical status of mind-body union to remain vexed.
However we understand the ontology, what does seem clear is that the experience of the passions, as well as other bodily-based perceptions such as sense-perceptions, provides a phenomenology of union: our sense-perceptions, appetites and passions enable us to experience ourselves as embodied humans, spatially located relative to extended, sensible objects and interacting with them. This is what Deborah Brown describes as “phenomenological monism – an experience of being one unified and embodied substance” (2006, 3). This is not ‘experience’ as later empiricists would understand it, but the rich, value-laden experience afforded through sense-perceptions and passions, experience of “ those things which pertain to the union of the soul and the body.” Such things are “known very clearly by the senses,” but only “obscurely by the understanding alone, or even by the understanding aided by the imagination” (Descartes to Elisabeth, 28 October 1643, AT III 691-2, Shapiro 2007 69). The experience, Descartes emphasizes, is pre-reflective experience, vivid, but confused, and irreducible to those distinct ideas that have been distilled through and refined for the understanding (see Alanen 2008). As such, we should not expect to be able to explain the experience away through a process of clarifying and distinguishing its components. The notion of the union is primitive for the experience of the passions and other body-based perceptions, and also required for their defense. Here, again, the passions seem a particularly exemplary kind of the rich, clear, yet not fully distinct experience Descartes has in mind. The passions present their objects in relation to the embodied human, e.g., something is good for me-qua-embodied, or poses a risk for me-qua-embodied. Embodiment itself also may become the object of a passionate love and care when, say, bodily health elicits love and joy in the soul. Indeed the passions and their intellectual counterparts may help explain how we come to identify with the union: Descartes speculates about how the soul when it “began to be joined to our body” perceives the body’s proper development, loves it, and thus joins itself willingly to the body, so as to make a more perfect union (AT XI 407-8, CSM I 365-6; see also Rorty 1986, Alanen 2003, 197).
5. The Definition of the Passions of the Soul
The correspondence with Elisabeth prodded Descartes to produce his most important text on the emotions, the Passions of the Soul, in response to her demand to “define the passions, in order to know them better” (Elisabeth to Descartes, 13 September 1645, AT IV 289, Shapiro 2007 110). The Passions of the Soul may not be a completely satisfactory explanation of mind-body union, but it does provide the definition Elisabeth asked for, as well as an intricate taxonomy of the passions, a description of their bodily causes, effects and function, and an account of the pursuit of virtue that addresses the means and extent to which we can regulate the passions.
Descartes’s definition of “passion” works by honing in on stricter and stricter senses of the term. In the first place, passions are simply those “functions” of the soul that are not actions: namely, perceptions. But since actions, such as volitions, can themselves be perceived, Descartes prefers to restrict the term to those perceptions caused by the body. Even this is a bit too broad, and so Descartes defines passions proper as “those perceptions, sensations or emotions of the soul which we refer particularly to it, and which are caused, maintained and strengthened by some movement of the spirits” (AT XI 349, CSM I 338–9). Descartes thereby locates passions squarely in perception, although he gives a nod to other views by calling them “emotions” (motions, changes, agitations, disturbances). Referring them to the soul allows him to distinguish passions from other bodily-based perceptions, such as the sense-perceptions we refer to external objects. What Descartes means by “referred to the soul” here is none too clear, except insofar as he maintains that the experience of the passions cannot be localized in some part of the body (as can feelings of pain or heat), and indeed, “we do not normally know any proximate cause to which we can refer them” (AT XI 347, CSM I 337). (Note that Descartes uses “cause” in several different senses throughout the Passions; cause here cannot be identified with the object.) The last part of the definition – that the passions are “caused, maintained and strengthened by some movement of the spirits” – is also important for differentiating the passions from non-bodily-based perceptions, such as voluntary imaginings. The “spirits” whose movement Descartes discusses here are the animal spirits of Galenist physiology, reinterpreted in light of Harvey’s discovery of the circulatory system and his own mechanist principles: they are simply fine and lively parts of the blood, rarified by the heart and brain, and passing through the brain to the nerves and then to the muscles to produce bodily motions. The physiology of the passions is an important component in the accounts of the causes, effects, functions and regulation of the passions. Each of the main passions receives a detailed description of the bodily changes that accompany it, such as changes in color, body temperature, facial expression, disposition of the limbs and the like, which can in turn be attributed to the movements of the spirits and heart.
The principal effect of the passions is to “move and dispose the soul to want the things for which they prepare the body” (AT XI 359, CSM I 343). They act on the soul by way of “the agitation by which the spirits move the little gland [i.e., the pineal gland] in the middle of the brain” (AT XI 371, CSM I 349), which thereby excite various perceptions in the soul. (For further discussion of this topic, see the related entry Descartes and the Pineal Gland.) But the pineal gland can be moved by many different causes. For this reason, Descartes admits that many other kinds of perceptions and volitions stand in close causal and experiential relations to the passions proper. Particularly important are what Descartes calls “intellectual” or “internal emotions,” such as the intellectual devotion felt when contemplating the idea of the true God, or the sadness that stems from reflecting on my errors. These have the soul as their cause, and so are properly speaking, volitions, but they are also affective states, and in embodied creatures like us are they may be difficult to disentangle from bodily-based passions.
Each genuine passion is characterized by an account of its motivational force (for which the “reference to the soul” is important), paired with a description of how it “represents” its object, which under normal conditions is also the cause of the series of bodily changes resulting in the passion. Although he does not deny that each passion has some distinctive felt character, Descartes offers no description of it other than the presentation of the object under some evaluative description and its effect on the will. In general, the “principal and most common causes” are objects, considered according to “the various ways in which they may harm or benefit us, or in general have importance for us” (AT XI 372, CSM I 349). Passions are not judgments, since judgments require an act of the will to affirm or deny. But they do have complex, propositional-like contents: through the passion of fear, I perceive that an oncoming train is dangerous to me, viz., I perceive it as dangerous. It is because these contents are evaluative that the passions will be motivating in ways that are normally functional.
6. The Classification of the Passions
Descartes identifies six “primitive” passions: wonder, which he calls “the first of all the passions,” love and hatred, desire, and joy and sadness. They are each distinct: desire, for instance, is directed at the future, whereas love is a passion involving a “consent by which we consider ourselves from the present on as joined with which we love, in the sense that we imagine a whole of which we think of ourselves only as one part and the loved thing as another” (AT XI 387, modified from CSM I 356). And each of these passions, except for wonder, have a built-in direction of motion, either appetitive or aversive depending on how they evaluate their objects – a feature that serves as an important organizing principle for Descartes. On this basis, Descartes opposes love to hatred, and joy to sadness. Desire has no opposite, since it comprises both appetites and aversions.
Descartes also accepts “an unlimited number” of further, specific passions, which he calls combinations of the six primitive passions. But he seems to find his most important taxonomical principles elsewhere, e.g., in the passion’s intensity (timidity is different from terror), whether its object is oneself or another (self-esteem differs from veneration), and in further modifications of the object and its relation to us (love is distinguished from the devotion we feel for an object “greater” than we are, such as God). Descartes allows that some passions involve mixtures, even contrary mixtures as in hope and fear. But since passions literally push the pineal gland in a particular direction, movements in different directions tend to cancel each other out. Passions seem to ‘combine’ most readily by producing trains of passions: desire may give rise to love, which may in turn generate joy. Trains of passions may involve passions with contrary directions, but this produces the rather uncomfortable sensations of remorse, or repentance. In fact, Descartes takes it as a basic explanatory principle that the passions do not oppose each other, and rejects the Thomist distinction between irascible and concupiscible appetites, and correlative divisions in the soul itself (AT XI 379, CSM I 352). The sort of conflicts that this distinction was supposed to explain Descartes instead attributes to different causes, to movements coming from the soul (the will) and to movements originating in the body, which can, but need not, propel the pineal gland in contrary directions.
7. Wonder and Generosity
Perhaps the most distinctive of the passions that Descartes identifies, however is the one that involves no evaluation of its object: wonder [admiration] merely presents its object as something novel or unusual. As such, wonder produces no change in the heart or the blood, which would prepare the body for movement. But it does involve the motions of the animal spirits through the brain and into the muscles, thereby fixing an “impression” of the object in the brain. And that explains the function of wonder: to “learn and retain in our memory things of which we were previously ignorant” (AT XI 384, CSM I 354). It is our response to those features of the world worthy of our consideration – something useful both for the preservation of the mind-body union and for the soul itself in its pursuit of knowledge. Wonder also manifests how our intentionality can become embodied, by bringing bodily resources to bear in directing our attention to an object (see Schmitter 2017, also Alanen 2003, chap. 6). Descartes’s understanding of wonder may well recall Aristotle’s famous dictum that philosophy begins with wonder. But wherever it begins, Descartes certainly does not think it should end there. Wonder at an unfamiliar object can become excessive, and make us crave novelty simply for its own sake. Such wonder is only functional if it prompts us to resolve it in the satisfaction of knowledge.
Another distinctive passion Descartes describes is generosity [generosité], which produces a kind of self-directed wonder, or esteem, grounded in our recognition “that nothing really belongs to us other than the free disposition of our volitions,” along with sensing “in ourselves at the same time a firm and constant resolution to use them well” (AT XI 446, slightly altered from CSM I 384). It is this passion that seems to be the keystone for “the pursuit of virtue,” in particular because it “serves as a remedy against all the disorders of the passions” (AT XI 447, CSM I 385). And although generosity is a perception directed at the self, combining a knowledge of what is truly important in and for ourselves with the will to act on the basis of that knowledge, it seems to generate like esteem for others: generous people do good without self-interest, are courteous, gracious and obliging, and live free from contempt, jealousy, envy, hatred, fear and anger for others. The key seems to be that generous people “are entirely masters of their passions” (AT XI 448, modified from CSM I 385).
8. The Remedy for the Passions
But Descartes does not think that passions should be eradicated wholesale: they are the sources of “the sweetest pleasures in this life” and “are all good in their nature” (AT XI 485, modified from CSM I 403) – with the possible exception of terror. Indeed, since they are functional by nature, it is not entirely clear why they should require remedy. True, like sense-perceptions, they can misfunction under non-standard circumstances. But unlike sense-perceptions, which give us material for error when we take them at face value in our theoretical reasonings, our passions do not seem to tempt us into thinking they reflect the independent structure of the world. It may be that Descartes holds that there is a conflict between the good for the mind-body union (preservation) and the good for the soul alone. This is something Malebranche insists on, and Descartes does allow that the two goods may fail to coincide (e.g., joy is always good for the soul, but not necessarily for the union). But his demand for mastery and management [mesnager] (AT XI 488) seems to be motivated just as much by the practical concerns of our embodied state. He identifies the remedy for disorders (or irregularities) of the passions [les dereglemens des Passions] quite generally with virtue, and virtue with happiness (AT XI 454). Perhaps though, the need for a remedy arises from the mechanical causation governing the physiology of the passions: it makes the passions simply too coarse to steer us as precisely as they could with further correction of their excesses and disorders.
In any case, Descartes clearly allows that our passions, based as they are on internal bodily dispositions to be moved by external objects, can conflict with our rationally considered evaluations of those objects – or what would be our evaluations, had we the time for proper deliberation. The disciplined pursuit of virtue averts such conflict by allowing the soul to improve on untutored nature in its dealings with its passions. The most important thing, Descartes tells us, is for the soul to equip itself with “firm and determinate judgments bearing upon the knowledge of good and evil, which the soul has resolved to follow in guiding its conduct” (AT XI 367, CSM I 347). But this is just the first step, for we should also alter our dispositions to feel the passions, by way of a kind of internal bodily training generating new and improved “habits” (AT XI 369, CSM I 348). What constitutes a “habit” is a matter of some controversy: it might be like the process of coming to perceive certain sounds as words, whereby we produce novel, learned conjunctions of perceptions and movements in the pineal gland. (This seems to be the view of Spinoza.) Or it might be a matter of the sort of physiological changes that take place during the training of hunting dogs, changes solely in body structure and movements, e.g., alterations in the internal structure of the brain and the subsequent coursing of the animal spirits. (This seems to be the view of Malebranche.) (On this issue, see Hoffman 1991, partially reprinted in 2009, Shapiro 2003, and Schmitter 2005.)
9. The Influence of the Imagination
The key to developing those habits that “stop the bodily movements which accompany” certain passions seems to lie in the body, particularly in the corporeal imagination (a part of the brain) and its practices. Descartes notes that an effective way of countering an undesirable passion is to imagine a new and different state of affairs, or response to the state of affairs. The act of imagining causes brain events, and so can serve as a voluntary, if indirect means to change the course of the animal spirits and eliminate the causes of some undesirable passion. More generally, entertaining any thought at all, especially a clear and distinct thought that we cannot help but affirm, carries an affective dimension that will in turn prompt movements in the imagination and the passions. The long-term consequences of such voluntary, imaginative practice is to reshape our internal bodily “dispositions” so that they produce specific passions under the appropriate, rationally endorsed circumstances.
For these and other reasons, remedying the passions is closely related to the maintenance of health. The pursuit of virtue, in particular, is presented as a kind of therapeutic and gymnastic regimen for the soul, one that corrects its weaknesses and increases its strength. It is a regimen whereby the soul harnesses the imagination and the body in general to work on itself. Mutatis mutandi, controlling the passions can have important consequences for bodily health. Exercising control over the passions means that we are simultaneously exercising control over the internal motions of the body – the beatings of the heart, circulation of the blood and heat, the disposition of the animal spirits, and so forth. It seems a fortunate fact that the way reason directs us to shape our passions coincides with the passionate production of healthful bodily movements (at least if our bodies are in even minimally working order). This accord between the education of the passions and the cultivation of health may indeed be Descartes’s trump card for his claim that the passions are good by nature.
10. Influences on Later Authors
Of course, it is this picture of harmony between the soul and the mind-body union and the prospect of complete mastery through resolute practice that Elisabeth found implausibly rosy. Spinoza and Malebranche will agree with her assessment, and each – in different ways – emphasizes our dependence on what is out of our control. But Descartes’s project remained extremely important, shaping the classificatory and explanatory apparatus of theories of the emotions for the next century and a half. The Cartesian feminist author François Poulain de la Barre cites both Descartes’s “Treatise on the Passions” and the correspondence with Elisabeth as part of a recommended plan of self-education, as well as using Descartes’s taxonomy of the simple passions (On the Education of Ladies in 2002, 218, 237). The Passions of the Soul was translated into English with remarkable speed, appearing by 1650, a mere year after its original publication. As a result, Descartes exerted a strong influence on British authors, even those who owed their main allegiances elsewhere, as was the case with the neo-Epicurean Walter Charleton. Henry More simply inserted chunks of the Passions of the Soul in his Enchiridion ethicum, while also appropriating bits and pieces from elsewhere (including an odd version of the distinction between concupiscible and irascible passions). In her Serious Proposal to the Ladies, Part II, Mary Astell cites both Descartes and More as good sources to understand the nature of the passions and “the Use of ’em” (2002, 218). Even those philosophers determined to break new ground felt his influence: Descartes’s taxonomy, for instance, clearly played a role in Hobbes’s account in the Leviathan, despite the very different theoretical styles of the two philosophers. And Descartes’s general approach to the passions as functional remained a bone of contention for generations to come, one fought over in rather different ways by Hobbes, Malebranche and Spinoza.