Ancient and Medieval Empiricism

First published Wed Sep 27, 2017

Although empiricism is often thought to be a modern doctrine, it has ancient roots, and its modern forms are built on late medieval developments. This article will begin by outlining three different forms of empiricism. It will examine the Presocratic and Hippocratic origins of the empiricist attitude, and discuss its development in the work of Aristotle, the Hellenistic medical writers, sceptics, and Epicureans. It will then examine the combination of Aristotelian and Augustinian views in the work of thirteenth and fourteenth-century thinkers, the connection between the study of magic and empiricism, the eclipse of the doctrine of divine illumination, and the gradual downplaying of the role of the intellect in the acquisition of knowledge.

Why study these ancient thinkers? To those who hold that “no conception can be properly understood except through its history” (Comte 1934: 2), the answer will seem obvious. But even those who prefer to engage in philosophical reflection, rather than studying its history, may find these thinkers illuminating. Empiricists have always had difficulty giving an account of key aspects of both everyday and scientific knowledge. They have found it hard to explain how we could know about logical and mathematical truths, causal relations, and (more generally) the modal structure of the world (how things could be). Insofar as we are still faced with these questions, we may be able to learn from the answers our predecessors gave.

1. Introduction

There are three questions raised by the title of this entry. The first is whether it is anachronistic. Is empiricism not a modern position? Can we attribute it to ancient and medieval thinkers? The charge of anachronism would, perhaps, be warranted if empiricism referred to a single set of beliefs. As we shall see, however, the term covers a variety of views regarding knowledge (sect. 2). Even among modern thinkers, the empiricism of John Locke (1632–1704) is not identical with that of Francis Bacon (1561–1626), and neither bears much resemblance to the empiricism of Rudolf Carnap (1891–1970), A. J. Ayer (1910–1989), or Hans Reichenbach (1891–1953). Yet all these thinkers have an attitude in common: they share a desire to keep factual claims (in the sense of claims regarding contingent matters) closely related to the deliverances of the senses. That desire has ancient roots. Modern empiricism was not a creatio e nihilo. It represented a revival of attitudes found already in the ancient world and the form in which it was expressed was dependent on late medieval developments.

A second question has to do with the article’s association of ancient and medieval views. The philosophers discussed here are separated by a thousand years. Why bring them together? This question is more easily answered. The intellectual renaissance of the twelfth and thirteenth centuries involved a revival of the work of the ancients. In the field of philosophy this took the form of a rediscovery of the works of Aristotle (384–322 BCE), by way of Latin translations from Arabic sources and Greek texts from the Byzantine world. Indeed much of the philosophical writing of this period was done by way of commentaries on Aristotle. Medieval philosophers were also influenced by writers from a later age, such as Plotinus (205–270 CE), Dionysius the Areopagite (5th–6th century CE), and St Augustine (354–430 CE). But these writers were themselves influenced by Aristotle’s predecessor, Plato (427–347 BCE). So in this respect, too, medieval philosophy has ancient roots.

A third question has to do with the scope of the discussion. As will already be clear, the tradition of philosophy being discussed here is that which began in the Greek city states of the sixth and fifth centuries BCE. But empiricist views are found within other traditions. The closest parallels are to be found among the Lokāyata (Cārvāka), one of the nāstika (non-orthodox) schools of Indian philosophy that existed in the sixth and seventh centuries CE. These are reported to have held that sensory perception is the only reliable means of knowledge and to have rejected the validity of inferences to unobservable entities (Chatterjee & Datta 2004: 54–59). The Buddha (ca. 485–405 BCE) could be said to be an empiricist, insofar as he based his dharma (teaching) on experience rather than authority or reason. But the Buddhist idea of experience is broader than that held by most empiricists (Jayatilleke 1963: 463–64 [para. 793]). The twelve āyatanas (sensory domains) of Buddhist tradition include the mind as well as the bodily senses and meditation is thought capable of producing higher forms of knowledge (the abhijñās) that are independent of sensory perception. Finally, we can find discussions of sense perception within classical Chinese philosophy. Mozi (Mo Tzu, ca. 480–392 BCE), for instance, ranked everyday experience among the three criteria of reliable knowledge (Mozi 35.3), while the more sceptical Xunzi (Hsün Tzu, ca. 312–210 BCE) pointed out how easily the senses are deceived (Xunzi 21.8). But while it would be interesting to explore these traditions, empiricism does not play as central a role in any of them as it does in the history of Western philosophy.

The question of scope also arises when it comes to the subject matter of the article, which is empiricism as a doctrine rather than as a practice. From the very beginning of what the Greeks called “the investigation of nature” (hē peri phuseōs historia), there have been those who studied the natural world by means of careful observation. There were medical writers who observed and recorded symptoms, astronomers who observed the movements of the heavens, and students of music who placed their ears “close [to their instruments] as though trying to hear what their neighbours were saying” (Plato Rep. 531a6–7). These people were surely empiricists in practice. But such figures will be of interest to us only if they also reflected on what they were doing, developing second-order beliefs about knowledge. It is these second-order beliefs that will be the focus of the present study.

2. Varieties of Empiricism

“Names of philosophical positions,” wrote W. V. O. Quine, “are a necessary evil” (1995: 251). This is certainly the case with the term “empiricism”: while it is difficult simply to abandon it, it can be misleading. Among historians of early modern philosophy, for instance, the traditional distinction between empiricists and rationalists has fallen out of favour, on the grounds that there are few thinkers who can be clearly assigned to either category (Norton 1981; Loeb 1981: 25–75). The problem here, however, is not the category of empiricism, but its use as a “pigeon-hole” into which one tries to place individual thinkers. Empiricism need not be a global doctrine: a thinker may be an empiricist in one domain but not in another. It is possible, for instance, to be an empiricist about knowledge of the natural world, but a rationalist with regard to a particular area of mathematics (Markie 2015: sect. 1.2). So it is not surprising that individual thinkers are hard to categorize. But empiricism is also an umbrella term: it covers a variety of views regarding knowledge. Even with regard to the one domain, a thinker may be an empiricist in one sense, but not in another. So if we are to use the category, we need to distinguish the different forms empiricism can take.

2.1 Explanatory Empiricism

The first is what we may call explanatory empiricism, which denies the validity of inferences from observable phenomena to causes that cannot themselves be observed. Perhaps the best known modern example is that of the physicist and philosopher Ernst Mach (1838–1916). At least for most of his life, Mach rejected the theory of atoms as an example of “hypothetico-fictive physics” (Mach 1992: 136) and would respond to believers in atoms with the words, Habn S’eins gsehn? (Have you seen one?) (Meyer 1992: 151). (For a slightly different view of Mach’s atomism, see Banks 2003: 12–14.) A more recent example is the “constructive empiricism” of Bas van Fraassen, which holds that the aim of science is to produce theories that are empirically adequate, a theory being empirically adequate if “what it says about the observable things and events in this world, is true” (van Fraassen 1980: 12). This view also rules out inferences to unobservable entities (van Fraassen 1980: 72). While this may sound like a modern position, it was held by the first people to call themselves “empiricists,” namely a group of ancient medical writers, who rejected inferences based on reasoning rather than the observed association of phenomena (sect. 3.3).

2.2 Genetic Empiricism

A second form of empiricism is summed up by the Latin slogan nihil est in intellectu quod non prius fuerit in sensu (nothing is in the intellect which was not first in the senses). We can think of this as a genetic empiricism (Lowe 1995: 189), which makes claims about the origins of our ideas. It takes two forms. The first of these is what we may call tabula rasa (blank slate) empiricism, which denies the existence of innate ideas or principles of reasoning, holding that both our factual knowledge and the concepts we employ in describing the world are drawn from experience. The locus classicus for an empiricism of this kind is the work of John Locke, who famously suggested that the mind is originally “white paper, void of all characters, without any ideas” (Locke Essay 2.1.2). But it also takes the form of what we may describe as a cognitive empiricism. This denies that we have intellectual powers or capacities giving access to factual knowledge independently of experience.

Cognitive empiricism may seem implicit in the tabula rasa principle that “nothing is in the intellect which was not first in the senses.” But the two positions are not identical, for one can deny that we have innate ideas or principles while also holding that the mind shapes what the senses provide. As G. W. Leibniz (1646–1716) would later remark, “nothing is in the intellect which was not first in the senses, except for: the intellect itself [nisi intellectus ipse]” (Leibniz NE 1.2). There are two contributions the intellect could make. It could predispose us to understand what we perceive in certain ways. (The “affordances” spoken of by James Gibson [1986: 127–43] can be thought of as dispositions of this kind.) Or it may have the capacity to receive a belief-forming influence from an external source, one not mediated by the senses. (For a medieval version of this idea, see sect. 4.2.) A thorough-going cognitive empiricism would deny the existence of either innate dispositions or non-sensory influences in the formation of beliefs. It would hold that the mind forms its beliefs by “selecting, combining, or otherwise manipulating simple ideas of sensation” (Kahn 1981: 407).

2.3 Justificatory Empiricism

A final form of empiricism is what we may call justificatory empiricism. In its strongest form, an empiricism of this kind is indifferent as to the origins of our ideas and can tolerate inferences to unobservable entities. It merely insists that wherever our ideas come from and whatever they claim, they cannot be regarded as justified until they have been successfully tested against experience. Within twentieth-century philosophy, this position is associated with a sharp distinction between the “context of discovery” and the “context of justification” (Reichenbach 1938: 6–7), with justificatory empiricists focusing on the latter. For Karl Popper (1902–1994), for instance, the question of how a theory is discovered is irrelevant to its epistemic status; what matters is whether that theory has explanatory power and has withstood severe testing (Popper 1935 [2002: 7–8]). On the face of it, this does seem a recent position. Perhaps no philosopher before Popper would have regarded the origins of an idea as entirely irrelevant to its standing. But there are hints of it in the work of some ancient and medieval thinkers, who held that factual claims arrived at by deductive reasoning lack credibility if they have not also been tested against experience.

3. Ancient Empiricism

The discussion that follows shall employ these categories in order to analyse the thought of ancient and medieval philosophers. Once again, this may be thought to run the risk of anachronism, insofar as such categories are not themselves ancient. Although one school of ancient thinkers did identify themselves as empiricists, no ancient or medieval philosophers made these particular distinctions. But this is not a fatal objection. We should not distort the thinking of ancient or medieval philosophers by forcing it into modern categories, as into a Procrustean bed. Nor should we write intellectual history in a “Whiggish” fashion, interested only in those features of ancient thought that anticipate our own. But as Allen Wood once remarked (a little too paradoxically), “people can mean things they can’t think, and therefore … must be able to express thoughts they can’t have” (A. Wood 2002: 227). When it comes to ancient and medieval philosophers, our modern categories can help highlight aspects of their thought they themselves may have been unaware of.

3.1 The Emergence of an Empiricist Attitude

If we think of empiricism as an attitude, rather than a clearly formulated doctrine, then it dates from the very beginnings of Western philosophy, in the work of the Presocratics. Some care is needed here, since we know of the Presocratics only through quotations and reports, found in authors who in some cases lived centuries later and who themselves had philosophical axes to grind. One of our major sources, for instance, is Aristotle. But Aristotle was not trying to compile an historical account; he was attempting to construct his own system and he sometimes reshaped his predecessors’ views with this goal in mind (Cherniss 1935: 347). Judging from the quotations and reports we do have, it would be difficult to describe the Presocratics as empiricists in practice. On the contrary, their claims about the natural world are notoriously sweeping and vague: it is far from clear how they could be tested against experience (Barnes 1982: 48). Some of the Presocratics, however, expressed sentiments that anticipate the doctrinal empiricisms of later times.

Of particular note are some sayings attributed to the Ionian philosopher Heraclitus (fl. ca. 500 BCE). One fragment reads, “The things of which there is sight, hearing, experience, [these] I prefer” (DK 22B55; Graham 2010: 149). Although the contrast here may be between knowledge by experience and knowledge by hearsay (Kahn 1979: 106), it does suggest a confidence in knowledge of the former kind. It is, however, balanced by another saying, which notes that “poor witnesses for men are the eyes and ears of those who have barbarian souls” (DK 22B107; Graham 2010: 149). Whereas the senses can provide knowledge, what they offer needs to be correctly understood. Empedocles (ca. 495–435 BCE), too, while emphasizing the limits of human understanding, encourages his hearers to “understand each thing in the way in which it is clear [noei d’hēi dēlon hekaston],” gleaning what knowledge they can from the senses (DK 31B3; Graham 2010: 343).

Empedocles’s saying can be understood as a response to the work of the Eleatic philosophers, such as Parmenides (ca. 515–445 BCE) and Melissus of Samos (fl. ca. 440 BCE). Parmenides relied on a priori arguments to reach conclusions that flew in the face of experience, while his follower Melissus argued for the unreliability of sense perception on the grounds that its deliverances were contradicted by reason (Barnes 1982: 298–302). Such teachings offered a challenge to the early scientific tradition established by Thales of Miletus (fl. ca. 585 BCE), for they suggested that “the phenomena which science attempts to understand … are figments of our deceptive senses” (Barnes 1982: 305). If there was to be a scientific tradition, it required a defence of sense perception over against pure reason.

Empiricist sentiments are also found in the work of some early medical writers. These go beyond a simple defence of sense perception to express a suspicion of theories that go beyond what can be observed. We find, perhaps, a hint of this attitude in the work of Alcmaeon of Croton (fl. ca. 500 BCE), to whom the following fragment is attributed: “Concerning things unseen the gods see clearly, but so far as men may conjecture… ” (DK 24B1; Kirk, Raven, & Schofield 1983: 339). It would be wrong to read a body of empiricist doctrine into so cryptic a remark. But it may indicate the beginning of a contrast, not only between what the gods know and men may know (a commonplace of ancient Greek thought), but between knowledge that can be obtained by observation and knowledge of “the unseen.” The limits of human knowledge, it suggests, are marked by the limits of what can be observed.

This contrast is certainly found in some of the works attributed to Hippocrates (ca. 460–370 BCE). The author of one Hippocratic treatise argues against those who practice medicine on the basis of some general principle or postulate (hupothesis). Medicine, he suggests, does not require a general theory “about human nature [ho ti estin anthrōpos],” of the kind offered by Empedocles and other philosophers (AM 20.1). Such general principles may be required when dealing with with matters that are “obscure and dubious,” such as “the things in the sky or under the earth” (AM 1.3). But medicine differs from such speculative sciences, since its conclusions can be confirmed by experience. Of particular note here is the phrase “the things in the sky or under the earth,” which picks out the main areas of early Ionian science (Barnes 1982: 139; cf. Plato Ap. 18b8–9).

At first sight, this looks like an early expression of explanatory empiricism: a refusal to make inferences to things that cannot be observed. But even leaving aside the fact that “the things in the sky” are not strictly unobservable, the same work also also speaks of discovering facts about what is inside the body “from evident things outside [the body]” (AM 22.3). In particular, it argues, we can draw conclusions about the body’s internal organs by noting the behaviour of different kinds of observable objects: those that are solid, stretched, spongy, porous, and so on. (The reasoning here is by way of analogy, a common practice among the earliest Greek thinkers [Lloyd 1992: 254–55; Allen 2001: 10–11].) This seems inconsistent with explanatory empiricism, since it justifies inferences from what can be observed to what is (at least in practice) unobservable.

Talk of discovering what is unseen from what is evident calls to mind the maxim attributed to Anaxagoras (ca. 500–428 BCE): “Appearances are a vision of the invisible” (DK 59B21a; Graham 2010: 309). Not only was this principle employed in the Hippocratic writings, but it was said to have been endorsed by Democritus (ca. 460–371 BCE) (Sextus M VII 1.140). For all his scepticism regarding sense perception (DK 68B6–10; Graham 2010: 592–95), Democritus seemed to think it had an evidential role (Asmis 1984: 345). In particular, he apparently believed it could confirm the atomist theory which Leucippus (fl. ca. 450–420 BCE) had originated and he himself had embraced. There is, however, a difficulty here, as Democritus himself may have realized, for in one report he has the senses utter the following: “Wretched mind, after taking from us your evidence, do you overthrow us? Our fall will be your defeat!” (DK 68B125; Graham 2010: 597). The problem here is that while one can cite observable facts (such as the fact of motion) in support of atomism, that doctrine in turn suggests that appearances are deceptive (Barnes 1982: 559–64). As another fragment reads, “by convention color, by convention sweet, by convention bitter, but in reality atoms and void” (DK 68B9, 125; Graham 2010: 597). At first sight, anyway, the atomist doctrine seems self-defeating.

What we find, then, in the work of some of the earliest Greek philosophers is not only the first outline of empiricist doctrines; we also find hints of the difficulties such doctrines would encounter. But to find a clearer statement of empiricist ideas, we must turn to the work of Aristotle.

3.2 Aristotle’s Empiricism

Was Aristotle an empiricist? The question is not an easy one to answer. Aristotle discussed a variety of ways in which human beings can achieve a grasp of reality. In one place, for instance, he outlines five ways in which “the soul possesses the truth by way of affirmation or denial” (EN 1139b15–17). These are art or craft (technē), scientific knowledge (epistēmē), practical wisdom (phronēsis), philosophical wisdom (sophia), and intellect (nous). But he did not construct a systematic epistemology and it is not clear we could construct a consistent one from his surviving works.

Aristotle did, however, believe the senses to be reliable, and that we must rely on their deliverances for our knowledge of the world. He was, as one recent author puts it, “the great defender of the manifest image in the classical world” (Kalderon 2015: 203; cf. Sellars 1991: 4–5). Although Aristotle had insisted that “not everything that appears is true” (Met. 1010b2–3), he also distinguished between appearances (ta phainomena) and sensations (aisthēseis). Each of the senses has its own proper objects (such as color, in the case of sight) and our grasp of these is “is [always] true or [at least] admits the lowest degree of falsehood” (DA 428b18–19; cf. 428a11). It is when we make judgements about these that we can fall into error (DA 430a27–28; Kalderon 2015: 68–70). Aristotle also insists that “no one can learn anything at all in the absence of sense” and that even when we are not actively perceiving, our thinking remains dependent on sensory images (DA 432a7–9). Insofar as it insists on both the reliability of the senses and their essential role in the gaining of knowledge, Aristotle’s view is broadly empiricist.

To gain a better understand of the nature and limits of Aristotle’s empiricism, we must once again make some distinctions. Aristotle can be classed as a tabula rasa empiricist, for he rejects the claim that we have innate ideas or principles of reasoning. He is also, arguably, an explanatory empiricist, although in a different sense from that found among later medical writers and sceptics. We can regard him as a modest kind of justificatory empiricist, who believes that scientific theorizing is answerable to what can be observed. But it is less clear that he can be said to be a cognitive empiricist, given the role of intellectual insight in his account of scientific explanation.

With regard to tabula rasa empiricism, Aristotle rejects the doctrine of innate ideas found in the work of Plato (427–347 BCE). He strongly denies, for instance, that we have innate knowledge of the principles of scientific demonstration (APo. 100a; Met. 993a). This aspect of Aristotle’s empiricism can be illustrated by his attitude to mathematics. For Plato, mathematical objects resemble the Forms—some may in fact be Forms (Shapiro 2000: 54–55)—which occupy a timeless realm distinct from that of the objects of sense perception (Rep. 510c1–511b2). They are known, therefore, either by recollection (anamnēsis) or by a kind of direct intellectual intuition. Along with his rejection of innate ideas, Aristotle also rejects this conception of mathematical objects. What the mathematician grasps are real features of perceptible objects, but regarded in a particular way (Lear 1982: 168, 184). They are regarded merely “as” (hēi) having quantity and being continuous or as objects of enumeration (Phys. 193b22–194a10; Met. 1061a28–1061b3, 1077b19–1078a4, 1078a22–28).

Is Aristotle an explanatory empiricist? Aristotle does accept the need for inferences from what can be observed to facts that are not immediately evident (Asmis 1984: 212–17). As he writes, “to gain light on things imperceptible we must use the evidence of perceptible things” (EN 1104a13–14). It follows that something perceived can serve as a sign of something that we would not otherwise know. Roughness of the tongue, for example, is a sign (sēmeion) of fever (DS 462b26–32); the large size of hailstones is a sign (sēmeion) they have been formed close to the earth (Meteor. 348a33–36). But while knowledge of signs constitutes evidence, it does not, in themselves, represent scientific knowledge. Scientific knowledge is knowledge not just of facts, but of their causes. Even if the association between sign and signified is without exception, so that one can infer the latter from the former, such an inference is not the same as offering an explanation. It may be, for instance, that fever is a reliable sign of illness (Rhet. 1357b18–19): all those with fever have an underlying medical condition. But this does not yet constitute an explanation. Clearly, the fever does not explain the illness. While a particular illness could explain the fever, an explanatory inference of this kind would go in the other direction: it would take us from the illness to the fever, showing the latter to be a necessary consequence of the former. A sign, in other words, can establish only what Aristotle calls “the fact” (to hoti); showing a correlation between sign and signified does not, in itself, establish the “reasoned fact” (to dioti) (Madden 1952: 372; cf. APo. 78a23).

Note, too, that the category of explanatory empiricism suggests a particular view of scientific explanation. It suggests that the causal factors to which an explanation appeals will be hidden aspect of the natural world, facts which lie “beneath,” as it were, the observable reality of things. An explanatory empiricist denies we can know such facts. Aristotle is cautious regarding our ability to know about matters that cannot be directly observed. As he writes, when it comes to “matters inaccessible to the senses,” it is sufficient if our investigation arrives at a possible cause (Meteor. 344a5–7). But Aristotle would also deny that we need knowledge of what is unobservable in order to have a satisfactory explanation. The causes invoked by an Aristotelian science are not occult or hidden. On the contrary, the explanatory properties of things are open to view. It follows that the arguments that constitute a scientific explanation are not inferences from an observable fact to an unobservable cause, such as the behavior of Democritean atoms. They are demonstrative arguments referring to active powers whose operations can be directly perceived. Even when a particular event (such as the formation of hailstones) cannot be directly perceived, a plausible explanation will be one that appeals to observable phenomena (such as the way objects are made smooth by friction). One apparent exception is found in Aristotle’s explanation of the movement of the outermost heavenly sphere. This posits a different kind of explanatory principle: a divine substance or being (ousia) which is “eternal and unmoved and separated from perceptible things” (Met. 1073a4–5). For the most part, however, Aristotle’s scientific explanations invoke perceptible realities.

What about justificatory empiricism? It seems that no ancient or medieval thinker would have endorsed a strong form of justificatory empiricism, which holds that the origins of a theory are irrelevant to its epistemic status. But many did insist that all scientific theorizing was answerable to experience. Aristotle was one of them. As he remarks, “we should accept what is evident to the senses rather than [mere] reasoning,” and reasoning only if it agrees with the observed facts (GA 760b29–33). He had little sympathy with the idea that the natural world could be explained in an entirely a priori fashion, as Plato sometimes suggests (e.g. Rep. 530b7–8, 531c1–5). He criticizes, for instance, the Pythagoreans for forcing their observations of the heavens to accord with theory, rather than seeking theories that account for what can be seen to occur (DC 293a25–27). Aristotle is particularly dismissive of the Eleatic philosophers, who in their reasoning “transcended sense perception and disregarded it on the grounds of following the argument.” He notes that while their opinions are supported by reason, it would be “almost madness to believe them, when one considers the facts” (GC 325a18–20). The facts in question are those revealed by the senses.

If there is a feature of Aristotle’s thought that casts doubt on his empiricism, it is the account of scientific reasoning found in his Posterior Analytics. That account is deductive: it involves a derivation of the fact to be explained from first principles, the latter being “true, primary, immediate, better known than and prior to the conclusion, the latter being related to them as effect to cause” (APo. 71b20–24). There has been much debate regarding the role of such demonstrations. But the most plausible view is that they are not, for Aristotle, a means of making scientific discoveries; they are the way in which such discoveries should be presented (Barnes 1994, xii). Indeed Aristotle expressly denies we can discover explanatory principles by way of demonstration, holding that such demonstrations serve merely to make them clear (APo. 93b16–18). This view seems consistent with Aristotle’s practice in his own scientific writings, as well as the methodological remarks found in his biological works. He argues, for instance, that when studying animals “we ought first to take the phenomena that are observed in each group, and then go on to state their causes” (PA 640a15). While we should not confuse Aristotle’s empiricism with that of Francis Bacon (Harari 2004: 35), even his theorizing can be said to begin with what is observed.

It remains true, however, that Aristotle’s ideal presentation of a scientific explanation is that of a demonstration from first principles. Only such a demonstration, he believes, would make clear the necessary connection that constitutes a causal relation. While he recognizes that this ideal is not always attainable, it remains a desideratum. So how does one arrive at those principles? It is here that Aristotle’s empiricism seems on shaky ground. The active properties to which scientific demonstrations appeal are universals: they are properties common to all beings of a particular kind which constitute them as beings of that kind. Aristotle rejects the idea that such universal properties exist extra rem, independently of the individuals that embody them. So in order to arrive at the principles of scientific explanation we need to recognize the identity of kind among the forms of particular objects and thus the universal that is embodied in each of them (Owens 1966: 168). The process by which we come to grasp the universals required for scientific explanations is known as epagōgē (APo. 99b15–100b15), a term commonly (but unhelpfully) translated as “induction.”

What Aristotle means by this term is notoriously unclear; indeed there is some debate about whether he uses it consistently (Ross 1949: 50; Harari 2004: 33–34). But it is possible to make some general comments. Aristotle customarily distinguishes induction from syllogistic reasoning, in the sense of demonstration. As he writes in one place, “all our beliefs come either through demonstration [dia sullogismou] or from induction [ex epagōgēs]” (APr. 68b13). The general contrast here is that while “demonstration proceeds from universals to particulars,” induction takes one “from particulars to universals” (Ross 1949: 47; cf. Top. 195a13–14). The latter, of course, is precisely what is required to discover the principles of scientific explanation. What is unclear, however, is how we can move from particulars to universals.

Aristotle denies (as we have seen) that the principles of a scientific demonstration are themselves to be reached by way of demonstration (APo. 72b19–20; 93b16–18). But a demonstration (sullogismos) is a strong form of argument, in which conclusions follow necessarily from the premises (APr. 24b18–20). So some weaker form of reasoning could be involved, such as “induction” in our modern sense: a generalization over a collection of particulars. The latter gives rise to the notorious “problem of induction” (sect. 4.2), of which Aristotle shows some awareness (Top. 131b19–36): how can any limited range of observations justify a universal claim? But even leaving this aside, there is a serious objection to understanding Aristotle’s epagōgē in this way. The most such a generalization could show that all individuals of a certain class have certain characteristics (APo. 92a37–92b2): that all swans are white, for instance. It could not tell us that this characteristic is essential, one of the features that constitutes a swan as a swan. Aristotle also suggests that each of the principles of scientific explanation is in some sense self-evident: it “commands belief of itself” (kath’heautēn einai pistēn) (Top. 100b19–22). This seems to exclude the idea that these principles are reached by any process of reasoning. Epagōgē is, therefore, best regarded as “an immediate apprehension of essences or forms” (Harari 2004: 34) that occurs in the very process of perceiving particular individuals of a given kind.

There is a problem here for anyone who wants to regard Aristotle as an empiricist. While his epagōgē certainly draws on the deliverances of the senses, and could not operate without them, it seems to go beyond what the senses could reveal. For Aristotle, as we have seen, sensation is reliable when it comes to its proper objects: colours, sounds, tastes, smells, and tangible properties. But there is a gap between sensing such properties and perceiving the characteristics that are essential to objects of a particular kind (Taylor 1990: 127–28). Even if we can reliably synthesize the proper objects of perception into the objects of everyday experience (tables, trees, and so on), it requires a further step to decide which properties belong necessarily to such objects. (For a less pessimistic view of the powers of epagōgē, see Barnes 1994: 267–71.)

If this is true, it is not clear what conclusion we should draw. One possible conclusion is that Aristotle is not a cognitive empiricist, since at a key point he relies on a rationalist, indeed “super-rationalist” view of cognition, one in which the (active) intellect “has nothing to learn from experience” (Kahn 1981: 410–11; cf. sect. 4.3). Experience would provide merely the occasion on which the necessary insight is gained. A second possible conclusion is that while Aristotle’s theory of knowledge was thoroughly empiricist, it was doomed to failure. The reliance on experience he advocated could not lead to the kind of insights he required (Gaukroger 1978: 124). A third possible conclusion is that his position transcends the distinction between empiricism and rationalism, epagōgē being “a form of perceptive insight” that enables one to see the intelligible aspect of what is grasped by the senses (Ziguras 2013: 96). But however we assess Aristotle’s views, the question they raised would return, to haunt the work of the medievals.

3.3 Medics, Sceptics, and Epicureans

For further examples of ancient empiricist doctrine we can turn to the medical writers and sceptics of the Hellenistic age (a roughly 300-year period following the death of Alexander the Great in 323 BCE) and the teachings of Epicurus (ca. 341–270 BCE) and his followers. The medical writers and sceptics offer a sophisticated form of explanatory empiricism, while the Epicureans offer a strong view of the reliability of sense perception coupled with a cautious acceptance of inferences to what is “not evident,” such as the existence and activity of atoms.

The first people to describe themselves as empiricists (empeirikoi) were a group of medical writers of the Hellenistic period. We know of these thinkers only indirectly, through the work of other ancient writers, in particular Galen of Pergamon (129–ca. 200 CE). As medical practitioners, their primary concerns were practical: finding the correct method of diagnosis and treatment. But in discussing these matters they put forward some general epistemological claims, developing the empiricist tendencies already found in the Hippocratic writings (sect. 3.1). In particular, they set themselves in opposition to those whom they called “rationalists” (logikoi) or “dogmatists” (dogmatikoi). What set them apart was a refusal to posit causes beyond those that can be observed.

In spelling out their position the empiricists distinguished between two styles of inference. What they rejected was the variety of reasoning they called “analogism” (analogismos), which “starts from what is apparent but ends up with what is entirely unclear” (Galen SB ch. 5). In its place they advocated what they called “epilogism” (epilogimos), which deals “solely with what is apparent,” but can be used “to discover what is currently unseen” (Galen SB ch. 5). The idea here is that while the cause that is inferred may be currently hidden, the inference is based on an association that is, at other times, directly observable. Epilogismos, the empiricists argued, is a form of reasoning used by all human beings, which leads to a consensus, while analogismos leads to disagreement and conclusions that can be neither confirmed nor denied (Galen ME ch. 24).

While we know of the medical empiricists only indirectly, we do have first-hand access to the thought of another group of explanatory empiricists, namely the sceptics of the Pyrrhonian school as represented by the writings of Sextus Empiricus (ca. 150–225 CE). (The empiricus title suggests that he, too, was associated with the medical writers.) Worth noting, first of all, is Sextus’s presentation of the problem of induction (epagōgē). This assumes that epagōgē is simply a process of enumerative induction. As we have already seen (sect. 3.2), this is unlikely to be what Aristotle understood by the term, but given this understanding of induction, Sextus is quick to point out its inadequacy. Those who follow this procedure must survey “all the particulars or some of them.” If they survey only some, the induction will be insecure, since it may be that some of the omitted particulars lack the feature in question. But if they try to survey all, “they will labour at an impossible task, since the particulars are infinite and indefinite” (Sextus PH 2.204). The argument is not strictly sound, since there are cases in which we know (or believe we know) all the instances. An example offered by John Buridan (1295–1358) was that of a proposition regarding all the (six) planets (SD 6.1.5). But the question would remain a live one for any would-be empiricist.

Does this scepticism rule out any kind of general knowledge? The sceptics, of course, are not interested in developing general laws or principles. If they do discuss scientific matters, it is only to show that for any one theory, a contrary but equally persuasive theory can be developed (Sextus PH 1.18). But they do not deny that for practical purposes we can rely on the observed association of particular kinds of events. Of importance here is Sextus’s distinction between two types of sign: the “commemorative” or “recollective” (hypomynēstikon) and the “indicative” (endeiktikon). An indicative sign is thought to signify some reality that has not directly been observed. It does so on account of what Sextus calls “its proper nature and constitution” (Sextus PH 2.101). The idea here seems to be that of a necessary connection between the sign and what it indicates, known by reason rather than by experience. The inference from movement to the possession of a soul, for example, makes use of an indicative sign, for the soul can never be directly observed. In Sextus’s view, inferences of this kind cannot be justified. Sextus is, however, happy to endorse the use of commemorative signs, which are based on nothing more than the past experience of the association of two kinds of phenomena. Smoke, for instance, is a commemorative sign of fire; a scar is a commemorative sign that the bearer has received a wound (Sextus PH 2.102).

While we may think of these as two forms of inference, Sextus denied that reliance on commemorative signs involves any inference at all, since it does not involve making a judgement. He argued that if it did involve an inference, you would expect those who had no knowledge of logic to be less skilled in this respect. But, as he writes, “illiterate helmsmen and farmers with no experience of dialectical principles are expert judges of signs [akrōs sēmeiountai]”, being able to predict (in one case) a coming storm or calm weather and (in the other) a good or a poor harvest (Sextus M VII 2.270). Indeed, even non-human animals gain knowledge in this way. As Sextus writes, “the dog, when it tracks an animal by its footprints, is actually using signs [sēmeioutai],” but it is not making inferences. In Sextus’s words, “it does not formulate the judgement ‘if this is a footprint, a beast is here’” (Sextus M VII 2.271). This deflationary view may be what allows Sextus to reconcile a reliance on commemorative signs with his scepticism.

The aim of the ancient sceptics was not to achieve knowledge of nature; it was to attain “tranquillity in matters of opinion” (kata doxan ataraxia) (Sextus PH 1.15). Something similar may be said about the Epicureans. Their movement can be regarded as a “secular religion” (Milton 2002: 182), which aimed to achieve a knowlege of nature only insofar as this promoted peace of mind. (For a more vigorous defence of the scientific credentials of Epicureanism, see Asmis 1984.) But even if this is true, the writings of Epicurus and his followers do embody a distinctive form of empiricism. It is, first of all, a tabula rasa empiricism, holding that the evidence of the senses is “the base and foundation” of all our knowledge (Sextus M VII 1.216). But it differs from some other forms of empiricism both in regarding as infallible the immediate deliverances of perception and allowing for the mind to be affected by external objects in ways independent of the five senses. Epicurean empiricism is also more tolerant than that of the medical writers and sceptics, since it accepts inferences to unobservable causes. It is not, in other words, an explanatory empiricism. Indeed this seems to be the reason why the more sceptical Sextus counts Epicureans among the “dogmatists” (PH 1.3).

In a work entitled On the Criterion or The Canon (Peri kritēriou ē kanōn), Epicurus is said to have argued that all sensations (aisthēseis) are reliable, there being nothing that can refute them (Diogenes Laërtius [DL] 10.31). Sextus sums up this Epicurean doctrine as the view that “all sensed things … are true and existent” (Sextus M VII 2.9). On the face of it, this seems an untenable position. Do our senses not deceive us? Do we not see sticks as bent where they enter water or a distant large object as small? There are two responses an Epicurean would make. The first is to make a clear distinction (comparable to that made by Aristotle [sect. 3.2]) between our sensations and the opinions we form on the basis of what we sense. When it comes to our opinions, Epicurus held that “some them are true and others are false, since they are judgements of ours concerning what appears, and we judge sometimes rightly and sometimes wrongly” (Sextus M VII 1.210). When we make mistakes, in other words, it is not the senses that are to blame. Secondly, the senses are verdical because the impressions they form are not “purely private mental phenomena” (O’Keefe 2010: 100). They are brought about by the objects of which they testify, which emit a continuous flow of images or simulacra (eidōla) from their surfaces (Epicurus Ep. Hdt. 46–51). On this view, the senses are reliably informative, faithfully reflecting the objects that produced them, even if we later attribute to them a false propositional content.

Epicurean empiricism is, however, a relatively tolerant form of empiricism. It is tolerant, first of all, insofar as it does not restrict perception to what is received by way of the five senses. Epicurus and his followers seem to have regarded the mind itself as a kind of “supersense” (DeWitt 1954: 207–9), capable of receiving eidōla on its own account. (This doctrine bears some resemblance to one of the Buddhist beliefs mentioned earlier [sect. 1].) The Epicurean writer Lucretius (ca. 95–54 BCE), for instance, claims that some of the simulacra thrown off by objects are exceedingly fine, such that they can penetrate the body and affect the mind independently of the five senses. This allows him to account for the images we see in dreams, which accurately reflect aspects of the world, although in a manner that deceives us (Lucretius RN 4.722–31, 5.1168–71).

Epicurean empiricism is also more tolerant insofar as it allows for explanatory inferences to unobservable entities. More precisely, Epicurus speaks of two kinds of inferences from what is perceived to what is currently unobserved. The first is an inference to “that which awaits confirmation” (to prosmenon); the second is an inference to “that which is non-evident” (to adēlon) (Epicurus Ep. Hdt. 38.10). Reflecting on the views of Epicureans and other “dogmatists,” Sextus makes a similar distinction (PH 2.97–98). He speaks, firstly, of an inference to something that is “for the moment” (pros kairon) non-evident, but which will become evident in due course. His example is the city of Athens, which (assuming I am not at Athens) will become evident to me if I travel there. This corresponds to Epicurus’s “that which awaits confirmation” (DL 10.34). But Sextus also speaks of entities that are “non-evident by nature” (ta … phusei adēla), whose existence and activity, he writes, some “dogmatists” regard as knowable by inference. One of his examples is the Epicurean (and Democritean) belief in atoms moving in the void (Sextus M VII 2.319). This corresponds to Epicurus’s “that which is non-evident.” Note that Sextus adds to these two a third category: that of matters which are “altogether non-evident” (ta kathapax adēla) (PH 2.97), which even dogmatists agreed could never be known by any kind of inference, his example being whether the number of stars is odd or even.

What kinds of inference (on the Epicurean view) could be used to supported belief in unobservable entities? In the case of entities unobservable only “for the moment,” the answer is clear. One can make a conjecture and then test it when the entity in question becomes observable (Sextus M VII 1.212). But in the case of things that are “non-evident by nature,” only indirect confirmation is possible. Epicurus’s view seems to have been that a hypothesis consistent with experience—one that is not “witnessed against”—can and should be accepted (Sextus M VII 1.216). But of course two or more hypotheses may survive this test. Remarkably, Epicurus and his followers seem to have held that in these circumstances they can all be accepted, not just as possible, but as true, being realized at some time or in some place (Allen 2004: 95; cf. Lucretius RN 5.526–33). While this may have seemed plausible in a universe infinite in extent and unlimited in time, it leaves open the question of which of these explanations applies to the particular case we are interested in. Epicurus seems to have held that we should not always expect to be able to answer this question (Ep. Pyth. 86). Nor do we need to do so; the knowledge that an event has some natural explanation is sufficient to free us from a superstitious fear of the gods (Ep. Pyth. 87).

4. Medieval Empiricism

It is hardly surprising, given the influence of Christianity, that neither ancient scepticism nor Epicureanism found much of a following among medieval thinkers. But the attitudes associated with the medical empiricism of late antiquity did not entirely disappear: we find at least hints of these among late medieval writers. A striking example is the polemical work Antipocras by Nicholas of Poland (fl. 1278). While himself an educated man, trained within the scholastic tradition and assocated with the medical school at Montpellier, Nicholas advocated a medical practice based on experience, praising the knowledge of common people over against that of the scholars. This may have been a reaction to the more theoretical style of medicine developing at Montpellier as a result of the discovery of works by Galen and some Arab writers (Eamon & Keil 1987: 195). But for evidence of more general empiricist doctrines, we must turn to the followers of Aristotle.

4.1 Genetic and Justificatory Empiricism

The medieval followers of Aristotle shared his confidence in the reliability of the senses. Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274), for example, follows Aristotle in holding that sensation is not deceived with regard to its proper objects, such as colours and sounds (ST 1a 17.3), provided that the sense organs are functioning properly and in the right circumstances (Pasnau 2002: 188–89).

Did medieval philosophers embrace a tabula rasa empiricism? The Latin phrase characterizing an empiricism of this kind—nihil est in intellectu quod non prius fuerit in sensu—was something of a commonplace. It is found (in variant forms) in the work of Bonaventure (1221–1274), where it is attributed to Aristotle, Aquinas, Matthew of Aquasparta (ca. 1240–1302), and Duns Scotus (1266–1308) (Cranefield 1970: 78–79). Not all accepted the idea, as we shall see, but Aristotelians generally took it for granted. Aquinas follows Aristotle (DA 432a7–9) in holding that all the objects of our understanding “have their being in the objects of perception,” rather than in some separated, Platonic realm. It follows that “without sense perception no one can either learn anything new, nor understand matters already learned.” Even when we are thinking about something we already know, our thought is always accompanied by an image (a “phantasm”), which is a likeness of something that can be perceived (Aquinas In DA 3.13 [para. 791]).

But even when they speak of the mind as a tabula rasa, we should not attribute to medieval writers the kind of genetic empiricism later found in the work of John Locke. The blank tablet of which medievals speak, following Aristotle (DA 430a1), is what they called the “passive” or “potential” intellect, which was only one element in the process of cognition (sect. 4.3). When it comes to the larger picture, medieval philosophers will often combine the Aristotelian idea that all knowledge comes through the senses with Augustinian views, which speak of divine illumination (sect. 4.2) or innate knowledge. Even Aquinas held that we have a kind of innate capacity, ultimately given by God, to grasp the first principles of scientific knowledge (Pasnau 2002: 307–8). This is probably best thought of as a kind of a dispositional innatism: we are disposed to form certain ideas when presented with the right kind of experience. At times Aquinas seems to go further. He writes, for instance, that our knowledge arises “partly from within and partly from without” and that there is some truth in the idea that “we already know that which we learn” (Aquinas DV 10.6). But what he seems to mean here is that the principles we employ in forming our beliefs are implicit in the structure of the mind and its operations (Allers 1942: 58) (see sect. 4.3). Other writers approach the tabula rasa idea from the other direction, beginning with a clear commitment to innate knowledge. Roger Bacon (1215–1292), for instance, suggests that the human soul is created with the species (aspects or forms) of all things within it, which seems a strongly Augustinian conception of knowledge. But since the soul’s union with the body hinders our access to this knowledge, the human mind (as potential intellect) can be described as a “blank slate” (tabula nuda or rasa) (Bacon In Phys. pp. 7, 9; R. Wood 2007: 54). A similar view is found in the work of Robert Grosseteste (ca. 1165–1253), who also combines a modified Augustinian belief in divine illumination (sect. 4.2) with the Aristotelian idea that we gain knowledge of scientific principles from experience (van Dyke 2009: 688–89).

While these look like puzzling combinations of empiricist and non-empiricist views, their rationale will become clear shortly (sect. 4.3). But alongside this qualified genetic empiricism, we also find expressions of a justificatory empiricism. In particular, the work of Roger Bacon sets out two forms of justificatory empiricism, both of which fall under the heading of what he calls scientia experimentalis. The first involves confirming well-founded deliverances of reason by “trying them out,” as it were, for oneself (Hackett 2015: sect. 5.4.3). Bacon’s rationale for urging this kind of testing is that arguments alone are insufficient to convince us of the truth of any practical matter. “Reasoning,” he writes,

draws a conclusion and forces us to grant it, but it does not confirm it nor remove doubt so that the mind may rest in the knowledge of the truth, unless this is found by way of experience. … For if a man … should prove by way of adequate arguments that fire burns and harms and destroys things, still the mind of the hearer would not rest on this account nor would such a person avoid fire before he had placed his hand or some combustible material in fire, so that he might test by experience [ut per experientiam probaret] what the argument had taught. (Bacon OM 6.1)

It follows (in a phrase for which Bacon has become famous) that “without experience nothing can be sufficiently known” (sine experientia nihil sufficienter sciri potest) (OM 6.1).

A second form of justificatory empiricism holds that some beliefs can be defended only by reference to experience, there being no arguments from prior principles that can be adduced in their support. These include, first of all, matters within the domain of the other sciences which mere reasoning could never have revealed, such as the practical discoveries made by alchemists (Bacon OM 6, 2a prae.). But there are also matters that fall outside the domain of any speculative science, fields of inquiry in which scientia experimentalis “by its own power investigates the secrets of nature” (Bacon OM 6, 3a prae.). To appreciate what this kind of investigation entailed, we need to understand the class of phenomena to which it applied: that of the secrets of nature.

The domain of natural philosophy was “the common course of nature” (Biard 2001: 79, 80): it dealt with what occurred (in Aristotle’s phrase) “either always or for the most part” (ē tou aei ē tou hōs epi to polu) (Met. 1027a21–22). But there existed phenomena that fell outside this domain, namely miracles and marvels. Miracles, in the strict sense, were supernatural occurrences, which fell in the domain of theology. But marvellous phenomena were often thought of as “preternatural,” that is to say, as brought about by occult but natural properties and powers (Daston 1991: 95–100). Such powers included the influence exercised by the heavenly bodies on earthly affairs, as well as mysterious properties of sublunary entities, such as the lodestone. These powers were occult in the sense of being hidden. But they were also mysterious in that their workings were not explicable in terms of what Aristotelians believed to be the four simple substances (earth, air, fire, and water) and their associated primary qualities (the hot and the cold, the moist and the dry) (Pasnau 2011: 44). It is for this reason that they could not be proved to exist by demonstrative arguments, but could be known only by experience. This gave rise to a particular form of empiricism associated with the study of “natural magic.”

An example can be found in the work of an author already mentioned: Nicholas of Poland, the radical medical empiricist of Montpellier. In his Antipocras Nicholas claims that although the presence of a divinely given power in the most humble of objects cannot be proven by reason, it “is made evident by its effect” (hoc patet effectu) (Nicholas of Poland Ant. ll. 202–3). In this respect Nicholas seems to have been influenced by another work more closely associated with magic, the De mirabilibus mundi. This states that there are “certain effects manifest to the senses to which we can assign no reason,” as well as effects known only by way of reason. The marvellous powers of natural objects belong to the former category, which are known by way of practical experience (per experientiam) (Ps-Albertus PA-DM para. 49–50). While this work was falsely attributed to Albert the Great (ca. 1200–1280), Albert himself adopts a similar line when defending the mysterious powers of certain stones: these, too, are known “most convincingly by experience,” although they lack a scientific explanation (A-DM 2.1.1).

When medieval writers speak of knowing matters per experientiam (by experience), they are understanding the term experientia very broadly. The same may be said of the term experimentalis, so that the phrase scientia experimentalis should be translated as “experiential knowledge” rather than “experimental science.” Although Bacon’s scientia experimentalis did include practical procedures (experimenta), as were used in alchemy, as well as the use of instruments (as in the study of optics and astronomy), it also included simple observation as well as reliance on second-hand reports of dubious value. (We are still a long way from the motto of the seventeenth-century Royal Society: nullius in verba, “take no man’s word for it.”) Nor is there any consistent link with quantification. In only a few fields, such as astronomy, are the procedures employed by natural philosophers associated with careful measurement. In the century following Bacon’s work, we do find the development of what we may call “quantified concepts,” particularly in the study of local motion. We find this, in particular, in the work of the Oxford calculatores associated with Merton College, who are perhaps best known for their formulation of the “mean speed theorem.” This was the idea that

a uniform acceleration produces the same … distance travelled in a given time, as a uniform velocity equal to the instantaneous velocity at the middle instance of the time of acceleration. (Crombie 1961: 153)

But while such developments mark a break with the Aristotelian tradition of a purely qualitative physics, they remain largely theoretical. While the discussions giving rise to the mean speed theorem emerged from everyday observations of falling bodies, the theorem itself was proven arithmetically and geometrically (Clagett 1959: 256, 259–60). The principles developed were not “operationalized,” that is to say, expressed in forms that would allow for experimental testing (Clagett 1959: 206). Their experimental testing had to await Galileo’s inclined plane experiments (Crombie 1961: 153–54).

This broad understanding of experience is evident, too, in medieval conceptions of the origin and scope of perceptual knowledge. With regard to the origins of such knowledge, later empiricists would focus almost exclusively on the five “exterior senses.” But medieval authors, following Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā; 980–1037), commonly list up to five “interior senses” (Bates 2010: 138–39) alongside the exterior ones. Aquinas reduces these to four: the common sense, the imagination, the vis aestimativa (or cogitativa), and the sense memory (Aquinas ST 1a 78.4). The work of these interior senses involves an active role in shaping our perceptions, even those of our physical environment. The mind, in other words, is not entirely passive, even at its basic levels of operation. The vis aestimativa, for instance, refers to the power that even non-rational creatures have of making judgements about what is dangerous or useful: it shapes our perceptions by adding an evaluative component. (There is something analogous here to James Gibson’s theory of “affordances” [sect. 2.2].)

With regard to the scope of experience, this was generally thought to include knowledge of our own interior acts. That we have some kind of immediate access to such knowledge was “one of the truisms of Augustinian thought” (Leff 1975: 28). Its mechanism was unclear—Scotus says simply that we know these things “by way of a certain sense, that is, an interior perception” (quodam sensu, id est, perceptione interiore) (Scotus Ord. IV d. 43, q. 2)—but its existence was not in doubt. As an anonymous scribe wrote in the margin of one of Ockham’s manuscripts, the idea that “there is nothing in the intellect unless it was formerly in the senses” applies to “external objects, not to its own acts” (Leff 1975: 28 n.116). In Bacon’s work, this focus on inner experience is taken a step further, insofar as his conception of experience embraces not only our everyday mental states, but also spiritual states up to and including “raptures” in which people have visions of things “of which it is not lawful for human beings to speak” (Bacon OM 6.2). These are experiences brought about by the grace of God, rather than any purely natural process of cognition.

4.2 The Eclipse of Divine Illumination

We have seen that medieval thought included a qualified form of tabula rasa empiricism and a distinctive form of justificatory empiricism, coupled with a broad undersanding of “experience.” There is no need to dwell on explanatory empiricism, for insofar as medieval natural philosophy was influenced by Aristotle it shared his view of scientific explanations. For the most part these did not invoke unobservable entities, such as atoms, but manifest powers of the entities we can perceive (sect. 3.2). Medieval thinkers did not deny that we could know about unobservable entities. God, after all, was an unobservable entity, and thinkers such as Aquinas thought that “natural reason” could know something about God, albeit by way of analogy. (William of Ockham [ca. 1285–1347] would later downplay the extent of such knowledge, without dismissing it altogether [Leff 1975: 382–98].) But there were limits to what we could know about the unobservable features of the natural world (Hutchison 1982: 235–36). Aquinas, for instance, appears to endorse Aristotle’s view that when it comes to matters that are “not manifest to the senses” (immanifesta sensui) we should not demand “a certain and necessary demonstration”; a merely possible explanation may be the best we can achieve (Aquinas In Meteor. 1.7 [lect. 11]). One could regard this as a modest kind of explanatory empiricism. But the focus here will be on a different question, namely whether any medievals were cognitive empiricists, denying that we have intellectual powers or capacities giving access to factual knowledge independently of experience.

Followers of St Augustine shared Plato’s doubts about the capacity of sense perception, in particular about its ability to give rise to scientific knowledge. Such knowledge, they held, did not arise from sense perception alone; it required a further input, provided by God himself: a divine illumination. This can be a difficult idea for a modern reader to grasp, since it is easily confused with another belief, which has to do with a supernatural source of knowledge accessed by faith. The two are analogous, insofar as they both involve a divine initiative. The act of faith requires a divine initiative “on the volitional side,” to enable us to accept propositions as divinely revealed. The doctrine of divine illumination also speaks of a divine initiative, but that initiative is directly cognitive rather than volitional (Pasnau 2015: sect. 1). It holds that divine illumination is required for a number of apparently ordinary cognitive activities, which are engaged in by believers and non-believers alike.

While this doctrine has theological roots, it was also motivated by two features of human knowledge. The first has to do with those principles of thought that appear to be necessarily, not contingently, true. These include mathematical truths and principles such as that of non-contradiction or sufficient reason. While such principles are essential to thought, it is difficult to see how they could be derived from sense perception. (Aristotle had provided an empiricist account of the origin of mathematical ideas [sect. 3.2], but this was, and remains, contested.) A second motivation was related to the Aristotelian ideal of science. Scientia, as we have seen, involved a grasp of the essential properties of perceived objects. But this, too, involves a kind of insight that can seem to lie beyond the capacity of the senses (sect. 3.2). Advocates of divine illumination argued that these kinds of knowledge were possible only because the human mind has access to the mind of God. More precisely, it was possible only because God bathed the human mind in his own, uncreated light. This allowed it not only to grasp necessary truths, but to understand the essences of created beings by reference to their exemplars in the divine mind.

The development of medieval empiricism involved a rejection of this doctrine. It is already opposed by Aquinas, who holds that that the human mind requires a special divine illumination only for those matters that entirely exceed its natural powers, which are known by divine revelation (Aquinas ST 1a 2ae 109.1). But the most vigorous rejection of the doctrine is to be found in the work of Duns Scotus, who opposes the (modified) illuminationist teaching found in the work of Henry of Ghent (ca. 1217–1293).

Henry’s version of the illuminationist doctrine was already influenced by Aristotelian thought (Marrone 1985: 145; 2011: 24), which in this context took the form of a desire to attribute as much as possible to the power of the human mind. But Henry was reluctant to attribute all we know to our unaided powers. In particular, he made a distinction between knowing what is true (id quod verum est) about an object and knowing its truth (eius veritatem). The first is a very basic level of knowledge, existing even in non-human animals. It does grasp its object as a something distinct from the knower, but fails to grasp its essential characteristics. Such knowledge is not sufficient for science, which requires a grasp of what the object truly is (quid sit in rei veritate) (Henry of Ghent Summa 1.2). The latter kind of knowledge requires access to the exemplar of the object in the divine mind, something only God can give.

It is this idea that Duns Scotus opposes. He would not, of course, have opposed the idea that the human mind was created by God and thus owes all its powers to God. (Scotus was, after all, a theologian.) But he did deny that scientific knowledge involved a special divine illumination. His argument proceeds in two stages. He insists, first of all, that Henry’s restrictions on the powers of the human mind, rather than leading to scientific certainty, lead inevitably to scepticism. If the human mind is naturally incapable of grasping these truths, then no amount of divine light will help it. He then argues that there are four kinds of naturally attainable knowledge that give rise to the certainty required for science. There is, first of all, knowledge of “matters knowable in an unqualified sense,” such as the fact that a triangle has three angles equal to two right angles. The second is knowledge of “matters knowable through experience,” such as that the moon is eclipsed. The third is knowledge of “our own actions,” such as the fact that I am awake. The fourth is knowledge of “matters we are currently aware of through the senses,” such as that the object in front of me is white (Scotus Ord. I dist. 3, pars 1, qu. 4, adnot.).

Perhaps the most critical of these is knowledge through experience, for it relates to the way we grasp the principles of scientific explanation. Scotus’s suggestion is that we can know these principles through repeated exposure to particular instances. As he writes,

even though a person does not experience every single individual, but only a great many, nor does he experience them at all times, but only frequently, still be knows infallibly that it is always this way and holds for all instances. He knows this in virtue of this proposition reposing in his soul: “Whatever occurs in a great many instances by a cause that is not free, is the natural effect of that cause.” (Scotus Ord. I dist. 3, pars 1, qu. 4)

Scotus seems to regard this proposition as self-evidently true. But as Nicholas of Autrecourt (1299–1369) would point out, it merely begs the question (Thijssen 1987: 249). In any case, Nicholas writes, if Scotus means by a cause “that which brought an effect in a great many instances in the past and will do so in the future,” then there is a problem. For “even if something has brought about an effect in a great many instances, it is still not certain it will continue to do so” (Nicholas of Autrecourt EO ll. 44–47; Thijssen 1987: 249 n. 44). So we cannot, with certainty, form general statements on the basis of the kind of observations to which Scotus appeals. (This is, of course, the very problem of induction to which Sextus Empiricus had referred [sect. 3.3].) Even if we could formulate such general statements, we could not be certain that they embody causal claims.

We shall come back to this question (sect. 4.3), which was made more pressing by the nominalism of Scotus’s successor, William of Ockham. But even if Scotus had no satisfactory alternative to the doctrine of divine illumination, that doctrine was soon eclipsed. By the mid-fourteenth century, it seems to have been no longer considered a viable option. While the idea did not entirely disappear—it re-emerges, for instance, in the work of Nicolas Malebranche (1638–1715)—its rejection by late medieval thinkers marked an important step on the road to a more thorough-going empiricism.

4.3 Towards a Cognitive Empiricism

Advocates of the doctrine of divine illumination would not count as cognitive empiricists, for they held that the mind has access to a source of knowledge that is independent of the senses. What about those who rejected this doctrine? In many cases it is also difficult to regard them as cognitive empiricists, because of the remarkable power they continued to attribute to the mind: that of grasping the universals embedded in the singular objects of sense perception. What we see in the work of William of Ockham is a downgrading of this power, which goes hand-in-hand with a rethinking of the idea of universals. Ockham’s work thus laid the foundations on which early modern empiricists would build.

The power of the mind to grasp universals was traditionally attributed to what was called the “agent intellect,” the intellect as active or productive. The idea of the agent (or active) intellect is one of the most complex and contested aspects of medieval epistemology. It has its origins in some cryptic remarks made by Aristotle (DA 430a10–19), in which he distinguishes between two aspects of the mind. There is the mind as “that which becomes all things” (nous tōi panta ginesthai) and there is the mind as “that which makes all things” (ho … tōi panta poiein). Behind these descriptions is the idea that the mind “becomes” the object of its knowledge, in the sense of taking on its intelligible form without the matter in which it was originally embodied. The mind as passive—as that which becomes all things—stands in relation to the mind that makes all things in the same way that prime matter, which is pure potential, stands in relation to its shaping principle. Aristotle describes the mind as active or productive—the nous poiētikos, to use a phrase coined by his commentators—in terms that suggest something immaterial: it is “separable, unmixed, and impassible.” This may be because it is not so much a substance, as an operation or function; indeed Aristotle describes the nous poiētikos as “by nature activity” (tēi ousiai … energeia).

As that last interpretive remark suggests, this passage demands commentary and commentators disagreed about how it was to be understood. (For a classic survey, see Brentano 1992.) Broadly speaking, there were two views. The first held that the agent intellect was separate from each human mind, such that the intelligible forms “flow” from this immaterial entity into the mind to produce an act of understanding. This was the view held, in two quite different forms, by Ibn Sīnā (Avicenna) and Ibn Rushd (Averroës) (1126–1198). Such a view implies that there is only one agent intellect, common to all human beings, which may or may not be identified with God himself. (When it is identified with God, this view closely resembles the Augustinian doctrine of divine illumination.) The alternative idea, vigorously defended by Aquinas, held that both the agent intellect and the potential intellect are aspects of the human mind. Even among those who held that latter view, there were different ways in which the agent intellect was thought to produce knowledge. In some versions of the doctrine (such as Aquinas’s) the agent intellect was thought to abstract the intelligible forms from the images produced by the senses. In other versions, the input of the senses was little more than the occasion on which the agent intellect drew on its own innate resources, in the process of which the mind could be thought of as enlightened by God. Thomas of York (d. ca. 1260), for instance spoke openly in this context of innate ideas and of a knowledge that came “from above and not from the senses” (Bowman 1973: 265).

The second of these views, in particular, seems incompatible with both a tabula rasa and a cognitive empiricism. So it is not surprising that the development of a more thoroughgoing cognitive empiricism went hand-in-hand with with an effective abandonment of the idea of the agent intellect.

The work of the agent intellect had seemed essential because of a widely held view regarding the object of knowledge. This held that while the senses deal with particular individuals, the intellect can grasp only their universal properties. As Aquinas writes, citing Aristotle (APo. 87b37–39), “sense has to do with particulars, whereas intellect has to do with universals” (sensus particularium, intellectus … universalium) (Aquinas In DA 2.5 [sect. 284]). (The idea that the intellect has direct knowledge only of universals seems distinctively Aristotelian; it was not shared by other ancient philosophical schools [Normore 2007: 114].) Aquinas’s reason for holding this view is that the intellect, as an immaterial substance, cannot directly grasp material singulars. Intellectual knowledge therefore requires the work of the agent intellect, abstracting the immaterial intelligible forms from the perceptible forms grasped by the senses. We do, of course, know singular objects, for all the objects of sensation are, ultimately, singulars. But in Aquinas’s view, the intellect knows these objects only indirectly, by directing its attention back to the images yielded by the senses and linking these with the associated general concept (Aquinas ST 1a 86.1).

William of Ockham, on the other hand, holds what Aquinas expressly denies: that “the singular object is that which is first known, in a manner simple and proper to itself” (Ockham Quodl. I qu. 13). He holds, too, that the immateriality of the intellect is no barrier to this, since the relation involved is a merely intentional one (Ockham Ord. I dist. 3, qu. 6; In Phys. 1.1 [sect. 2]). Ockham, however, goes further in denying the very existence of universals. All Aristotelians, of course, denied that universals exist extra rem (distinct from singular objects). But Christian Aristotelians such as Aquinas continued to regard the similarities between individuals of a given kind as the product of a common idea, which existed ante rem (before the existence of particular objects) in the mind of God (Aquinas ST 1a 15.2). As aspects of the divine mind, these were thought to share in the divine nature. Indeed they were nothing less than “the divine essence as imitable outside itself” (Klocker 1980: 357). This gave the natural kinds discoverable by science a metaphysical grounding. While paying lip service to the Augustinian notion of ideas in the divine mind, Ockham reduced these to the ideas God has of individual objects in the act of creating them. These ideas refer, in the first instance, to the creatures themselves: the only reason for positing them is that when God creates he knows what he is doing (Deus est rationabiliter operans) (Ockham Ord. I dist. 35, qu. 5). It follows, as Ockham writes, that

no universal … exists in any way outside the mind and anything that can be predicated of many is by its nature in the mind either psychologically [subiective] or logically [obiective], and … no universal is of the essence or nature [de essentia seu quidditate] of any substance. (Ockham Ord. I dist. 2, qu. 8)

This means that the features that unite entities of a kind, which are expressed in the general propositions of science, no longer have a metaphysical foundation. While this view is generally described as “nominalist,” it is more accurately characterized as “conceptualist,” since the “names” to which universals were reduced were nomina mentalia (mental names), or (as we would say) concepts (Maurer 1999: 63–64). But with this qualification in mind, we can continue to refer to it as “nominalist.”

What implications does this have for the idea of the agent intellect? Despite his nominalism, Ockham continues to believe that there are real similarities lying behind our classificatory schemes, rejecting the idea that these are entirely matters of convention (Ockham Ord. I dist. 2 qu. 8). But although real similarities exist, they are not expressions of common essences or natures. Coupled with the idea that the mind has an immediate grasp of singular objects, it follows that a special faculty was not longer required in order to abstract the universal from the particular. It was enough for the mind to be able to identify similarities among particular individuals. (Note that the status of these similarities then became a problem, which Ockham may never satisfactorily have resolved [Goddu 1984: 92–93].) So it comes as no surprise to discover that Ockham denies any real distinction between the agent intellect and the potential intellect. “The same intellect,” he writes, simply “has different names” (Ockham Ord. I dist. 3, qu. 6). Since there was now no distinctive task for the agent intellect to perform, Ockham could wield his famous razor to abandon the idea that it represented a distinct power of the mind (Ockham Rep. II qu. 20).

There is another dimension to the empiricism of this period, which is a new emphasis on experience as a means of discovering causal relations. Any Aristotelian, of course, would have agreed that we know of causal relations by means of experience. But what we find in the work of Scotus and Ockham is a particular focus on this idea, coupled with descriptions of how one may isolate particular causes. Historians have long associated this with a renewed emphasis on God’s absolute power and the idea that the order of the world depends entirely on his will, which makes that order radically contingent and discoverable only a posteriori (Foster 1934: 464–65; Henry 2009: 88). It is, however, difficult to find a contemporary expression of this idea and it has recently been contested (Harrison 2002: 63–64). Nor should one overstate the degree of novelty in the thought of Scotus and Ockham. Grosseteste had already outlined the idea of a controlled experiment (Lewis 2013: sect. 11), noting that we can come to know that scammony (convulvulus scammonia) purges red bile by administering it “after all other causes purging red bile have been isolated and excluded” (Grosseteste In APo. 1.15; Crombie 1953: 74). It is true, however, that more detailed accounts of how to isolate causal relations are found only in the late thirteenth and fourteenth centuries. Scotus outlined several such methods (Vos 2006: 312–19), all of which involved separating out possible causes and testing them by seeing in which cases the effect follows. At one point, for example, Scotus writes:

How, from perceptible effects, does one arrive at knowledge of the cause? I respond, by dividing thus: in [a situation of type] A are present [factors] B, C, D, if you wish to know which of D, B, or C is a cause, consider the case where you find B without C. If then D follows B and not C, then in [a situation of type] A, B is the cause of D. (Scotus In Met. I qu. 4)

Ockham picks up on this idea. He does not deny that we can know of some causes by simple reasoning, on the basis of self-evident or well-established metaphysical principles. We can know, for instance, that the will causes its own acts (Ockham Ord. I dist. 1, qu. 3) or that there exists a first conserving cause of this world (Ockham Ord. I dist. 2, qu. 10]). But when it comes to the discovery of causes within the natural world, we must rely on observation. If a causal agent is of a very specific kind (in Ockham’s terms, known by way of its species specialissima), just one observation will suffice. A single observation of a particular kind of herb curing a particular illness, for example, can safely be generalized. It can be generalized on the basis of the principle that “all agents of the most specific kind will bring about effects of the same nature” (Ockham Ord. I prol. qu. 2). If the suspected cause is of a more generic kind, then many instances will be needed (Ockham Ord. I prol. qu. 2). But in either case, the process is thoroughly empirical: it involves the isolation of causal factors by way of experience. As Ockham writes,

although I do not intend to make any general claim about the nature of immediate [secondary] causes, I shall say what suffices for something to be an immediate cause, namely that when it is present there occurs the effect, and when it is not present … the effect does not occur. And everything that has this character with respect to another is the cause of that other … That this is sufficient for one thing to be the cause of another, seems manifest. Because if not, there remains no way of knowing something to be the cause of something else. (Ockham Ord. I dist. 45, qu. 1)

It is tempting to see this as a reduction of the idea of causation to that of the regular association of kinds of events. One could even argue that such a view would be a logical consequence of Ockham's nominalism (Klocker 1980: 351). But Ockham’s point here seems to be epistemological, not metaphysical: this is how we discover a cause (Adams 1979: 23). It follows that the only kind of cause we can discover is that which produces a novel (and therefore observable) effect. Without such an effect, there would (once again) be no way of knowing something to be a cause (Ockham Sum. II 3). Coupled with the effective abandonment of the idea of the agent intellect, this brings us very close to a thoroughgoing cognitive empiricism.

5. Conclusion

Those sympathetic to empiricism may be inclined to portray this history as a progress from darkness to light. But a moment’s reflection suggests it deserves a more cautious evaluation. These ancient and medieval thinkers certainly laid the foundations on which early modern and modern empiricists would build. But they also bequeathed a series of problems, some of which have never been satisfactorily resolved.

There are, first of all, the problems faced by the Epicureans, who were genetic but not explanatory empiricists, favouring the atomist theory of Leucippus and Democritus. As Democritus seems to have realized, while the atomist doctrine can be supported by observable facts (such as the fact of motion), once formulated it seems to undercut a belief in the reliability of such observations. At the very least, it suggests a distinction between what would later be called “primary” and “secondary” qualities, narrowing the range of the kind of experiences to which natural philosophers would appeal.

The Epicureans also seem to have come up against another enduring problem: that of the underdetermination of theory by data. If the senses cannot directly “bear witness” to the existence of what cannot be observed, being able only to bear witness against it, there may be a number of apparently equally acceptable hypotheses about the unobservable. One could argue, as Epicureans seem to have done, that these should all be regarded as true, in the sense of being realized somewhere and at some time. But this seems unsatisfactory when it comes to explaining particular events.

More broadly, there is the problem of just what experience can show. Can experience be a source of mathematical or logical knowledge? Can it reveal the causal relations that are traditionally regarded as the goal of science? Aristotle, as we saw, seems to have held that the mind has the power of identifying the causal powers that belong to particular kinds of entities. But it was never clear that experience alone could achieve such an insight. Medieval discussions of the “agent intellect” tended to regard it as an external power, or, at least, a human faculty that participates in a divine light. Thinkers such as Henry of Ghent went further, embracing the Augustinian idea that an act of divine illumination is required on each occasion we attain such insights. Under the impact of Aristotelian naturalism this idea was abandoned, but without (it must be said) any clear alternative.

Later empiricists could (and did) follow Ockham in denying that there are universals to be discovered; they professed to be undisturbed by the fact that we cannot grasp the “real essences” of the objects we perceive (Locke Essay 3.6.9). But the problems of empiricism did not go away. Even one of the empiricist’s favorite ideas—the “covering law” account of scientific explanation—assumes we can arrive at true generalizations, propositions that apply to all members of a particular class. But for those who take Ockham’s nominalism to its logical conclusion, a law of nature can be nothing more than a contingently true proposition. Since the similarities that fix class membership have no metaphysical grounding, not being based on a shared nature, we cannot know the truth of the law by any kind of rational insight. The only way of testing such a proposition is by observation. It is at this point that there arises the “problem of induction,” first discussed by Sextus Empiricus and picked up by Nicholas of Autrecourt.

The problems, however, go beyond that of induction. If laws of nature are to be distinguished from accidental generalizations, they must be thought to embody modal knowledge, particularly as this relates to contrary-to-fact conditionals (Armstrong 1978: 274). Epicurus seems to have somewhat naïvely believed that “in grasping the phenomena, we grasp how things can and must be” (Allen 2004: 98). But it is far from clear how observation could lead to such insights. If Epicurus was naïve in this respect, the same could be said of many modern empiricists.

This article began with the observation that we should not approach ancient thinkers in a “Whiggish” fashion; nor should we force their thought into modern categories. But what this history shows is that there is no need to do so. Once we understand what these thinkers were saying, we can see that many of their questions remain what medievals called quaestiones disputatae, with which we are still grappling.


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