Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

Malebranche on the Emotions

1. Introduction

Part V of Nicolas Malebranche’s most famous work, the voluminous Search after Truth (1674–5) is devoted entirely to the passions, while other parts treat different kinds of affective states, such as the “inclinations”. Malebranche freely acknowledges his debt to Descartes here and elsewhere, but his treatment of the passions differs on at least two counts: first is the emphasis on original sin and our fallen, corrupted nature, which shows Malebranche’s affinity with Augustine and the Augustinian revival of the 17th century. Second is the rejection of the Cartesian view granting priority to knowledge of our own mind. Although we are capable of clear and distinct ideas through the “vision in God,” Malebranche denies that direct experience of our soul and its modifications provides such ideas. In this way, he gives a very un-Cartesian twist to the Cartesian claim that the passions of the soul (and similar perceptions) are confused. Less important for our purposes is Malebranche’s notorious occasionalism, the view that genuine causal power belongs only to God. We need simply to bear in mind that talk of “natural causes” is shorthand for those states or events that are the regular occasions for God to produce some effect. (For disussion of these topics, see the related entry Malebranche.)

2. The Constitutive Structure of the Passions

The Search After Truth V.3 identifies seven moments that together make up the structure of the passions. First is a judgment-like perception of the relation an object has to us; this perception may be either distinct or confused. Next comes a determination of the impulse of the will. Although clearly related to the first, the two cannot be identified, since Malebranche does not seem to think that a rational perception alone can be motivating, although the will responds to what appears a good. Along with the perception and determination of the will, we also get an accompanying sensation. The main thing that allows us to distinguish among passions is this sensation, insofar as it is a sensation of, e.g., “love, aversion, desire, joy, or sadness” (ST V.3, 348). Another element is bodily, a new determination of the flow of the animal spirits and blood. Following on the heels of these bodily changes is a sensible “emotion” of the soul as it feels itself moved by the unexpected flow of spirits. This, in turn, is followed by another sensation, peculiar to the particular passion in question, caused by the disturbances the animal spirits excite in the brain. Last is the sensation of joy, or inner delight [douceur intérieure] that accompanies all the passions.

Different passions may mobilize the elements of this structure differently. For instance, Malebranche allows that passions may differ because the first perceptions differ, even if the associated emotions do not (although that difference in perception will produce correlative changes in the third element, the sensation in the soul). In the case of passions excited by confused sensations, the first three elements (the evaluating perception, the inclination of the will, and the accompanying sensation) may be missing. The imperfect passion of wonder [admiration] lacks even more of the elements typical of other passions. Despite concessions to such truncated passions, the complicated and variable internal constitution of the passions allows Malebranche to adopt a holistic account in which the passions can be finely differentiated. However, the main principle of taxonomy is the relation the passion supposes between the object and us.

3. The Classification of the Passions

Malebranche’s taxonomy in the Search after Truth does not seem completely consistent, but in V.7, he declares that the two parent passions are love and hatred – although he follows Augustine in making love primary (see section 4 below). These produce three “general” passions of desire, joy and sadness, e.g., there can be desiderative love, joyful love and melancholy love. But Malebranche also throws wonder into the mix, calling it a passion that precedes all the others. He characterizes wonder in ways reminiscent of Descartes: it involves no evaluative perception of our relation to the object, and it doesn’t dispose the body towards action, since it produces no agitation in the nerves leading to the heart. It can be useful to science, prompting us to discover and learn new truths, although it can also malfunction. Despite including all six of what Descartes considered the “primitive” passions, the rest of Malebranche’s taxonomy differs a good deal from Descartes’s, as can be seen in the principles of classification offered in V.10. Love and hate may produce different species modified by desire, joy and sadness, but here Malebranche tells us that all passions can be reduced to the three “primitive” passions of desire, joy and sadness, combined with different judgments about the passions’ objects. Some passions don’t reduce to just one, but contain an emotion mixed of almost equal parts of two or more of the primitive passions, even mixtures of such seemingly opposed passions as joy and sadness. Wonder too can be divided into various species of, e.g., esteem, self-esteem, or pride, veneration, scorn, and humility.

4. The Functions of the Passions

Malebranche follows Descartes in maintaining that the passions are inherently functional for the union of mind and body, by teaching us what will preserve the body. Passions are in us, Malebranche maintains, because we have an essential relation to our bodies. The natural cause of the passions is the body, more specifically, the movement of animal spirits. The passions themselves are located in the will (although as we have seen, they contain components of various kinds). Thus, they are impulses or inclinations, comparable in some respects to what Malebranche calls “natural inclinations,” which are also affective and willful. But natural inclinations do not have their (natural, occasional) causes in the body, and occur even in pure intelligences, such as the angels. Natural inclinations are the distinguishing “motions” proper to the mind alone, in which God has imprinted a love of the good in general, which is simply part of God’s love for himself, and the source of all our particular loves (see ST IV.1). That we have such inclinations is a condition for our disposition to experience the passions: the passions are confused and bodily-dependent traces of God’s love. So Malebranche takes love to be the primary impulse driving all the passions. He does not, however, adopt the fully Augustinian position of reducing all passions to love. Since sensible pain is a real evil, and not simply a privation of good, there can be a genuine object of aversion. But if we are not fleeing pain, then aversion does reduce to love, to the pursuit of some good or other. More generally, our very capacity to experience passions is explained by their function in inclining us toward loving our bodies and all that might be useful for their preservation. Malebranche extends this functional explanation even to the natural causes of the passions: those movements “of the animal spirits that are dispersed throughout the body in order to produce and maintain in it a disposition appropriate to the object we perceive, so that the mind and body might be of mutual help in dealing with it” (ST V.1, 338). For this reason, the operation of the passions, even of aversive passions such as sadness, is always accompanied by a feeling of “inner delight,” a reflection that the body is in the proper state vis-à-vis the object.

Malebranche, however, takes the good that the passions serve to be a limited good; it is a good only for the mind-body union, not one of the goods for the soul alone (see Greenberg 2010). Moreover, the corruption that is our lot after the Fall affects our experience of the passions. Whereas Adam could feel the passions at will, we cannot. Moreover, the inner delight we feel accompanying all the passions is increased. And so, we typically find ourselves at the mercy of the passions, and thereby torn from the greater good of God. This is because we are not merely joined, but subjugated to our bodies – and through our bodies, to our “relatives, friends, city, prince, country, clothes, house, land, horse, dog, to the entire earth, the sun, the stars, to all the heavens” (ST V. 2, 342). Since union with God is the greatest of all goods, we should fight against the influence of the passions, even against the love that joins us more firmly to our bodies, and seek the separation required to devote ourselves to the good of the mind. As Malebranche puts it, the passions belong to “the order of nature,” and are well-ordered only if considered in relation to the preservation of the body. Even then, they may sometimes mislead us, although such cases are fortunately rare (see ST V.1, 340). In this respect, Malebranche differs somewhat from Descartes. His Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion (1688) addresses the phantom pains that served Descartes as exemplars of material falsity and thus a source of relatively faultless error on our part. But Malebranche (through the character Theodore) maintains that such error arises strictly from a culpable misuse of natural reason (or rather, natural “revelation”) (DMR 97). The difference is mostly a matter of emphasis, but it is a telling one.

5. The Role of Grace in Correcting the Passions

It is no easy task to overcome the influence of the passions in our corrupted state. The passions do not obey our rational will, and the inner delight that accompanies the operation of the passions makes for genuine discomfort if we struggle against their promptings. Here Malebranche’s view of how the Fall corrupted a battery of natural dispositions and inclinations that were inherently functional produces multiple evaluations of the role of pleasures and pains. This is reflected in his criticisms of previous theories of the emotions. The Epicureans were at fault for identifying the good with sensible pleasure (no matter how moderate and long-lasting that pleasure might be). But neither does the Stoic ideal of apatheia offer a satisfactory alternative, for it is simply implausible. Instead, Malebranche holds both that we have a duty to struggle against the delight that the passions afford in the name of a higher good, and that “there is no felicity without pleasure” (ST V.4, 361). Were all else equal, pleasure would be good, and we simply cannot conceive of a happiness that does not include pleasure and pleasurable affects. But all else is not equal. The problem with the views of both Epicureans and Stoics – and indeed even of such a nominally Christian author as Descartes – is that they see no need for Grace to overcome the dysfunctional wages of original sin. We can (and should) struggle against the passions, but Grace is required to restore the balance of power within our natures. It does so by providing us with a sensible delight in following reason and in the intellectual love of God, which will outweigh the discomfort of resisting the passions. Indeed, just as the corruption wrought by original sin has perverted our dispositions to pleasure to supercharge our bodily enjoyments, grace grants us new and powerful pleasure in the love and union with God, a sensible perception that God is our good (see ST V.4, 360, also Schmitter, forthcoming).

6. The Passions and Error

However, Malebranche’s main topic in The Search After Truth is not moral philosophy, but the methods for improving our attempts to discover the truth. The passions are simply not suited to pursuing this good; they tend to lead us into intellectual error, and so it is important to correct their influence. Following Descartes, Malebranche compares passions to sensations, and suggests that they offer a comparable opportunity for error by tempting us to attribute qualities belonging only to the subjective perceiving to the objects of those perceptions. The kinds of qualities we project are quite different in each case, but both involve projecting something peculiar to the interaction of mind and object onto the object alone. The passions also tempt us to errors of over-generalization: we may over-generalize about the objects of our passions, as when my hate for something makes me overlook even its good qualities; we may over-generalize about the dispositions of other humans, as when I assume that others tend to feel the same passions I do; and we may over-generalize about objects related to the objects of our passions, as when I groundlessly extend my dislike for some person to his friends and relations. In describing these sorts of errors, Malebranche adopts something of an associationist psychology, and his analysis foreshadows Hume’s analysis of prejudices. The passionate stance taken toward one object spreads to whatever might be associated in any number of ways with that thing. Unlike Hume, Malebranche does not offer specific principles of association, but he does offer a physiological explanation of the “spread.” Passions invigorate the flow of animal spirits through the brain just as the traces representing the object are called up. Because of their vigor, the spirits are likely to overflow to nearby, related traces of objects (association is here understood in terms of the proximity of brain traces), which then come along for the recollective ride. And so the “dominant passions” we feel will color our thinking about a wide range of objects. Malebranche attributes all sorts of theoretical errors, fashions, and factionalism (including what he clearly considers an irrational preference for scholastic philosophy) to the prejudices generated by such passionate overflow.

The influence of the passions is not all bad. Wonder can be useful for the sciences, just because of the vigor with which it stirs up the various animal spirits, and thereby allows us to fix our attention and retain things in memory. We may indeed need to call on the passion of wonder as a strategy in the pursuit of science, for instance by imagining something as novel (even more novel than it really is). But wonder can also malfunction, producing not learning, but stupefaction. Indeed, Malebranche takes the mistaken veneration felt for the ancient philosophers to rest in no small part on the way artists are wont to depict each as possessing “a huge head with a broad and high forehead and a magnificently full beard” (ST V.7, 383). And other passions that “involve the heart” more, and thereby dispose the body for action, can be yet more prejudicial to our interests. In particular, Malebranche declares that hatred and dread are the passions most damaging both to our reason and to civil society.

Malebranche insists time and time again that “all the passions seek their own justification” (ST V.11, 399). That is, they tend to maintain themselves through a kind of feedback loop that includes the production of judgments that accord with the passion and sustain it: cheerful passions will produce judgments that all is right in the world, whereas dread encourages judgments with the opposite character. Because they offer an alternative source for judgments, the passions can compete with our intellect and override its verdicts. Moreover, the passions draw support from other passions; they “cooperate among themselves,” producing self-sustaining complexes and trains of passion:

desire is animated by love, strengthened by hope, increased by joy, renewed by dread, accompanied by courage, envy, anger, and several other passions that in turn form an infinite variety of judgments that succeed one another and sustain the desire giving birth to them. (ST V.11, 402)

7. The Influence of the Imagination on the Passions

The support the passions afford each other is largely a matter of the relations among the perceptions and judgments generated by each passion, which can overwhelm the few resources available to the intellect to combat them. For this reason, intervening in the formation of those judgments can undermine the self-seeking justifications of the passions. Although he is not sanguine about our chances, Malebranche recommends that our best strategy is to recruit allies for the intellect, particularly by enlisting the imagination. Chapter V.8 describes how the passions stir up the animal spirits and leave brain traces that are not under the soul’s command,so that “ the passions, then, act on the imagination, and the imagination thus corrupted combats reason by continually representing things to it not as they are in themselves” (ST V.11, 402). But the imagination itself stands – to some extent – under the control of the mind, and is, in fact, “the only means the soul has of arresting the effects of its passions” (ST V.3, 351). The imagination is a bodily faculty, with physiological connections to the opening and contracting of the nerves that determine the flow of spirits and humors. That is a connection we can use and modify, for instance, by forming imaginative pictures to accompany various thoughts, including abstract thoughts. Now, even purely abstract thoughts may produce “inclinations in the soul,” e.g., thinking of truth, virtue, or God can produce an inclination of love. And inclinations of the soul (even those not directly related to the body) have bodily effects; in particular, they produce disturbances in the animal spirits. The imagination, however, adds a strong extra impetus to those effects. Actively deploying the imagination, then, can generate the entire train of sensations and emotions typical of that passion we deem appropriate, namely the passion in accord with the soul’s natural inclinations. We can also resist the pernicious influences of the imagination caused by recalcitrant passions through techniques of association. Training ourselves to associate some thought with whatever arouses our passion, we can redirect the accompanying bodily movements as we see fit. Doing so repeatedly produces a habituation that changes our dispositions for actions and passions. None of these tricks obviate the need for Grace, but they are useful stopgap measures.

8. The Social Character of the Passions

Just as the passions exhibit and produce dependence on the body, so too do they exhibit and produce social relations and interdependence on others. For the train of the passions does not stop at the limits of an individual body, but is communicated between individuals. A passion in one individual will produce facial expressions and other sensible bodily effects – bearing, changes of color, words, cries, and the like. Perceiving these outer symptoms of the passions powerfully affects the imagination of other humans (and animals), and thence rouses their passions. The communication of passions across populations is a crucial bit of glue holding civil society together. But it can also threaten social order.

Malebranche adopts the same attitude towards communications of the passions that he showed towards the passions individually: they are basically functional. For one, he takes it that the passions so reproduced are usually sociable: “passions that move us mainly in order to link us to all sensible things for the preservation of society and of our sensible being” (ST V.7, 377). In particular, expressions of distress produce passions in others that disturb and interest them in the person’s preservation (ST V.3, 348–9). Even wonder can serve a social purpose: Malebranche interprets the behavior of small dogs in the presence of a larger dog as expressions of wonder that work toward their self-preservation. Malebranche also assumes that the passions produce like passions in others – that their communication is a communication of like to like. (This is a point made frequently in ancient rhetoric). As such, the communication of passions serves to join “men together in relation to good and evil and [make] them exactly like one another not only in their mental disposition but also in the condition of their body” (ST V.7, 377). But although it usually greases the wheels of human interaction, the social communication of passions can also exacerbate their detrimental aspects, e.g., by allowing the passion-induced errors of one person to be replicated across an entire population.

However, the communication and liability to passions is not completely uniform. Malebranche suggests that the disposition to feel various passions will vary across differences in “sexes and ages,” as well as characters, “occupations and stations in life.” The reasons for this variation are both physiological and social-psychological. Malebranche holds that people of different ages, sexes, and temperaments (e.g., melancholics) will show differences in the “construction of the brain’s fibers as well as the agitation and amount of spirits and blood.” Differences in such construction will clearly alter which passions one will feel, and what the effects of a passion will be. But so too do the associations we form affect the dispositions to feel passions towards certain things. These associations are psychological, but are shaped by social position. Thus, “great men” depend on more things than other people do, and their slavery is of greater extent (see James 2005, and for a contrast, Schmitter 2012). In contrast, women are likely to be involved only with family and neighborhood, and so won’t be as liable to passions directed at an entire nation. But the passions they do feel may be stronger, just because of their narrow scope.

9. Passions, Causation and Consciousness

Malebranche emphasizes that the communication of passions takes place through purely mechanical means. Each step is mechanical, starting with how a passion produces bodily expressions. Fear may make our faces blanch, our hearts race, and our knees knock together, but these are simply the effects of the movements of the blood and animal spirits that are part of the passion. So too may the perception of these expressions strike the imagination and initiate a series of bodily changes in the observer, culminating in some passion. But again these effects are just the result of the design of the machine. Malebranche takes it that this explains why we may be completely unaware of many or most of these effects, even as they occur within us.

In general, Malebranche denies that the experience of the passions (or indeed of any perceptions) is transparent to itself: “not all our passions are accompanied by some awareness on the mind’s part … we often feel moved by some passion without knowing it and sometimes even without feeling its cause” (ST V.12, 407). Malebranche here seems most struck by the possibility that we do not know the cause of our passions – a point familiar from Descartes. But he also acknowledges that we may feel a passion without knowing what it is; even an occurrent passion may be ‘an I-know-not-what moves me.’ Passions seem most likely to be opaque when we feel them unreflectively, through mere association. Malebranche takes such association to operate as does the mechanical causation found in bodily events, especially where there are “secret alliances with the present disposition of our body” (ST V.12, 407). In this way, he links a lack of full accessibility to consciousness with mechanical causation in an associationist psychology.

10. Influences on Later Authors

Although now somewhat overshadowed by other seventeenth-century continental philosophers, Malebranche’s influence on early modern thought was enormous. This is particularly the case in British philosophy, which saw an important group of English Malebrancheans arise in the late seventeenth century, most notably John Norris (see Norris, 1688), while the British Empiricists used him as their favorite exemplar of a “rationalist.” Nowhere is the extent of Malebranche’s influence more obvious than in his treatment of the passions: not only did his general proto-associationist and imagination-based psychology and its extension to the social communication of affects shape the thought of several generations of eighteenth century British philosophers, but his particular accounts of the passion of love, and even of why we take pleasure in tragic drama were adopted almost wholesale by several authors (Norris and Astell, 1695, and cf. Masham, 1696), with Norris giving a throughly hedonist interpretation to Malebranche’s account of pleasure. Similar associationist views can also be found in such contemporaries as Spinoza and Pascal. But Malebranche seems the main conduit through which these thoughts were received by British philosophers, making him a force to be reckoned with in understanding the origins of 18th century British empiricist psychology and moral philosophy. Hutcheson explicitly identifies Malebranche as the source for the distinction between violent passions and calm affections, and although neither Hume, nor Smith are so overt, their notions of sympathy and affective dynamics are clearly indebted to Malebranche.

Copyright © 2021 by
Amy M. Schmitter <>

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