Supplement to 17th and 18th Century Theories of Emotions

Francis Hutcheson on the Emotions

1. Introduction

Perhaps the clearest exemplar of a sentimentalist moral philosopher is Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746). He offers a moral sense theory that conceives of our affections much as did Shaftesbury, while maintaining that our moral judgments bottom out in specific kinds of emotions. Although his account of the emotions is closely tied to the requirements of his moral philosophy, Hutcheson also develops an affective psychology and phenomenology. The most important works for understanding his views on the emotions are his Inquiry into the Original of our Ideas of Beauty and Virtue (1725) and his Essay on the Nature and Conduct of the Passions with Illustrations on the Moral Sense (1728), which discusses the views of Cicero and Malebranche, among others. Further material can be found in Reflections upon Laughter, and Remarks on the Fable of the Bees (1725–6), in which he addresses the egoist psychology of Hobbes and Mandeville, and in the multi-volumed Philosophiae moralis institutio compendiaria, ethices et jurisprudentiae naturalis elementa continens, lib. iii. (1742) and System of Moral Philosophy (1755).

2. Terminology and Classification of the Senses

These works teem with terminology and classificatory schemes for describing both our emotions and our sense-faculties proliferate in these works. Hutcheson understands a ‘sense’ receptively, as that which receives involuntary mental determinations, typically attended with perceptions of pleasure or pain. More specifically, an “affection or passion” refers to “those Modifications or Actions of the mind consequent on the Apprehension of certain Objects or Events in which the Mind generally conceives Good or Evil” (Essay 15). Emotions are thus identified as special kinds of sensations. There are, however, many different kinds of sensations, and many different kinds of senses. The Philosophiae moralis institutio compendiaria (lib. I, chap. I, sec. 4–14) and the System of Moral Philosophy (Book I, chap. II) list more than a dozen senses, while the Essay (sec. I) restricts itself to a mere five, starting with the familiar ‘external’ sense. To this external sense, Hutcheson adds an internal sense (comprising the aesthetic sense and the pleasures of the imagination), a public sense (or sensus communis a kind of fellow-feeling), a moral sense, and a sense of honor (Essay 17–8), of which at least the last three have an affective component. The senses are not completely independent of each other: for instance, the moral sense requires an element of reflection on the previous senses, and the fifth sense, the sense of honor involves additional reflection on how others perceive and evaluate us morally. Hutcheson takes simple perceptions of pleasure and pain to be located in the external sense, but many other affections of the senses seem intrinsically pleasurable or painful.

All of these senses receive sensations. But they also generate desires or aversions, especially through reflection, which in turn provide spurs to action. Together they give Hutcheson his general account of ‘affections or passions,’ which incorporate a mixture of immediate sensations and modifications produced by reflection:

[W]e denote by the Affection or Passion some other “perceptions of Pleasure or Pain, not directly raised by the Presence or Operation of the Event or Object, but by our Reflection upon or Apprehension of their present or certainly future Existence; so that we are sure that the Object or Event will raise the direct Sensations in us.” (Essay 30)

Hutcheson further distinguishes between an affection, involving a calm desire or aversion, and a passion, which includes

a confused Sensation either of Pleasure or Pain, occasioned or attended by some violent bodily Motions, which keeps the Mind much employed upon the present Affair, to the exclusion of everything else, and prolongs or strengthens the Affection sometimes to such a degree, as to prevent all deliberate Reasoning about our Conduct. (Essay 31)

Hutcheson’s account here shows influences from Malebranche, although his scheme is considerably simpler. In particular, passions involve a confused sensation, which allow them to grip our minds tenaciously. Hutcheson also supposes that the passions involve correlative bodily events, which helps explain both their confusion and their tenacity, although he leaves it to “Physicians or Anatomists [to] explain the several Motions in the Fluids or Solids of the Body, which accompany any Passion” (Essay 47). Confusion itself is linked with a kind of violence or agitation, so that confused sensations alone may be enough to make our desires become ‘passionate.’ The violence of the passions also seems partly a matter of their particularity: passions are directed at particular objects, raising desires about them, in contrast with the generality of, e.g., benevolence. Calm affections such as benevolence likewise involve desires, but typically they are calm (Hutcheson cites Marcus Aurelius as an exception who violently desired benevolence). The frenzied desires evoked by the passions also seem to be directed at what is immediate, while calm affections can be far-sighted.

Hutcheson often rates their violence as a measure of the hold passions may have on us. At the same time, he holds that we can override the violent force of the passions by frequent reflection on the calm desires, particularly by habituation of that reflection. Such reflection is a crucial weapon in gaining command over the passions, as prudence often dictates we should. Command of our passions becomes morally praiseworthy when it is governed by the calm affection of general benevolence. In general, our actions are motivated by our prevailing desires, which can be generated by either the affections or the passions of various senses. It is the distinction between calm affection and violent, confused passion that Hutcheson uses to explain how we seem to judge motivations, actions and “tempers” (characters) on their rationality. Passions can oppose what we approve on reflection, and it is what we approve on reflection that is considered ‘rational.’ Moreover, reflective evaluations are what ground moral judgments. And Hutcheson argues, those are generated by affections, not reason.

3. Affections and Moral Philosophy

The moral philosophy of Hutcheson’s Inquiry borrows many important elements from Shaftesbury. It rests on the notion of a moral sense, which is an inborn faculty and comparable to the aesthetic sense. And although all our affections involve an element of reflection, the exercise of the moral sense calls for additional reflection by someone adopting the position of a spectator. What the spectator takes as objects of moral evaluation are the affections of rational agents, insofar as they produce intentional actions. Moral evaluation is particularly targeted at those cases where agents exhibit other-directed affections, or where we feel that they should. For, like Shaftesbury, Hutcheson holds the crucial feature of our moral evaluation to be that we approve affections that are irreducibly benevolent and other-directed, while condemning inappropriately selfish ones. A spectator then looks to the actions of a rational agent to see how they flow from some affection toward other sensitive beings. Identifying the affection as a form of benevolence, involving a desire for the happiness of another, the spectator feels approbation and can reflectively judge the agent to be virtuous. In contrast, we condemn agents as vicious when their self-love overrides the benevolence intrinsic to human psychology.

Like many other early modern theorists of the emotions (including Hobbes and Mandeville), Hutcheson considers us to be incapable of true malice. In general, he assumes that nature, or at least our psychological nature, is generally benevolent, much as did Shaftesbury, although Hutcheson thinks that Shaftesbury’s natural teleology gets the order of explanation wrong. Because of the intrinsically well-ordered benevolence of our nature, our feelings of approval and condemnation, and their correlative moral affections are inherently pleasurable and painful. But Hutcheson insists that the pleasure and pain are effects of the approbation or condemnation, not their causes. Pleasure and pain are, in turn, antecedent to any sense of advantage or interest, which derive from those feelings. Our moral sense is thus ‘disinterested’ in a way that is comparable to the aesthetic sense. And the moral sense seems internally consistent: just as we approve of benevolent affections in those we judge, so too can our judgments withstand our own scrutiny.

4. Psychological Arguments for Benevolence

Hutcheson argues frequently and forcefully that we are capable of irreducibly benevolent affections and passions, against the view he associates with Hobbes and Mandeville that all passions are, in the final analysis, forms of self-interest. Self-interest, he maintains, cannot explain why we approve what we do, and in particular, why we identify with those of benevolent character. Hutcheson also argues that it is impossible to reduce feelings of benevolence to what is advantageous, because we cannot feel benevolence at will, no matter how clearly we calculate the advantage in doing so (Inquiry, 126–7). Hutcheson’s argument supposes that our affections and passions are not under our direct control; they are in large measure passive feelings. But although we cannot feel affections or passions at will, we are naturally fitted to feeling particular affections, including benevolent ones, under particular circumstances. Such benevolence may generate some pain for the well-meaning individual, so not even desire for pleasure can explain away our benevolence. Moreover, even when benevolence is accompanied by pleasure, the aim of the benevolence is not a desire for pleasure.

Hutcheson seems to take it as evidence of our benevolence that besides general benevolence, we also feel particular affections that are other-directed: natural affection, gratitude, honor, shame, or compassion. All of these are supposed to show extensive benevolence at work. Indeed, he often groups all other-directed passions together, assuming that they must be directed at the good of others, so they seem so many forms of benevolence. Nonetheless, we do make distinctions of moral worth relative to the extent of the other-directed affection: the more general the benevolence, the higher its moral worth. On the other hand, the existence of an other-based passion of limited scope (e.g., parental anxiety for children) can play an extenuating role in the evaluation of an action. Then too, because we can play the role of spectator for ourselves, we may extend our benevolent impulses to ourselves, that is, we can form self-related desires stemming from benevolence. This does not eliminate the distinction between self-love and benevolence, but it means that benevolence does not require self-abnegation at all times. It also suggests that there may be genuine differences of kind among self-directed affections, differences that will generate very different reflective affections and lead us to attribute to some a moral worth lacked by mere selfishness.

5. The Fundamental Role of Affections

Crucial to Hutcheson’s understanding of our moral sense is his case against rationalism in moral philosophy. The arguments by which he makes his case are based in considerations of the relation between means and ends. To this end he makes several distinctions among our determinations and reason, arguing that reason alone cannot explain any of them. It can explain neither election, an agent’s determination to an action, nor approbation, the spectator’s evaluation of an action. When we seek the ultimate ends for either, we find that reason is merely instrumental, and cannot give exciting reasons, i.e., the reasons that motivate an action. Those bottom out in instincts and affections. Justifying reasons, on the other hand, depend on our approval of an end, which requires recourse to a sense. And so they bottom out in the moral sense, which depends on affections and their reflection.

Something similar can be said about our natural moral “obligations.” They rest on our basic psychological impulse of benevolence, making our sense of obligation a “determination of our nature” (Inquiry, 244). Hutcheson seems to equivocate a bit here: either ‘obligation’ simply means motivation, or ‘nature’ is normatively freighted. But that may simply be because he has no recourse for explaining normative judgments other than through our affections and sense-faculty. And Hutcheson argues that we cannot turn our approbation or condemnation on the sense-faculty itself – that is, we cannot judge its moral worth – except insofar as we use the moral sense. Fortunately, we all share impulses of benevolence, and feel reflective affections that esteem those impulses as overriding all others.

6. Psychology and Phenomenology of the Passions and Control Over Happiness

As we have seen, the affections differ from simple sensations in that they are reflective. They are also motivating, because they are related to desire and aversion, and so they explain intentional actions – actions directed at obtaining (or avoiding) some object. The Essay also allows that our emotions may involve “propensities,” which are directions of action, detached from any notion of “good.” Propensities may, therefore, motivate action, but in a way that lacks a goal, or real intention, as Hutcheson explains in the case of anger (Essay 52). Such propensities distinguish passions from the calm affections. The passions may also have distinctive sensations, or feels, but it is their propensities that explain the particular motivational force and almost unintentional character of passion-driven action. They will also explain why passions do not always answer to beliefs about objects, for they contain a drive that is not directed at bringing about an objective state of affairs.

In the absence of something like Shaftesbury’s natural teleology, Hutcheson can offer no guarantee that exercising our benevolent affections, the ones that generate our moral approbation, will likewise produce happiness. Happiness is a matter of pleasure, in particular the pleasures linked to our passions and affections. We are happy when the pleasurable affections and passions, and to a lesser degree, sensations, predominate over the painful ones.

The pursuit of happiness raises the question of how much control we have over our passions and affections, so as to maximize pleasurable ones and minimize painful ones. Hutcheson’s answer is that we do not have much. Still, there are several ways to exert the control we do have. First, insofar as passions and affections are linked to opinions, we may be able to exercise some control over our opinions. The propensities of our passions, however, are not very responsive to opinion. Fortunately, our epistemic state is much less important for our happiness than is our social situation. Among our natural, benevolent affections are affections directed at the happiness of others. That means that our happiness is directly dependent on the happiness of others, particularly those close to us. That too is not fully in our control, a point on which Hutcheson takes Stoic views to task (Essay 82). Nonetheless, we do act for the happiness of others, and hope that our actions will see success. So, whatever we can do to achieve the ends of our benevolent affections will, in fact, increase our own chances for happiness. By the same token, we might be advised to choose our friends wisely, selecting those most likely to allow our benevolent actions to bear fruit. Last, Hutcheson argues that to the degree we can turn our violent passions into calm affections, we will optimize the chances for pleasure over pain. Again for this reason, exercising our benevolent affections seems a sound strategy.

7. Influences on Later Authors

Hutcheson’s influence was particularly marked on those authors who adopted, or simply considered, sentimentalist positions in moral philosophy, such as Hume, and even more, Adam Smith (1723–90), who studied under Hutcheson. Hume was also clearly affected by Hutcheson’s moral and affective psychology, from which he learned much. But Hume argued directly against Hutcheson’s approach to our other-directed passions, distinguishing sharply between extensive benevolence and limited generosity. Hume went so far as to allow that other-directed passions need not be benevolent in character at all, admitting malice as a genuine psychological possibility. Both Hume and Smith also borrowed some of Hutcheson’s (and Shaftesbury’s) terminology, but put it to novel uses, quite different from what Hutcheson envisioned. And Smith used the very notion of sympathy to argue against the basis on which Hutcheson built his moral sense theory, particularly criticizing it for providing no independent measure of its own normative status. Instead, Smith argues that we normally appraise the propriety of sentiments, whether of others or our own, by subjecting them to “the great discipline” established by nature: “a regard to the sentiments of the real or supposed spectator of our conduct” (1982, 145).

Copyright © 2021 by
Amy M. Schmitter <>

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