Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

Spinoza on the Emotions

1. Introduction

Parts III-V of Spinoza’s Ethics (ms. 1675), more than half of the work, treat the definitions and classification of the “affects,” the nature of bondage and the possibility of freedom. Spinoza also treats particular emotions elsewhere, e.g., in the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect and the Short Treatise on God, Man and his Well-Being. But I shall concentrate on the Ethics, since it shows the centrality of the emotions to Spinoza’s conception of the human being and human life and develops his signature distinction between ‘passions’ and ‘afects.’ At the same time, this text is an excellent example of how putting old wine in new bottles can produce completely original potions.

Following the “geometrical method,” Spinoza defines the emotions, both individually and collectively, and draws out the entailments of those definitions and other principles in various propositions, scholia and corollaries. This is part of the systematizing and reductive enterprise of the entire Ethics, for which the ultimate goal is to explain freedom and “blessedness” [beatitudo] as the knowledge of God. Crucial to this project is the metaphysical status of the affects, but not what Spinoza calls the “external affections.” So compared to his predecessors, Spinoza shows relatively little interest in bodily causes, symptoms and consequences of the emotions, such as the movements of the heart and spirits or facial expressions. Instead, bodily causes and effects only form part of his project insofar as they are explanatory of the operations of the mind – although even then, they do not constitute causes of mental states. For Spinoza asserts that states, or “modes,” of mind are at the same time states of the body, just understood through a different attribute (IIP7s) – the view commonly known as his “parallelism.” This term has come under dispute by, e.g., Chantal Jaquet on the grounds that it mischaracterizes the psychosomatic relation of “equality,” requiring a kind of double account at every step. Instead, Jaquet argues that Spinoza gives a mixed account that treats some affects as purely psychical and others as psychophysical (Jaquet, 2018, 19, 136). Nonetheless, differences in the attribute under which a particular affective mode falls do not seem to give rise to systematic principles of taxonomy.

2. Spinoza’s Influences

Despite the claim prefacing Book III that “no one, to my knowledge has determined the nature and powers of the Affects, nor what … the Mind can do to moderate them,” Spinoza’s work shows clear influences from Descartes and Hobbes, as well as from such ancient theories as Stoicism. The debt to Descartes is especially marked, with the list of affects defined at the end of Book III drawn mostly from the Latin translation of the Passions of the Soul that appeared in Amsterdam in 1650 (see Wolfson 1934, 2: 209–210, cited in Spinoza 1985, 531). But Spinoza’s account differs in several important respects: he lists contempt along with wonder [admiratio], and counts neither as proper passions. Nor is Spinoza slow to criticize Descartes. He rejects Descartes’s characterization of love (insofar as it involves imagining oneself joined to the loved object); he dismisses the role given the pineal gland as both anatomically incorrect and non-explanatory; and most importantly, he denies that we can gain control over our passions, holding that it is metaphysically impossible for the human mind to be autonomous in the way he claims Descartes believed. On this last point, Spinoza is even more at odds with the Stoics, although at the same time he is quite sympathetic to their desire for escape from the passions. Indeed, he shares with the Stoics an ideal of freedom, in contrast with being hostage to fortune, in a world that unfolds according to its own law. But just as he denies the possibility of complete autonomy, so too does he reject the notion that a “good” suicide might express such autonomy, holding instead that any sort of self-destructive behavior is the result of defeat by external causes (IVP18s, see also IVP20). And Spinoza’s vilification of the passions does not extend to emotions, or “affects,” in general: he approves – in almost Epicurean fashion – of moderate joy, the kind of joy associated with activity.

Spinoza’s debt to Hobbes is less ambivalent than his borrowing from other predecessors. Like Hobbes, Spinoza takes what is essential to humans to be a kind of “endeavour” or conatus, which strives fundamentally for self-preservation; he deems passions an expression of this drive. Like Hobbes, Spinoza holds that the passions endemic to human life breed conflict. And like Hobbes, he argues that the disadvantages of the state of nature can be resolved through the institution of a sovereign imposing a common and public measure for right and wrong – although his conception of the sovereign (and its relation to subjects) is radically different from Hobbes’s and he holds out the possibility of free and rational persons agreeing without the need for a power to overawe them all. Spinoza may also have a somewhat more censorious view of the passion Hobbes called “glory,” at least when “love of esteem” [gloria] becomes “ambition” [ambitio] Ambition is an “excessive desire for esteem,” and Spinoza cites Cicero (though with less irony than Montaigne) on the insidious desire for ambition (III Def. of the Affects XLIV), which he maintains strengthens all the affects and is itself almost impossible to overcome. At the same time, Spinoza recognizes distinctive affects (or affect-like states) directed towards God, which are central to his picture of freedom from bondage and happiness.

3. The Terminology of Affects and Passions

For all the mining of earlier sources, Spinoza’s approach to the emotions is distinctive, beginning with his vocabulary. ‘Passion’ is used narrowly, while the more inclusive term is ‘affect’ [affectus]. The affects, in turn, are a species of “affection” [affectio], modification or quality, a notion embedded deep in Spinoza’s metaphysics. The affects consist in “the affections of the body whereby the body’s power of acting is increased or diminished … together with the ideas of these affections” (IIID3). But the connection between the modifications of the body and ideas is not quite as casual as this definition may sound. Spinoza’s parallelism holds that the mind is constituted by its idea of the body; we become aware of the body, however, largely through its changes. So it is really the affects – whether active or passive – that constitute the mind. The relation of equality, even identity, holding between mind and body further entails that the affects involve both the body and the mind passing to a greater or lesser perfection (without, of course, assuming any causal link between the two). And although, Spinoza takes the mind’s striving for its own perfection to be tantamount (for the most part) to striving for a more perfect body, the striving itself is best explained through the economy of the affects.

In contrast, Spinoza restricts the term ‘passion’ to affects that are passive: “an affect that is called a Passion [pathema] of the Mind is a confused idea by which the Mind affirms of its Body, or some part of it, a greater or lesser power of existing [existendi vis] than before, which, when it is given determines the Mind to think of this rather than that” (III Gen. Def. of the Affects). What makes an affect a passion is that it is confused, and therefore inadequate. That is, the mind is not the adequate cause of the affect; rather, it responds to some external thing, which can thus be considered the active cause. We turn passions into actions insofar as we conceive some idea clearly and distinctly, or adequately. It is in our interest to do so, since bondage to the passions is not a happy state of affairs. Nevertheless, the experience of some passions is part of the human condition, insofar as humans are not God, but merely finite parts of the whole substance of the universe.

Spinoza recognizes various other states that are emotion-like, but which he is reluctant to call passions, or even affects. For instance, he discusses wonder and contempt among the passions, largely because of their significance for theorists such as Descartes. But Spinoza takes them to mark more the absence than the presence of a passion. Moderation and related states indicate strength of mind, not the affects thereby controlled. Fortitude, which may seem rather like Descartes’s “generosity,” is also a kind of mental disposition or strength, as is mercy, a power of the mind. Shamelessness, on the other hand, is an absence of affect (an affect that we would normally expect). In a different vein, God’s love for himself cannot count as an affect, since God is immutable and this love is essential to God. Similarly, humans’ intellectual love of God and the blessedness [beatitudo], by which they approach to God, do not seem a proper affects. (Jaquet proposes a sharp distinction between the [amor erga Deum] [love towards God] and the [amor intellectis Deum] [the intellectual love of God], on the grounds that the former, but not the latter, is a proper affect; see Jaquet 2018, 111–12). Other kinds of affects, e.g., cheerfulness, merriment, melancholy, and grief, are treated as identical to pleasure and pain; they remain undefined because they are purely bodily states, that is, kinds of pleasure and pain unmodified by any other associated idea.

4. The Explanation of the Conatus

All of the affects proper derive from what is essential to the mind, its conatus, or drive toward self-preservation. Because of this basis, desire is central to the affects, indeed “the very essence or nature of each” (IIIP56d; see also IIIP9s). The affects can then be reduced to three primary affects, which are “nothing but these three [desire; joy or pleasure; and sadness or pain], each one generally being called by a different name on account of its varying relations and extrinsic denominations” (III Def of the Affects XLVIII). Pleasure, joy and delight [laetitia] involve passing to state of greater perfection, that is, to greater power. Pain, displeasure, and sorrow [tristitia], in contrast, involve passing to state of lesser perfection and power. Joy and sadness, however, are simply species of desire: “Desire, or Appetite itself insofar as it is increased or diminished, aided or restrained, by external causes” (IIIP57d.) These affects are passions when the causes of the bodily changes are (at least in part) external; they are thus ideas of such things as increase or diminish the body’s power of acting.

Like Hobbes, Spinoza admits nothing “except what follows from the necessity of the … efficient cause” (IV Preface) and thus refuses to treat the conatus teleologically, or even functionally. The affects and passions express this conatus, without being designed for any end; they are merely appetites lacking final causes. For this reason, Spinoza interprets the “perfection” for which we strive as a matter of the “power of action.” It is the force [vis] or individual conatus expressing itself. One of Spinoza’s most general principles is that we all strive to preserve our own being, or what comes to much the same thing, to increase our power of acting. This explains the attractive and aversive aspects of joy and sadness, which are simply the affects involved in a change in the power of acting. It also explains why the distinction between active affects and passions is important to Spinoza. The mind can act to pass to greater perfection, that is, to preserve its own being and increase its power of action; indeed insofar as it genuinely acts it is doing both, and so acting as such generates affects (but not passions) of joy and desire. By the same token, the mind feels no affects of sadness insofar as it acts: painful passions are all passions, and as such, involve passing to a state of lesser perfection. Only active affects and those passions that signal an increase in our power of acting are enjoyable. What appears as goal-driven pursuit of pleasure can thus be understood simply as the built-in drive of our conatus. But acting according to the dictates of our own nature pushes us to overcome the passions in general, or when possible, to turn them into active affects.

5. The Classification of the Affects

For all the rigors of the geometrical method, Spinoza does not seem to place great stock in the details of his taxonomic scheme. He reduces the affects to the three primary ones of desire, joy and sadness. But he also maintains that there are as many kinds of passions as there are different objects, so that the passions become innumerable. At the same time, he denies – against a long tradition – that the passions of joy or sadness should be differentiated according to the temporality of their objects; considering an object by itself, or as necessary, possible, or contingent does, however, make a real difference to the strength of the felt passion. In general, Spinoza differentiates passions on widely varying grounds. For instance, whether a passion counts as “scorn” depends on the fairness of judgment (although as a disposition to incorrectly assess someone as worthless, this passion is a species of hate). And despite refusing to treat wonder and disdain as full-blown affects, Spinoza takes them to act as intensifiers that can be combined with other affects to “deduce more Affects than those which are usually indicated by the accepted words” (IIIP52s), e.g., “devotion” and “mockery.” Through such varying and sometimes ad hoc means, Spinoza “deduces” more than forty affects, although the lack of a tidy taxonomy makes it difficult to determine the exact headcount (especially since he asserts that several passions are more or less identical, while denying that other states are genuine affects). Spinoza himself admits that “from what has already been said I believe it is clear to anyone that the various affects can be compounded with one another in so many ways, and that so many variations can arise from this composition that they cannot be defined by any number” (IIIP59s).

Spinoza’s nonchalance may be partially explained by his general aims: “to determine the powers of the affects and the power of the mind over the affects.” For that, “it is enough to have a general definition of each affect” (IIIP56s), or indeed simply “to enumerate only the main affects” (IIIP59s). What most interests him in Parts III and IV is an account of the “movements” of the affects – what produces them, strengthens them, leads from one to another, and can weaken or “overcome” them. Indeed, because they interact and spread from one to another, the affects will be difficult to enumerate.

6. The Association of Affects

These features of Spinoza’s explanation of the affects produce an associationist psychology, one that finds various causal and explanatory relations to account for the spread of the affects. A central aim of the Ethics is to show that the mind and its affects are as much a part of the order of nature as is anything else. And although that means that the affects are subject to “geometrical” demonstration of the most rigorously rational kind, it does not mean that the affects themselves answer to rational norms, that is, that they appear in ways that would withstand rational scrutiny. Instead, the affects can spread through associations between their objects, including the most accidental of associations in memory or imagination, as well as through causal relations. For example, I may feel love towards something that benefits something else that I already love; I may also feel love towards something that was simply present on an occasion when I felt pleasure. My passions can likewise give rise to prejudices, as when I feel contempt for a person conceived “under the universal name of [some] class or nation” (IIIP46), and so feel contempt for all members of that class or nation. An affect can produce new affects when the constitution of the body changes, e.g., appetite can turn to disgust as we become sated. Affects can spread through our imagination of the affects others feel. They can spread as we reflect on ourselves, so when the mind considers itself and its power of acting, it becomes more perfect, and thus experiences joy. And in particular, they can spread as we reflect the passions that others feel back on ourselves. Thus the appetite for approbation from others, which Spinoza calls “love of esteem” (III Def. of the Affects XXX; see also IIIP30) can turn into love for another if we imagine that person feels love for us, as well as producing the pleasurable affect of self-esteem, and further affects of thankfulness or gratitude.

7. The Social Character of the Affects

The associationism of the affects, thus, has a deeply social component. Part of this social component is what Spinoza calls the “imitation of the affects.” However, Spinoza differs markedly from Malebranche by denying that the associationist spread of the affects always tends to produce like from like. Not only does Spinoza distinguish different passions depending on their direction (love for another is not just the same as thankfulness for their love for me), he also admits that they can move in contrary directions. If I feel love for another, whom I imagine feels hate for me, my love can turn into hate. As part of the order of nature, the associations producing the passions and affects must be explicable, but it does not follow that they are always the same.

Spinoza likewise disputes Malebranche’s functionalist assumption that the communication of the passions tends to promote civil society. For one, the affect of self-esteem allows us to conceive our power more distinctly, adequately and actively insofar as we imagine other people more disdainfully; thus, we are naturally prone to hatred and envy. We can also come into conflict if we both love the same thing and imagine that it cannot be possessed generally. True, Spinoza allows that certain passions, e.g., pity, fear, lust, despondency, and shame, can generate socially useful effects, but in general, “insofar as men are subject to passions, they cannot be said to agree in nature” (IVP32) and thus can be evil for each other (IV P30d). Spinoza here adopts a Hobbesian approach to explain both how we disagree “in nature” and how reason suggests articles of peace to alleviate such natural disagreement.

8. Passions and Reason

Very much like Hobbes, Spinoza poses a prima facie opposition between reason, which provides a common and publicly accessible understanding of the good, and divisive passions. Following reason, men “agree in nature;” reason also produces the affects and the strength of mind that promote sociability, so the reasonable man is always “just, honest and honorable,” and wants for others what they want for themselves (IVP18s). Moreover, whatever useful effects might arise from the passions can arise just as well from reason, without the possibility of conflict and disagreement. However, following reason is nothing more than following the laws of our own nature, acting on the conatus for self-preservation, and seeking our own advantage. As did Hobbes, Spinoza calls this seeking of our own advantage in general, and of self-preservation in particular, the “fundamental law of nature.” And rational reflection on the fundamental law shows the desirability of cooperative endeavor:

… to man, then, there is nothing more useful than man. Man, I say, can wish for nothing more helpful to the preservation of his being than that all should so agree in all things that the Minds and Bodies of all would compose, as it were, one Mind and one Body; that all should strive together, as far as they can, to preserve their being; and that all, together, should seek for themselves the common advantage of all. (IVP18s)

On this basis, Spinoza identifies reason and virtue. Just because it seeks our advantage (our enlightened self-interest), reason demands that we seek the advantage of others. It also recommends that we give up the right of nature to judge and act on all things for ourselves in favor of a civil authority instituting a common standard that will coordinate our conflicting passions. Moreover, reason suggests that we adopt an affective policy that meets many intuitive considerations of virtue, for instance, that we should return love for any passion others might feel for us. Again, all this is driven by our seeking our own advantage. But since Spinoza holds that one affect can only be taken away by another affect, he recommends overcoming the “bondage” of the passions by combating the passions with active affects that increase our power. Exercising our reason, that is, understanding the nature and connection of things is itself a way of increasing our power, becoming more active, and passing to a state of greater perfection. The exercise of reason thus generates joyful affects that can help us to overcome bondage, even before we act on its recommendations. Reasoning and acting on reason, then, are both ways to preserve the mind and make it less vulnerable to external degeneration. True, we will always be susceptible to external forces that are stronger than we, but we can extend the reach and power of our minds simply by reflecting on our own advantage, and even more so, by acting in accord with our rational reflections.

9. Adequate Knowledge, Freedom and Beatitude

The activity of our minds can be measured by the degree to which we are causes of our own ideas, that is, by the adequacy of our ideas to the whole sequence of causes and order of nature. As minds, then, knowledge is our main good, particularly knowledge of God – that is, knowledge of the whole, which is like that possessed by God. Our striving, then, should be directed at what Spinoza identifies as knowledge of either the second or the third kind. The former is exemplified in the Ethics, where the whole is demonstrated in geometrical fashion. The latter is intuitive knowledge of the whole, the better kind of knowledge, which we should want for ourselves and others. Spinoza takes it that this third kind of knowledge is the closest we approach to God, and in it, we experience a love that is part of the infinite love God has for itself. We thereby achieve what Spinoza calls the state of “beatitude.” “Beatitude” is not exactly an affect, but it is close: it is “that satisfaction of mind that stems from the intuitive knowledge of God” (IV Appendix IV). And the process of achieving it should certainly involve the experience of many joyous affects.

We have, then, for Spinoza a bit of a happy paradox: since we are always subject to external causes, we can never be free from the passions. But we can take a meta-stance as it were, by understanding even our unhappy passions as things that happen according to the order of nature. Thus, we will “bear calmly those things which happen to us contrary to what the principle of our advantage demands” (IV Appendix XXXII) Satisfaction comes from understanding, and insofar as we have adequate ideas, we are active, thus increasing our power of acting and preserving ourselves. So, insofar as we understand that which is “contrary to what the principle of our advantage demands,” we advance our advantage.

10. The Passions and Identity

This point raises a question about whose advantage exactly is being advanced when we understand – who, in fact, we are. Spinoza’s metaphysics does not ground human identity in the basic metaphysical constitution of things: a human being is not an independent substance and cannot be individuated by its real distinction from all else. The human mind is constituted by its affects, which insofar as they are active, and thus proper to the mind itself, work to preserve its being, and increase its power of action. Still, it is always dependent on and susceptible to what is outside it. Something similar can be said for bodies too; they are not substantially differentiated from the rest of the extended universe with which they interact and on which they depend. But Spinoza’s parallelism (or ‘equalism’) means that an alternative, less substantial account of how we individuate the human body can capture mental identity in the same net. Spinoza provides such an account in his understanding of how the bodily activity of the affects preserves the relations and boundaries of our bodies, particularly the proportion of motion and rest crucial to bodily identity and life. So, the active affects maintain identity – the identity on which they depend – by negotiating what systems theory calls a “systems-environment boundary.” It is perfectly consistent with the dynamically achieved identity of body, mind, and human being, however, that we might take on yet other identities, identities that may be equally important to us and equally ‘ours.’ For instance, Spinoza sometimes speaks of the society common to all humans as a body seeking to preserve its own boundaries and proportions of motion and rest, something that would give a physical grounding to collective identity. Then too, insofar as we approach beatitude and the intuitive knowledge of the whole, we may take on an identity approaching to the identity of the whole, becoming more and more like God. These remain mere speculations, though, unresolved in Spinoza’s work. Indeed, some of the puzzling passages at the end of Part V appear torn between whether we should seek to “merge” our individual mind with God or to preserve its distinctive identity within the field of different, external, and sometimes competing forces.

11. Influences on Later Authors

Although both Leibniz and Hume take issue with different features of his metaphysics, Spinoza’s approach to the passions seems to have exerted relatively little direct influence on his contemporaries. There are similarities, of course: Hume complicates the understanding of our psychological associations and how they can be transmitted socially in ways not unlike Spinoza. Hume also talks about the mechanisms by which we generate prejudices, although he will find their source more in the causal associations of the imagination than in the passions. But there is little evidence that these are anything more than similarities, especially since Hume’s knowledge of Spinoza was transmitted largely through Bayle. It may be that Spinoza’s approach to the emotions is so closely intertwined with the whole of his system that it is difficult to appropriate piecemeal, and so remains sui generis. On the other hand, Spinoza was to become an important figure for nineteenth-century philosophers, most notably for Friedrich Nietzsche. In 1881, Nietzsche wrote his friend Overbeck that he was “astonished” and “utterly enchanted” to find in Spinoza a precursor insofar as they both tend “to make knowledge [Erkenntnis] the most powerful affect” (Nietzsche 1976, 92, translation slightly altered). Nietzsche later singles out Spinoza’s treatment of pity for praise in the Genealogy of Morals (1887). More generally, his understanding of the will to power shares a great deal with Spinoza’s understanding of our affective drive, although whether this is a matter of direct influence or what Nietzsche might call a common “instinct” is arguable.

Copyright © 2021 by
Amy M. Schmitter <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free