Notes to Empathy

1. In his Cartesian Meditations, Husserl still seems to address the problem of other minds from within the framework of a Cartesian conception of the mind; at least in the sense that he gives epistemic priority to the first person perspective. Nevertheless, pace Descartes, he stresses in his fifth Meditations that at the most basic level we experience ourselves as a psychophysical unity, as a lived body (Leib) and not merely as a physical body (Körper).

2. In their 2006 article, psychologists Jolliffe and Farrington, try to argue for the validity of what they call the Basic Empathy Scale. Their use of the term “basic empathy” has to be strictly distinguished from the term as used by Stueber 2006. Indeed what Joliffe and Farrington mean is that they try to develop a scale measuring empathy, where empathy is properly distinguished from sympathy. For this distinction see also section 4 of this entry.

3. It could be argued that philosophers maintaining such a division are therefore not necessarily belonging only to what one commonly refers to as the hermeneutic tradition in continental philosophy. Peter Winch, for example, who argues from a Wittgensteinian perspective for a methodological distinction between the natural and social sciences and, should also be counted among those who maintain a hermeneutic conception of the social sciences.

Copyright © 2019 by
Karsten Stueber <>

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