Notes to Social Epistemology

1. Furthermore, Moss (2011) uses epistemic utility theory to argue for an aggregation method that takes into account values for accuracy and that supports averaging under certain conditions (see Pettigrew 2011 [2016] for an overview of epistemic utility theory). Pettigrew (2019a,b) likewise starts with the goal of maximizing accuracy and argues for linear pooling. Staffel (2015) responds.

2. See Easwaran et al. (2016) for a good discussion of the complications.

3. Though as Dietrich and List show, another similar method will be appropriate to cases where the group members have private information.

4. Easwaran et al. give a simple updating rule that fulfills this property (and some other desiderata) in cases where one updates on a reliable peer. On the other hand, Elkin and Wheeler (2016) argue that aggregation should not go outside the range of original credences, and use imprecise probabilities to develop a reasonable averaging principle that respects this.

5. In addition, Smaldino and McElreath (2016) use a compelling model to show how credit rewards can lead to the spread of “bad” methods—those methods that tend to yield false positive results.

6. We have seen some answers to these questions. To give a few more examples, Bruner (2013) argues for incentivizing scientists to police their peers by punishing fraud. Romero (2018) argues for a system where some researchers are devoted only to replicating results so that their credit incentives come apart from those driving novel findings. Zollman (2018) argues that credit motivated scientists will spend more time on science and less on leisure.

7. As O’Connor and Weatherall (2019) point out, this may help explain episodes from the history of science where real learners rejected well-supported theories, such as the famous Semmelweis case where Viennese physicians refused to take-up handwashing despite ample evidence that it prevents patient death during childbirth.

8. Bramson et al. (2017) give a nice analysis of what polarization means in such cases.

9. These findings are in keeping with a larger modeling tradition exploring polarization, but focusing less on beliefs about matters of fact, and more on opinion dynamics such as the influential Hegselmann and Krause (2002) bounded confidence model.

10. For more on the role of diversity across many of the models discussed here see Muldoon (2013).

11. Avin (2018, 2019) uses the epistemic landscape model as a framework for exploring the influence of funding choices on scientific progress. Grim et al. (2013) consider networked agents on these landscapes and derive a result familiar from Zollman (2007)—that less connected researchers do better in exploring the space.

Copyright © 2019 by
Alvin Goldman <>
Cailin O’Connor <>

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