Contemporary virtue epistemology (hereafter ‘VE’) is a diverse collection of approaches to epistemology. At least two central tendencies are discernible among the approaches. First, they view epistemology as a normative discipline. Second, they view intellectual agents and communities as the primary focus of epistemic evaluation, with a focus on the intellectual virtues and vices embodied in and expressed by these agents and communities.
This entry introduces many of the most important results of the contemporary VE research program. These include novel attempts to resolve longstanding disputes, solve perennial problems, grapple with novel challenges, and expand epistemology’s horizons. In the process, it reveals the diversity within VE. Beyond sharing the two unifying commitments mentioned above, its practitioners diverge over the nature of intellectual virtues, which questions to ask, and which methods to use.
It will be helpful to note some terminology before proceeding. First, we use ‘cognitive’, ‘epistemic’ and ‘intellectual’ synonymously. Second, we often use ‘normative’ broadly to include not only norms and rules, but also duties and values. Finally, ‘practitioners’ names contemporary virtue epistemologists.
- 1. Introduction
- 2. Precursors and Contemporary Origins
- 3. The Nature of Intellectual Virtues
- 4. Conventional and Alternative
- 5. Knowledge
- 6. Epistemic Value
- 7. Credit
- 8. Contextualism
- 9. Epistemic Situationism
- 10. Expanding Horizons
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
At least two central tendencies are evident in VE taken as a whole.
One central tendency is to view epistemology as a normative discipline. This implies at least two things. First, it signals opposition to Quine’s radical suggestion in “Epistemology Naturalized” that philosophers should abandon questions about what’s reasonable to believe, and should restrict themselves to questions about cognitive psychology instead. Virtue epistemologists reject this proposal (McDowell 1994: 133; Sosa 1991: 100–105; Zagzebski 1996: 334–8). Nevertheless, they are generally receptive to empirical data from psychology, history, and other fields (e.g., Greco 2001; Roberts & Wood 2007: Part II; Sosa 1991: 105–6; Zagzebski 1996: 336–7). Second, it implies that epistemologists should focus their efforts on understanding epistemic norms, value, and evaluation. This is a defining feature of the field. Accordingly, VE features centrally in the recent “value turn” in epistemology (Riggs 2006; Pritchard 2007).
For some practitioners, however, the idea that epistemology is a normative discipline means more than this. For example, some think that epistemological terms (or concepts) like ‘knowledge’, ‘evidence’, ‘justification’, ‘duty’ and ‘virtue’ cannot be adequately defined or fully explained in purely non-normative vocabulary (e.g., Axtell & Carter 2008; McDowell 1994; Roberts & Wood 2007; and Zagzebski 1996, 2009), although others disagree (e.g., Goldman 1992; Greco 1999, 2009; Sosa 2007).
Others think that epistemology should aim to promote intellectual well being. Perhaps an epistemological theory should be “practically useful” in helping us recognize when we do or don’t know something (Zagzebski 1996: 267), or help us overcome “anxieties” due to defective presuppositions about knowledge (McDowell 1994: xi; Pritchard 2016a). Perhaps epistemology should help us appreciate and respond to forms of “epistemic injustice” (Fricker 2007). Perhaps epistemology should inspire us with portraits of intellectual virtues, thereby promoting cultural reformation and intellectual flourishing (Roberts & Wood 2007). Perhaps epistemology should examine intellectual vices and other defects to tell cautionary tales of what not to do and how not to be (Alfano 2015, Battaly 2014, Cassam 2016). Or perhaps practitioners should help redesign educational institutions to help students cultivate intellectual virtues (e.g., the Intellectual Virtues Academy—see Other Internet Resources).
The other central tendency is to view intellectual agents and communities as the primary source of epistemic value and the primary focus of epistemic evaluation. This focus includes not only individuals and groups, but also the traits constitutive of their cognitive character.
This second commitment of VE is often accompanied by a “direction of analysis” characteristic of virtue theories in both ethics and epistemology. Virtue ethics explains an action’s moral properties in terms of the agent’s properties, such as whether it results from kindness or spite. VE explains a cognitive performance’s normative properties in terms of the cognizer’s properties, such as whether a belief results from hastiness or excellent eyesight, or whether an inquiry manifests carelessness or discrimination. For virtue ethics the relevant properties are moral traits, and for VE intellectual traits.
Beyond those basic central tendencies, we find great diversity in the field. Four main issues divide practitioners. The first concerns the nature and scope of intellectual virtues (section 3). The second concerns what questions to address (section 4). The third concerns what methods to use (sections 4 and 9). The fourth concerns the relations among epistemic virtue, knowledge, and epistemic credit (sections 5, 6, and 7).
2. Precursors and Contemporary Origins
Practitioners draw inspiration from many important historical philosophers, including Plato (Zagzebski 1996: 139), Aristotle (Greco 2002: 311; Sosa 2009: 187; Zagzebski 1996, passim), Aquinas (Roberts & Wood 2007: 69–70; Zagzebski 1996, passim), Descartes (Sosa 2007: ch. 6), Kierkegaard (Roberts & Wood 2007: 29–30), Nietzsche (Alfano 2013a), and Peirce (Hookway 2000). Hints of VE can also be found in Hume (1748), Reid (1785), Russell (1948), and Sellars (1956). Islamic philosophy offers precursors to contemporary virtue epistemology, such as discussions of the epistemic value of imagination in al-Kindī and al-Fārābī (Adamson 2015) and Avicenna’s sophisticated social epistemology of reliable and unreliable testimony (Black 2013).
Contemporary virtue epistemology, conceived as such and as a distinctive movement within epistemology, began with Ernest Sosa’s work in the early 1980s (see the papers collected in Sosa 1991). Sosa applied his “virtue perspectivism” to adjudicate disputes in contemporary epistemology, such as the disputes between foundationalists and coherentists, and between internalists and externalists (for a review, see Turri 2013). Other important early contributions were by Lorraine Code (1987), James Montmarquet (1993), Jonathan Kvanvig (1992), and Linda Zagzebski (1996), who argued that Sosa’s approach, while promising, did not go far enough in identifying the central role of virtues, such as responsibility or conscientiousness, the social and developmental bases of virtues, or important relationships between intellectual and ethical virtues. Other approaches attempt to blend features of Sosa’s initial approach and these alternatives (e.g., Greco 1993). It has also been argued that early versions of reliabilism are best interpreted as a form of VE (Kvanvig 1992).
3. The Nature of Intellectual Virtues
Start with an uncontroversial, but still informative, characterization of intellectual virtues: intellectual virtues are characteristics that promote intellectual flourishing, or which make for an excellent cognizer.
VE is standardly divided up into virtue responsibilists and virtue reliabilists (e.g., Axtell 1997). According to this taxonomy, the two camps differ over how to characterize intellectual virtue. Virtue reliabilists (e.g., Goldman, Greco, and Sosa) understand intellectual virtues to include faculties such as perception, intuition, and memory; call these ‘faculty-virtues’. Their view is best understood as a descendant from earlier externalist epistemologies such as simple process reliabilism. Virtue responsibilists (e.g., Battaly, Code, Hookway, Montmarquet, and Zagzebski) understand intellectual virtues to include cultivated character traits such as conscientiousness and open-mindedness; call these ‘trait-virtues’. Their approach is broadly aligned with internalist sympathies in epistemology and deeply concerned with cognition’s ethical dimensions and implications.
This reliabilist/responsibilist taxonomy has attracted criticism (Fleisher 2017). First, it is not clear why practitioners need to choose between faculty-virtues and trait-virtues. At first glance, excellent perception, good memory, open-mindedness, and intellectual humility all seem equally good candidates to manifest excellence or promote flourishing. Arguments over which are the “real” virtues can seem pointless and counterproductive, since many are the ways of excelling and flourishing intellectually (Battaly 2015). Second, and closely related, it is plausible that a complete epistemology must feature both faculty-virtues and trait-virtues. Faculty-virtues seem indispensable in accounting for knowledge of the past and the world around us. Trait-virtues could be required to account for the full range of richer intellectual achievements, such as understanding and wisdom, which might presuppose knowledge but which arguably also exceed it (compare Zagzebski 2001: 248–9). Baehr (2006b) argues that virtue reliabilists should not neglect trait-virtues, because these are necessary to explain some cases of knowledge. For instance, intellectual courage and perseverance, not just good memory and perception, might figure centrally in an explanation of how a knower arrived at the truth.
Battaly (2008: 7) provides a helpful list of questions to guide inquiry into the nature of intellectual virtue:
There are five primary questions that analyses of the intellectual virtues should address. First, are the virtues natural or acquired? Second, does virtue possession require the agent to possess acquired intellectually virtuous motivations or dispositions to perform intellectually virtuous actions? Third, are the virtues distinct from skills? Fourth, are the virtues reliable? Finally, fifth, what makes the virtues valuable? Are they instrumentally, constitutively, or intrinsically valuable?
Jason Kawall (2002) calls attention to a set of virtues neglected by virtue epistemologists of all stripes. Virtue ethicists have long recognized a difference between self-regarding moral virtues, such as prudence and courage, and other-regarding virtues, such as benevolence and compassion. And they have recognized the importance of both sorts. But virtue epistemologists have overlooked a similar distinction among intellectual virtues. They focus on self-regarding intellectual virtues, such as perceptual acuity or intellectual courage, which promote the individual’s own intellectual flourishing. They neglect other-regarding intellectual virtues, such as honesty and integrity, which promote other people’s acquisition of knowledge and intellectual flourishing. More complex other-regarding virtues would involve a willingness and ability to articulately communicate one’s reasons to others, or the creativity to discover knowledge new to a community. “An epistemic agent who focuses exclusively on self-regarding epistemic virtues”, Kawall (2002: 260) writes, “could be a deficient epistemic agent to the extent that she is a member of a community”. Such attention to the cognitive agent’s epistemic community also informs research on epistemic justice and injustice (Fricker 2007, Sherman 2016) and recent explorations of embedded, scaffolded, and extended intellectual character (Alfano 2013b; Alfano & Skorburg 2017, 2018), topics to which we return in section 9.
4. Conventional and Alternative
Disagreements about the nature of virtue are closely connected to another pair of disagreements. These disagreements concern which questions and methods should feature in epistemology.
Many practitioners deploy VE’s resources to address standard questions in standard ways. (Here ‘standard’ means ‘standard for contemporary Anglophone epistemology’.) They offer analyses or definitions of knowledge and justification. They try to solve puzzles and problems, such as the Gettier problem and the lottery problem. They construct counterexamples. They confront the skeptic. This is conventional VE.
Other practitioners address alternative questions or use alternative methods. They shun definitions and tidy analyses. They focus on topics other than knowledge and justification, such as deliberation, inquiry, understanding, wisdom, profiles of individual virtues and vices, examinations of the relations among distinct virtues and vices, and the social, ethical, and political dimensions of cognition involved in misinformation, disinformation, propaganda, and so on. They ignore the radical skeptic. They mine literature and drama for inspiration and examples. This is alternative VE.
An example of conventional VE is Ernest Sosa’s (1991: section IV) attempt to define knowledge as true belief held “out of intellectual virtue”, or to settle the dispute among internalists and externalists about epistemic justification (Sosa 2003: ch. 9), providing detailed definitions and carefully trying to disarm counterexamples. Another prime example of conventional VE is Linda Zagzebski’s (1996: part III) definition of knowledge and attempted resolution of the Gettier problem.
An example of alternative VE is Robert Roberts and Jay Wood’s (2007) view that conventional questions and methods have eviscerated epistemology, and that we should instead aim to reform intellectual culture by sketching subtle and nuanced pictures (“maps”) of the intellectual virtues, drawing freely on literature, history, and scripture. Another example is Jonathan Kvanvig’s (1992) argument that VE will flourish only by relinquishing the Cartesian epistemological project and instead focusing on the role that virtues play in training and education. Others have argued that the kernel of truth in VE is best developed in an interdisciplinary context drawing on the methods and findings of the cognitive, social, and life sciences (Turri 2015a).
The foregoing does not imply that VE is a house divided against itself. On the contrary, we find a spectrum of conventional and alternative approaches rather than a simple dichotomy, and among various practitioners we often see a “live and let live” attitude. Thus while some practitioners of alternative VE counsel a radical, wholesale break from conventional questions or methods, most either blend conventional and alternative elements (e.g., Zagzebski, Riggs, Battaly), or see value in conventional VE (e.g., Baehr 2011). Conventional practitioners likewise recognize that “alternative” questions are not only important but as old as philosophy itself, such as questions about wisdom and the social transmission of knowledge. The same goes for the “alternative” methods of consulting literature, as Plato looked to Homer, approaching philosophical questions with scientific tools, as Aristotle inquired into the biological and social bases of cognition, and referring to scripture, as the Islamic philosophical tradition did in relation to the norms of testimony.
Many virtue epistemologists agree that, in very general terms, knowledge is non-accidentally true belief. Different theories spell out “non-accidentally” differently, but among many practitioners a common understanding of that key term seems to have emerged. Simply put, to know is to believe the truth because of your intellectual virtue (e.g., Sosa 1991: 277; Zagzebski 1996: 271–2, Riggs 2002: 93–4; Lehrer 2000: 223; Greco 2003: 111; Turri 2011). In recent years, some practitioners influenced by the knowledge-first approach have suggested reversing the direction of analysis by starting with competences to know and then understanding belief as potentially-defective knowledge (Miracchi 2015, Kelp 2017). Either way, practitioners hold that there is a tight connection between knowledge, on the one hand, and the exercise of intellectual virtue or competence, on the other hand.
One benefit claimed for this basic approach is that it provides an intuitive account of why knowledge is inconsistent with luck of a certain sort. For instance, some begin with the intuitive thought that you don’t know something if it is “largely a matter of luck” that you believe it (Riggs 2007). But why does knowledge preclude luck in this way? In the first detailed attempt to answer this question, Wayne Riggs says that the opposition between knowledge and luck is best explained by the hypothesis that knowledge is “an achievement for which the knower deserves credit” (Riggs 2009: 341). And knowers deserve credit because they believe the truth because of their virtue (Greco 2003). In response, some have argued that luck and virtue are orthogonal dimensions of epistemic evaluation (Pritchard 2012), and that knowledge must be due to virtue more than luck, as opposed to virtue rather than luck (Carter 2014).
A related benefit of the basic approach is that, in the eyes of many practitioners, it solves the Gettier problem. Gettier cases follow a recipe. Start with a belief sufficiently justified to meet the justification condition for knowledge. Then add an element of bad luck that would normally prevent the justified belief from being true. Lastly add a dose of good luck that “cancels out the bad”, so the belief ends up true anyhow. It has proven difficult to explain why this “double luck” prevents knowledge (Zagzebski 1996).
Here is a Gettier case (adapted from Zagzebski 1996: 285–6). Mary enters the house and looks into the living room. A familiar appearance greets her from her husband’s chair. She thinks, “My husband is sitting in the living room”, and then walks into the den. But Mary misidentified the man in the chair. It is not her husband, but his brother, whom she had no reason to believe was even in the country. However, her husband was seated along the opposite wall of the living room, out of Mary’s sight, dozing in a different chair.
The VE solution to the Gettier problem is that knowledge requires you to believe the truth “because of” your intellectual virtues, but Gettier subjects do not believe the truth because of their virtues, so they do not know (Zagzebski 1996: 285 ff; Greco 2003; Sosa 2007: ch. 5; Turri 2011). Some critics complain that this view is uninformative because we lack an adequate understanding of what it is to believe “because of” or “out of” virtue (e.g., Roberts & Wood 2007). Other critics argue that the basic approach still suffers from counterexamples (e.g., Baehr 2006a; Church 2013).
Recently, leading practitioners have touted the fact that VE places knowledge in a familiar pattern. On this approach, epistemic evaluation is just another example of the basic way in which we evaluate all behavior, performances, and attempts. The most widely discussed articulation of this view is Ernest Sosa’s AAA–model of performance assessment (Sosa 2007: 22–3; for related but subtly different approaches, see Greco 2003 & 2010 and Morton 2013). On this approach, we can assess performances for accuracy, adroitness, and aptness. Accurate performances achieve their aim, adroit performances manifest competence, and apt performances are accurate because adroit. This AAA-model applies to all conduct and performances with an aim, whether intentional (as in ballet) or unintentional (as with a heartbeat).
Here’s how the model applies in epistemology. (A more complicated model has lately been proposed, which takes into account the agent’s own risk-assessment and decisions about when and how to perform; see Sosa 2015.) Belief-formation is a psychological performance with an aim. For beliefs, accuracy is identified with truth, adroitness with manifesting intellectual competence, and aptness with being “true because competent”. Apt belief, then, is belief that is true because competent. A competence, in turn,
is a disposition, one with a basis resident in the competent agent, one that would in appropriately normal conditions ensure (or make highly likely) the success of any relevant performance issued by it. (Sosa 2007: 29)
Knowledge is then identified with apt belief, which is just “a special case” of “creditable, apt performance”, a status common across the gamut of human activities.
Consider the performance of an archer who hits a bullseye because she shoots competently. Her shot is apt, and her bullseye an achievement. It’s possible that she might easily have missed. She might have luckily avoided being drugged before the competition, which would have impaired her competence. Or a strong gust of wind, which would have ruined her shot, might have just been avoided by a rare confluence of local meteorological conditions. In any of these ways, her performance might have been apt even though there are nearby possible worlds in which she does not hit the bullseye. Sosa (2007: 31) says that knowledge is also like this: in some cases you might believe aptly, and thus know, even though you might easily have been wrong. More recently, Sosa (2020) has also argued that suspension of judgment can be analyzed in a similar way: when someone sets out on an inquiry as to whether p, she might conclude that the evidence is inconclusive, leading her to suspend judgment as to whether p. Such suspension is itself a manifestation of the competence to recognize that one is not in a position to know whether p.
Some have argued that Sosa’s AAA-model is open to counterexamples. For example, Duncan Pritchard (2009a), echoing Jennifer Lackey’s (2007) broader criticism of credit views of knowledge, argues that Sosa’s view gives the wrong verdict in the fake-barn thought experiment (originally due to Carl Ginet; see Goldman 1976: 772–3). In this thought experiment, Henry and his son are driving through the country. Henry pulls over to stretch his legs, and while doing so regales his son with a list of currently visible roadside items. “That’s a tractor. That’s a combine. That’s a horse. That’s a silo. And that’s a fine barn”, he adds, pointing to the nearby roadside barn. But unbeknownst to them, the locals recently secretly replaced nearly every barn in the country with fake barns (they’re in “Fake Barn Country”). Henry happens to see the one real barn in the whole county. Had he instead set eyes on any of the numerous nearby fakes, he would have falsely believed it was a barn. Henry has a true belief because of his perceptual acuity, Pritchard says, so it counts as apt and Sosa’s view entails that Henry knows. But, Pritchard claims, it’s obvious that Henry doesn’t know. Pritchard (2008a: 445) raises an exactly similar objection to Greco’s theory of knowledge.
Criticism on this point has come on two fronts. On the one hand, some epistemologists have argued that (contra Pritchard) fake-barn-style cases, which feature environmental luck, are not cases of apt belief or cognitive achievement (e.g., Jarvis 2013; Littlejohn 2014). On the other hand, some reject the claim that the agent doesn’t know in this case or structurally similar ones (e.g., Lycan 2006; Turri 2011). Moreover, recent experimental work has shown that non-philosophers overwhelmingly view fake-barn cases, and structurally similar ones, as instances of knowledge (Colaço, Buckwalter, Stich & Machery 2014; Turri, Buckwalter, & Blouw 2014; Turri 2016c).
6. Epistemic Value
What is the nature of epistemic value and how is knowledge distinctively epistemically valuable? In particular, why is knowledge more valuable than mere true belief, especially if true belief serves just as well for guiding action? Such questions have occupied center stage in recent epistemology and date back at least to Plato’s Meno (see Pritchard & Turri 2014 for an overview). Many virtue epistemologists think that their approach is uniquely suited to provide satisfying answers to these questions.
Zagzebski (2003) argues that an adequate account of knowledge must explain why knowledge is more valuable than mere true belief. This is known as “the value problem”. VE is well positioned to solve it, she argues, because the correct solution must help us see how knowledge possesses value independently of anything “external” to its production. A good cup of coffee is not better simply because it was made by a good, reliable coffee machine. Likewise a true belief is not made better simply because it was formed by a reliable method. The added value must come from something “internal” to it. The solution is to view knowledge as a credit-worthy state of the agent, produced or sustained by her virtuous agency.
Greco (2009, 2012) and Sosa (2003, 2007, 2020) contend that knowledge is a kind of achievement—intellectual success through ability, for which the knower is creditable. And in general, success through virtue is more valuable than mere success, especially accidental success. So knowledge is more valuable than true belief. Riggs (2009: 342; see also Riggs 1998 & 2002) puts the point succinctly:
The reason that credit-worthiness views of knowledge can solve the value problem is that they introduce a new vector of value: credit…. If knowing that p always entails that one deserves credit for having achieved a true belief, then this introduces something besides true belief that is valuable
Carter, Jarvis and Rubin (2015) propose a taxonomy of varieties of cognitive achievement based on the relative weights given to achieving success versus avoiding failure; for example, having a suspicion that p is a cognitive attempt that puts more weight on achieving success, whereas Cartesian certainty that p is a cognitive attempt to puts almost exclusive weight on avoiding failure.
Aristotle made a related distinction between achieving some end by luck or accident, and achieving it through the exercise of one’s abilities or virtues. It is only the latter kind of action, he argues, that is both intrinsically valuable and constitutive of human flourishing. “Human good”, he writes, “turns out to be activity of soul exhibiting excellence” (Nicomachean Ethics 1098a15–16; translation by W. D. Ross 1984, p. 1735). The successful exercise of one’s intellectual virtues is both intrinsically good and constitutive of human flourishing. This pertains to moral and intellectual virtue. Assuming the basic VE line on knowledge is correct, we get a straightforward solution to the value problem.
As we reviewed in the sections on knowledge and epistemic value, a very popular thesis in VE is that knowledge is a credit-worthy state of the agent. You know only if you deserve credit for believing the truth. Call this “the credit thesis”. The credit thesis helps explain knowledge’s value. It also features prominently in attempts to resolve the Gettier problem and explain epistemic luck.
Jennifer Lackey (2007) argues that we do not deserve credit for everything we know, so (a) standard VE definitions of knowledge are false, and (b) VE is not ideally suited to explain knowledge’s value. She presents counterexamples involving testimonial and innate knowledge. On Lackey’s understanding, to earn credit for a true belief, your “reliable cognitive faculties” must be “the most salient part” of the explanation for why you believe the truth (Lackey 2007: 351; see also Greco 2003: 130). Cognitive faculties cannot be merely necessary or important parts of the explanation, she argues, because then Gettier problems would immediately arise (Lackey 2007: 347–8).
Here is a close variant of one of Lackey’s cases (Lackey 2007: 352), which she later (2009) calls “Chicago Visitor”: Morris just arrived at the Chicago train station and wants directions to the Sears Tower. He approaches the first adult passerby he sees (“Passerby”) and asks for directions. Passerby knows the city extraordinarily well and articulately offers impeccable directions: the tower is two blocks east of the station. On that basis Morris unhesitatingly forms the corresponding true belief.
Lackey reasons as follows. Morris clearly gains knowledge of the tower’s location. But Passerby’s contribution is most salient in explaining why Morris learned the truth. Morris’s contribution to the process is minimal. Morris’s reliable cognitive faculties are not the most salient part of the explanation for why he believes the truth. So he doesn’t deserve credit. But he knows nonetheless. So the credit thesis is false.
Lackey also asks us to consider “the possibility of natural innate knowledge” (Lackey 2007: 358). Surely such knowledge is possible, so an adequate theory of knowledge must accommodate the possibility. But “it seems highly unlikely that a subject would deserve credit for such knowledge”. For the belief’s origin, “such as natural selection or some other evolutionary mechanism”, would be the most salient part of the explanation for why you had the true belief. So the credit thesis is false.
Sosa (2007: 95) responds that Morris still deserves “partial credit”, even though his success in believing the truth is primarily attributable to a “socially seated competence” embodied in the people involved in the testimonial chain. This suffices for his belief to be apt, and thus count as knowledge. Partial credit grounded in apt performance is a perfectly general phenomenon, as common in team sport as in testimony.
The quarterback’s pass derives from his competence, but its great success, its being a touchdown pass manifests more fully the team’s competence.
Riggs (2009: 209) responds that it isn’t clear that Morris does know where the tower is. We aren’t compelled to count as knowledge every “casual, unreflective acceptance of testimony” (Riggs 2009: 214). And notice that if we continue the story by having someone soon afterward ask Morris where the tower is, he’d be out of line to simply assert, “It’s two blocks that way”, which suggests that he doesn’t really know after all (Riggs 2009: 210–11). Beyond that, Riggs distinguishes two senses of credit: praiseworthiness and attributability. Knowledge requires that your true belief be attributable to you as an agent, but not that you be praiseworthy for it. Riggs claims that Lackey’s objections wrongly suppose that defenders of the credit thesis think that knowledge requires praiseworthiness, are too closely tied to Greco’s particular account of credit (with its emphasis on explanatory salience), and also overlook the possibility of “group effort” in achievements.
Greco (2007) responds that Morris still deserves credit for learning the truth. Credit for cooperative success can accrue to multiple individuals, even ones who contribute less than others. It generally requires only that your “efforts and abilities” be “appropriately involved” in the success (Greco 2007: 65). Further developing this idea, Greco points out that intellectual virtues are often social virtues, exercised in social environments. For example, various social-cognitive abilities are involved in assessments of speaker competence and sincerity, and so important for the reception of testimony. A different kind of response proposes that knowledge-producing virtues are often seated not in the individual knower, but in the broader intellectual community. On such occasion, knowledge continues to be understood as “produced from virtue,” but the virtues in questions are now community virtues rather than those of an individual knower. By far, the most common analogy for such approaches is teamwork in sports (Green 2017). Let us distinguish between a) several individuals constituting a group agent, which agent is in turn the locus of group intentions and actions, and b) several individual agents doing something together. The latter kind of cooperation is often referred to as “shared” or “joint” agency, as distinguished from group agency. Greco (2020) uses a joint agency framework to understand testimonial knowledge. The guiding idea is that the transmission of knowledge from speaker to hearer involves the kind of cooperation that constitutes joint agency. On this view, the resulting testimonial knowledge is not attributable to the competent individual agency of the hearer, but rather to the competent joint agency of speaker and hearer acting together. In that sense, transmitted knowledge is understood as a joint achievement rather than an individual achievement.
Greco’s account of knowledge transmission accommodates a strong notion of social epistemic dependence. This is because joint agency in general involves dependence among the cooperating actors to “do their part” in the cooperative activity. Moreover, as in other cases of joint action, the hearer has no guarantee that the speaker will prove dependable, no guarantee that the speaker will play their part well. Finally, we may note that much of the forgoing discussion about knowledge transmission can be extended to knowledge generation as well. That is, the production of knowledge can sometimes involve the kind of intentional cooperation that characterizes joint activity. For example, we can conceive of a research team that cooperates in an investigation that is too complicated for any one person to undertake alone. If that cooperation is structured in the right way, and if the knowledge so produced is attributable to that cooperation, we will have cases in which the production of knowledge is a joint achievement.
Lackey (2009) replies to Greco, Riggs, and Sosa. Her response is subtle and multidimensional, but its centerpiece is a dilemma for VE’s credit thesis. Either VE’s notion of creditworthiness is substantial enough to rule out credit for Gettier subjects or it isn’t. If it is substantial enough, then it rules out too much testimonial knowledge, in which case it fails. If it isn’t substantial enough, then it suffers refutation by Gettier cases, in which case it still fails. Either way, it fails. (Compare Kvanvig 2003; Pritchard 2008b.)
According to a widely debated view in recent epistemology, contextualism, the truth conditions for knowledge attributions such as “S knows that P” are context-sensitive, due to the context-sensitivity of the cognitive verb “know” (for a review, see Rysiew 2016). Contextualists disagree over how to model the alleged context-sensitivity. Some say “know” is an indexical possessing a context-invariant character that is a function from contexts to contents (Cohen 2013). Others claim that “knows” is a vague predicate in need of contextual supplementation to predicate a determinate property (Heller 1999). Critics argue that leading contextualist proposals are ad hoc or unmotivated because we lack independent evidence that “knows” is context-sensitive in these ways (Stanley 2005), or because behavioral experiments demonstrate that people do not evaluate knowledge attributions in the way that leading contextualists have assumed or predicted (Turri 2016b).
Greco (2004, 2008) defends a version of contextualism, what he calls “virtue contextualism”. Virtue contextualism emerges from the basic idea, mentioned above, that to know is to believe the truth because of your intellectual virtue or ability. When we say “because of your intellectual virtue or ability”, how are we to understand “because”? In general, explanatory talk is context-sensitive. It is context-sensitive in two primary ways. First, abnormal features tend to be explanatorily salient. There’s a panic in a Manhattan apartment building, which happens very soon after a tiger wanders into the lobby. We have no trouble identifying the panic’s cause: the tiger. That’s true even though the tiger’s presence isn’t individually sufficient to cause a panic—people must also fear tigers, but they normally do. Second, our interests and purposes single out certain features as especially relevant. We tend to focus on things we can control. If a student asks a teacher why he failed the exam, the teacher might point out that he rarely came to class and didn’t pick up a study guide until the morning of the exam.
If explanatory talk is generally context-sensitive, and knowledge-talk is just a species of explanatory-talk, then perhaps knowledge-attributions are too. By changing what seems normal or by changing our interests and purpose, we might go from a context where saying “S believes the truth because of her virtue” expresses a truth, to a context where uttering the same words expresses a falsehood. And since saying “S knows” is tantamount to saying “S believes the truth because of her virtue”, it follows that knowledge-attributions are likewise context-sensitive. By deriving its account of context-sensitivity from the general character of explanatory-talk, virtue contextualism might avoid the charge that it is unmotivated and ad hoc. However, further work is required to test whether the theory fits with people’s actual linguistic behavior.
9. Epistemic Situationism
As mentioned above, practitioners of all stripes tend to recognize the importance of empirical findings about cognition and inquiry. There are multiple reasons for this sensitivity beyond a predilection for naturalism. First, even though VE is a normative discipline as discussed above, some practitioners accept a version of the ought implies can principle. To the extent that empirical research in psychology, cognitive science, and other fields delineates the limits of human cognition, such research constrains the inquiries, dispositions, and states that can be epistemically demanded of people. More ambitiously, one might think that extremely demanding epistemic norms are sometimes inappropriate even if, strictly speaking, they can be satisfied. Second, even if one rejects ought implies can, an alleged strength of VE is its ability to respond successfully to skepticism. However, if the dispositions practitioners assume to exist are never or rarely embodied by humans, then skepticism looms. Note that this argument goes through even if people could acquire and manifest epistemic virtues, just so long as they in fact don’t. Third, empirical research may help to solve the generality problem. Any episode of acquiring a belief can be classed under an indefinite number of headings; some such classifications individuate highly reliable dispositions, while others individuate less reliable dispositions. When I infer from the fact that every emerald I’ve examined is green that every emerald (whether examined or not) is green, should my inference be described as inductive generalization or inductive generalization employing projectable predicates? Though the generality problem was first articulated as a hurdle for process reliabilism (Pollock 1984), Goldman (1986: 50) and Zagzebski (1996: 300) recognize that VE faces its own version of the problem. Should epistemic virtues be coarsely individuated, so that open-mindedness makes the cut, or should they be finely individuated, so that open-mindedness towards friends while in a good mood makes the cut? Zagzebski (1996: 309) argues that this question should be answered empirically, with a preference for coarse individuation. Finally, practitioners who favor an ameliorative or educative approach to VE have an additional reason to attend to empirical findings, because these may reveal common cognitive defects that could potentially be set right, as well as suggesting more promising prospects for cognitive and epistemic training and development than those employed in contemporary pedagogy.
These considerations notwithstanding, the cognitive sciences might pose a threat to VE. After all, to the extent that people’s cognitive dispositions do not qualify as virtues (because they are unreliable or irresponsible, for example), the true beliefs they produce will not count as knowledge (Alfano 2012). Recall that practitioners are largely in agreement that knowledge is true belief that manifests virtue. If empirical studies suggest that people’s beliefs usually manifest cognitive defects or incompetence, then VE would be led to the conclusion that most of our true beliefs don’t count as knowledge. This challenge to VE is analogous to the “situationist challenge” to virtue ethics (Doris 1998, 2002; Flanagan 1991; Harman 1999; for a recent articulation, see Merritt, Doris, and Harman 2010).
Mark Alfano (2012: 234) first framed the problem as an inconsistent triad: anti-skepticism, according to which almost all humans have quite a bit of knowledge, epistemic situationism, according to which most people’s intellectual dispositions are not virtues because they are highly sensitive to seemingly trivial and epistemically irrelevant situational factors, and VE. Regarding the reliability of people’s inferential dispositions, Alfano (2014, 2013b: chapter 6) pointed to a robust series of findings related to the unreliability of heuristics such as the availability heuristic, the representativeness heuristic, and the recognition heuristic. Regarding responsibilist VE, Alfano (2012, 2013b: chapter 5) emphasized findings on the substantial influence of seemingly trivial but epistemically irrelevant factors on belief-formation. These factors include mood elevators, mood depressors, and social cues of unanimous versus non-unanimous agreement. Subsequently, while a few philosophers have twisted the empirical knife further (e.g., Olin and Doris 2014; Blumenthal-Barby 2015), at least four lines of response have emerged.
The first main response to epistemic situationism is to deny that there is a problem, referring to more heartening empirical evidence. For example, Fairweather and Montemayor (2014) argue that heuristics—instead of being unreliable mental shortcuts—are more reliable than traditional inferential patterns that people tend to misuse. In a similar vein, Samuelson and Church (2015) argue that heuristics, when properly monitored and interrupted by top-down effortful cognition, can be reliable, and that effective exercise of such top-down control constitutes a version of the responsibilist virtue of intellectual humility. And King (2014a) defends responsibilism by pointing out that, at least on Zagzebski’s (1996) version of VE, knowledge needn’t manifest virtue but instead needs only to arise from the sort of motivated inquiry that a virtuous person would engage in.
The second main response is more conciliatory, suggesting that VE should focus less on achieving virtue and more on avoiding vice. Roberts and West (2015) contend that research on heuristics and related cognitive biases shows that humans are best understood as manifesting various natural epistemic defects. The work of becoming a good-enough cognizer is then a matter of cultivating ways of avoiding or overcoming these defects. They suggest that self-vigilance and increased intellectual vitality are two key ways to handle these defects, making their view somewhat similar to that of Samuelson and Church (2015). Cassam (2016) argues that the extensive literature on conspiracy theories and conspiratorial thinking shows that people are prone to various intellectual vices, understood as character traits that impede effective and responsible inquiry. Understanding human inquiry and how it is liable to go wrong thus requires a study of intellectual vices.
This suggestion is in line with the third main response to epistemic situationism, which is to somehow offload some of the cognitive agency traditionally required of the individual onto the material, social, or political environment. For instance, Pritchard (2014) argues for a more modest version of VE that countenances the essential role of the environment in the acquisition of knowledge. Someone who is luckily placed in their material, social, and political environment will end up with more knowledge despite less exercise of cognitive agency than someone who is unluckily placed, even if the latter exercises heroic levels of cognitive agency. Epistemic situationism is thus reinterpreted as evidence for our inescapable epistemic dependence on circumstance. Alfano (2013b, 2016a) and Alfano and Skorburg (2017, 2018) connect the challenge of epistemic situationism with the literature in the philosophy of mind on embedded, scaffolded, and extended cognition inspired by Clark and Chalmers (1998; see also Sterelny 2010). The basic idea here is that when a cognitive agent is suitably integrated with natural objects, artifacts, and other agents in their material, social, and political environment, those externalia may be partially constitutive of the agent’s cognitive dispositions. Embedded cognition occurs in a mostly-stable natural environment; scaffolded cognition occurs in a mostly-stable artificial environment; outright extended cognition occurs in a dynamically-reactive environment. Within this taxonomy, Alfano and Skorburg (2018) argue that it is possible to improve the reliability of the recognition heuristic not by developing further internal cognitive resources (as Samuelson & Church 2015 and Roberts & West 2015 would have it) but by better structuring the informational ecosystem in which people find themselves—a suggestion that harmonizes with recent work on the epistemology of information and communication technologies such as the Internet (Bozdag & van den Hoven 2015; Lynch 2016) and library sciences (Fallis & Whitcomb 2009). Alfano (2016a) and Alfano and Skorburg (2017) argue that, in some cases, pairs of agents mutually constitute each other’s character by engaging in dynamic interactions with interlocking virtues. The literature on embedded, scaffolded, and extended epistemic virtues is a natural development of VE’s emphasis on intellectual agents and communities.
A fourth response is that there is no evidence that knowledge requires the sort of dispositions that epistemic situationism challenges and, moreover, that there is theoretical and empirical evidence that knowledge does not require such dispositions (Turri 2017). More specifically, according to this line of criticism, no serious argument has ever been provided that knowledge requires reliability; instead, philosophers have relied on weak explanatory arguments or, more commonly, simply assumed that knowledge requires reliability (Turri 2016a). Moreover, if knowledge is an achievement, then we should expect it to not require reliability, because no other achievement requires reliability (Turri 2015c). Additionally, recent empirical studies have shown that the ordinary concept of knowledge—which is the concept practitioners have claimed to be interested in—does not make reliability a necessary condition of knowledge (Turri 2016a). For instance, in cases of perceptual and memorial beliefs, people attribute knowledge at similarly high rates (~80%) regardless of whether the agent gets it right ten-percent of the time or ninety-percent of the time. Along with this line of criticism, researchers have offered an alternative theory of knowledge that allows for knowledge produced by even highly unreliable cognitive abilities or powers (Turri 2016a,c).
10. Expanding Horizons
In this closing section, we survey four directions in which VE has developed. These directions are natural extensions of the ongoing research programs canvassed above, but they promise to bring new insights into VE and epistemology more generally. These include virtues in epistemic communities, profiles of specific virtues and vices, philosophizing about epistemic statuses other than knowledge, and explorations of the relations between intellectual virtues and epistemic emotions.
10.1 Intellectual Virtues in Epistemic Communities
Jonathan Kvanvig (1992) argues for an alternative vision of the place of virtues in epistemology. Modern epistemology has a narrow Cartesian focus on (time-slices of) individuals and particular beliefs. VE, Kvanvig says, should not follow suit. It is better suited to focus on social and historical factors. The virtues are important, on Kvanvig’s view, because of their indispensable role in training people to seek, acquire, and transmit truths—a distinctly social activity (see also Morton 2013).
Traditional epistemology, Kvanvig says, is dominated by an “individualistic” and “synchronic” conception of knowledge. It takes its most important job to be specifying the conditions under which an individual knows a particular proposition at a particular time. Kvanvig abandons this in favor of a genetic epistemology focused on the cognitive life of the mind as it develops within a social context. Questions about the group supplant questions about the individual. Questions about cognitive development and learning supplant questions about what an individual knows at a given time. This approach jibes well with both the educative streak already noted in VE and the embedded, scaffolded, and extended virtue approach described in section 9.
Kvanvig sees at least two ways this new approach would feature the virtues. First, virtues are essential to understanding the cognitive life of the mind, particularly development and learning, which happens over time through various processes, such as imitating virtuous agents and taking to heart cautionary tales of vice. Second, virtues are essential in characterizing cognitive ideals. For example, one way of organizing information is better than another, Kvanvig argues, because in appropriate circumstances that’s how an intellectually virtuous person would organize it.
10.2 Specific Virtues and Vices
Another “growth area” for VE is profiles of individual virtues and vices. Work in this area has progressed in fits and starts, with a great deal of work on some intellectual virtues and vices but less on others. Traits that have received significant attention include intellectual courage, intellectual humility, epistemic justice, as well as the vices that oppose these virtues.
Roberts and Wood (2007: 219) characterize intellectual courage and caution as the virtues that dispose us to respond appropriately to perceived threats in our intellectual lives—courage disposing us to not be unduly intimidated, caution disposing us to not take inappropriate risks in achieving intellectual goods. For them, then, intellectual courage is analogous to Aristotelian moral courage, in that it disposes its bearer to respond well to threats, being neither too rash nor too fearful. Baehr (2011, chap. 9) likewise argues that intellectual courage is best construed as a disposition to respond well to threats to one’s epistemic well-being; he focuses in particular on the courage to inquire rather than the courage to believe or doubt. Drawing on Nietzsche, Alfano (2013a, 2019) explores a related kind of intellectual courage to inquire into the forbidden. He argues that such Nietzschean courage is needed to understand the most disheartening and shameful aspects of human nature, which people tend to whitewash or gloss over. On a different note, Alfano (2013b) emphasizes the importance of intellectual courage in publicly announcing what one knows or believes in the face of social and institutional pressure to conform or be silent. Such courage relates to the transmission of knowledge and the destruction of ignorance and error in one’s community rather than the seeking of knowledge for the inquirer’s sake. Having such a sense of when and how to speak one’s mind is a primary constituent of the virtue of being an effective whistleblower, an underappreciated exemplar of the current era (DesAutels 2009). Medina (2013) offers an account of subjects with exceptional intellectual courage, such as Sor Juana Ines de la Cruz in seventeenth century Mexico. Such heroes defy cognitive obstacles in contexts of epistemic oppression through inventiveness and imagination.
Contributors to the profile of intellectual humility include Carter and Pritchard (2016), Hazlett (2012), Roberts and Wood (2007), Samuelson and Church (2015), Whitcomb et al. (2015), and Christen et al. (2014). Hazlett (2012: 220) claims that intellectual humility is the
disposition not to adopt epistemically improper higher order epistemic attitudes, and to adopt (in the right way, in the right situations) epistemically proper higher order epistemic attitudes.
This conception of intellectual humility is most pertinent in the realm of disagreement. The view of Roberts and Wood is similar, holding that intellectual humility is “a striking or unusual unconcern for social importance, and thus a kind of emotional insensitivity to the issues of status” (2007: 239). Their definition, like Hazlett’s, emphasizes the social nature of intellectual humility. Unlike Hazlett, Roberts and Wood put more weight on the intellectually humble person’s concerns and emotions, and less on her doxastic states.
Samuelson and Church (2015), by contrast, characterize intellectual humility in the dual-process language popular in contemporary psychology. Samuelson and Church think that intellectual humility can be implemented as a motivating trait, but they are inclined to construe it in the dual-system framework, where it harmonizes automatic intuitive processes (heuristics, affective judgments, etc.) with slow, controlled, effortful, attentive thought and deliberation. On this view, someone who tends to jump to conclusions based on intuitions (“System 1”) fails to be intellectually humble, especially if he is not open to revising his beliefs in the face of new evidence. By contrast, someone who forces himself to slow down and think carefully (“System 2”) in situations where intuitive responses are liable to mislead would be a paragon of intellectual humility.
Whitcomb et al. (2015; see also Medina 2013) propose a conception of intellectual humility as appropriately attending to and owning one’s cognitive limitations. Such attentiveness can be conscious, but it is grounded in an implicit sensitivity to one’s own dispositions. Attending to one’s limitations is in turn meant to lead to intellectually humble cognitive, behavioral, motivational, and affective responses. This trait leads the intellectually humble person to revise her beliefs in light of her recognition of her limitations, to try to overcome or quarantine the bad effects of her limitations, to desire to embody fewer and less severe limitations, and to display fitting emotions (e.g., regret rather than amusement) towards her limitations.
Finally, Christen, Alfano, and Robinson (2014) give a descriptive rather than a normative account of intellectual humility. Like the views canvassed above, they think that intellectual humility can be understood as a multifaceted disposition that opposes other dispositions. Rather than consulting their own intuitions about what the facets of intellectual humility and its opposing vices are, however, they employ a thesaurus-based psycholexical analysis, which suggests that intellectual humility has three positive facets (the sensitive self, the discreet self, and the inquisitive self) and three opposing vices (the underrated other, the underrated self, and the overrated self). The sensitive self is characterized by comprehension, responsiveness, and mindfulness—all ways of demonstrating openness to new ideas and information. The inquisitive self is characterized by curiosity, exploration, and learning—all ways of seeking new ideas and information. The discreet self is characterized by demureness and unpretentiousness—ways of relating to other people, especially those one might disagree with.
Miranda Fricker (2003, 2007) provides a detailed case study of the virtue of epistemic justice and the opposing vice of “epistemic injustice” suffered by the marginalized and less powerful. Epistemic injustice harms someone in their capacity as a (potential) knower and comes in several varieties. One species is hermeneutical injustice, which occurs when people are denied the conceptual and linguistic resources to make sense of and communicate their experience. A prime example is sexual harassment, a concept forged 1970s America. The other main species of epistemic injustice that has received by far the most attention, though, is testimonial injustice, which occurs when someone’s assertions are accorded less (or more) credence than they deserve because of prejudice of some kind, such as bias regarding identities like gender, race, ethnicity, or age. The vice of testimonial injustice is a disposition to commit such acts of epistemic injustice. The virtue of corrective testimonial justice is a disposition to remain aware of and compensate for your prejudices by interfering with your estimation of the value of someone’s testimony. This corrective virtue, Fricker (2003: 161) argues, is cultivated through social training.
Medina (2011, 2012, 2013) has developed a social-contextualist account of the virtue of epistemic justice and the corresponding vice of epistemic injustice. Medina (2011) argues that testimonial justice requires the development of epistemic sensibility that detects and corrects both undeserved credibility deficits and undeserved credibility excesses. He also argues that hermeneutical injustices are often addressed best in dialogical communities that come to a mutual understanding of their predicament, rather than by individuals.
Sherman (2016) agrees with Fricker about the harm caused by testimonial injustice but questions the efficacy of trying to cultivate a virtue to correct it. The essential problem is that people tend to think that their own opinions and trust in the testimony of others are reasonable. If you thought that you’d given someone’s word too little weight, you would already have revised your opinion. In light of this, Sherman suggests that efforts to cultivate corrective testimonial justice are likely to fail or even backfire.
Following Sherman, Alfano (2015; see also Alfano & Skorburg 2018) suggests communalizing the pursuit of testimonial justice by, for example, recruiting your friends to confront you when they think you’ve committed an act of injustice and going out of your way to do the same when you witness injustice. Also in response to Sherman, Davidson and Kelly (2015) argue that while it may be difficult or impossible to adjust one’s credence in the moment, taking distal ecological control (Clark 2007) over one’s material, social, and political environment can help to tamp down or eradicate the biases that lead to testimonial injustice. Likewise, Washington (2016: 11) argues that because isolated individuals lack a “Bad Judgment Alarm”, the response to testimonial injustice should not be to reflexively cultivate one’s own character but to promote a “social and moral ecology that facilitates the expression of our values”. These approaches harmonize with the embedded, scaffolded, and extended virtue model described above, as well as Kvanvig’s (1992) celebration of the role of the epistemic community.
Other intellectual virtues have received less attention to date, though not for lack of philosophical merit. These include intellectual generosity (Roberts & Wood 2007: 293), epistemic temperance (Battaly 2010), open-mindedness (Adler 2004; Baehr 2011; Carter & Gordon 2014b), intellectual perseverance (King 2014b), inquisitiveness (L. Watson 2015), and curiosity (Alfano 2013a; Whitcomb 2010). In a recent book, Cassam (2019) catalogues a range of epistemic vices. Some, such as closed-mindedness, are character traits. Others, such as wishful thinking, are better conceptualized as ways of thinking. Still others, such as epistemic malevolence and epistemic insouciance, are best understood as attitudes. Cassam characterizes the attitude of malevolence as a stance, which is a voluntarily-adopted policy to engage in certain types of conduct; by contrast, he characterizes the attitude of epistemic insouciance as a posture, which is affective and involuntary (in this case, a reckless and flippant disregard for truth, evidence, and expertise). These theoretical reflections have recently been bolstered by empirical work by Meyer, Alfano, & de Bruin (2021), who who show that possession of the epistemic vices of indifference to truth (related to epistemic insouciance) and intellectual rigidity (related to closed-mindedness) predicts acceptance of fake news, conspiracy theories, and misinformation about COVID-19.
10.3 Statuses Other Than Knowledge
As explained in section 6, practitioners have engaged in a lively discussion of what the distinctive value of knowledge is. The main question here has been what makes knowledge more valuable than true belief? Further such value questions might be asked. For instance, what if anything makes understanding more valuable than knowledge? Or, if understanding is a species of knowledge, what if anything makes it more valuable than knowledge that does not qualify as understanding? And what makes wisdom especially epistemically valuable?
Answers to these questions tend to home in on properties either of the content or of the cognizer. For example, there is a long tradition in the philosophy of science on the nature of scientific explanation. In this tradition, explanations provide understanding by communicating knowledge of causes (Lipton 1991; Salmon 1984; Khalifa & Gadomski 2013; Turri 2015b). By contrast, epistemologists, especially virtue epistemologists, have tended to argue that understanding is a special status that arises from acts of intellectual virtue. For instance, Pritchard (2016b) argues that understanding arises from “seeing it for oneself”, which manifests the virtue of intellectual autonomy. Stephen Grimm (2006) argues that understanding is a special kind of knowledge that arises from “grasping”, a distinctive psychological act that manifests intellectual virtue. Carter and Gordon (2014a,b) argue that objectual understanding, in particular, has a special value knowledge lacks, and further that this kind of understanding is needed in order to explain why certain traits, such as open-mindedness, are intellectual virtues. And on Zagzebski’s view, understanding is closely tied to mastery of an art or skill, does not pertain to discrete propositions but to patterns or systems, and consequently takes a nonpropositional object. Understanding does not result from mere acquisition of information, as can propositional knowledge. She thinks of understanding as “the state of comprehension of nonpropositional structures of reality” (Zagzebski 2001: 242). She also conjectures that we can define understanding analogously to how she defined knowledge. The main difference would be in the relevant virtues that produce the different states. Whereas knowledge derives from virtues that aim at truth, understanding derives at least partly from different virtues, special ones hitherto “unanalyzed, even unrecognized” (Zagzebski 2001: 248).
Looking beyond even understanding, Zagzebski further hopes that one day epistemologists will turn their attention to wisdom. Further, she claims, VE makes it easier to “recover” interest in and analyze understanding and wisdom. For more on wisdom and its potential connection to the virtue of epistemic humility, see Ryan (2014).
10.4 Epistemic Emotions
It’s uncontroversial to say that many virtues are emotional dispositions, even if they involve behavior in addition to emotion. As mentioned above, intellectual courage disposes its bearer to appropriate fear and confidence in matters epistemic. Alfano (2016b: chapter 4) suggests that, because we are able to individuate emotions more clearly than virtues, it might be helpful to index virtues to the emotions they govern. If this is on the right track, then intellectual virtues could be distinguished and structured by cataloguing what Morton (2010; see also Morton 2014, Stocker 2010, and Kashdan & Silvia 2011) calls epistemic emotions. These include such states as curiosity, fascination, intrigue, hope, trust, distrust, mistrust, surprise, doubt, skepticism, boredom, puzzlement, confusion, wonder, awe, faith, and epistemic angst. Note that some of these emotions are referred to by words that are also used to refer to their controlling virtues. As Morton says, “the words often do triple duty. Character links to virtue links to emotion” (2010).
VE can benefit from theorizing about epistemic emotions in at least three ways. One benefit of theorizing intellectual virtues via epistemic emotions is that doing so furnishes practitioners with a sort of “to do list”: many of the virtues related to the emotions mentioned in the previous paragraph are unexplored or underexplored. These virtues are ripe for the picking. Another benefit of the lens of epistemic emotion is that it helps to make sense of intellectual virtues as dispositions to motivated inquiry rather than just static belief. Emotions are, after all, motivational states, and epistemic emotions in particular direct us to seek confirmation, disconfirmation, and so on. This point is related to but more specific than Michael Brady’s (2013: 92) idea that emotions in general motivate inquiry because they “capture and consume” attention, thereby motivating inquiry into their own eliciting conditions. For instance, fear captures and consumes the attention of the fearful person, directing him to find and understand the (potential) threat or danger.
Finally, epistemic emotions help to make sense of the motivations and practices of scientists. For example, Thagard (2002) mined James Watson’s (1969) autobiographical account of the discovery of the structure of DNA for emotion terms; the most common related to interest and the joy of discovery, followed by fear, hope, anger, distress, aesthetic appreciation, and surprise. In addition, the literature on the demarcation between science and pseudo-science, along with the literature on scientific revolutions, is peppered with the language of emotion—especially epistemic emotion. Popper (1962) talks of scientists’ attitudes to their hypotheses as one of “hope” rather than belief. He distinguishes science from pseudoscience by sneering at the “faith” characteristic of the latter and praising the “doubt” and openness to testing of the former. He argues that the “special problem under investigation” and the scientist’s “theoretical interests” determine her point of view. Lakatos (1978) contrasts scientific knowledge with theological certainty that “must be beyond doubt”. Kuhn (1962) says that the attitude scientists have towards their paradigms is one of not only belief but also “trust”. He claims that scientists received the discovery of x-rays “not only with surprise but with shock”, going on to say that “though they could not doubt the evidence, [they] were clearly staggered by it”.
In times of crisis, says Kuhn, scientists are plagued by “malaise”. Such malaise has recently become most evident in social psychology’s replication crisis. For example, two pre-registered replications of the so-called “ego-depletion effect” recently found that, despite decades of positive studies and successful meta-analyses, there appears to be no such effect (Hagger et al. 2016; Lurquin et al. 2016). A science journalist writing for Slate magazine described these findings as “not just worrying” but “terrifying”, because they suggest that an entire field of research is “suspicious” (Engber 2016, see Other Internet Resources). The article quotes Evan Carter, one of the young scientists in the thick of the crisis, saying,
All of a sudden it felt like everything was crumbling. I basically lost my compass. Normally I could say, all right there have been 100 published studies on this, so I can feel good about it, I can feel confident. And then that just went away.
On his blog, social psychologist Michael Inzlicht (2016, see Other Internet Resources) writes that despite being
in love with social psychology […] I have so many feelings about the situation we’re in, and sometimes the weight of it breaks my heart. […] it is only when we feel badly, when we acknowledge and, yes, grieve for yesterday, that we can allow for a better tomorrow.
He goes on to say, “This is flat-out scary”, and, “I’m in a dark place. I feel like the ground is moving from underneath me and I no longer know what is real and what is not”. Practitioners of VE may be in a position to offer aid and comfort to afflicted scientists, or at least an accurate description of what ails them.
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Dedicated Journal Issues
- Metaphilosophy, 34(1–2), (2003)
- Metaphilosophy, 41(1–2), (2010)
- The Monist, 99(2), (2016).
- Noûs, 27(1), (1993).
- Philosophical Issues, 5 (1994).
- Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 60(1), (2000).
- Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 66(2), (2003).
- Philosophical Papers, 37(3), (2008).
- Philosophical Studies, 78 (1995).
- Philosophical Studies, 130(1), (2006).
- Philosophical Studies, 143(3), (2009).
- Philosophical Studies, 143(4), (2009).
- Teorema, 27(1), (2009) (in Spanish).
Other Important Works
- Axtell, Guy, 1998, “The Role of the Intellectual Virtues in the Reunification of Epistemology”, The Monist, 81(3): 488–508. doi:10.5840/monist199881325
- BonJour, Laurence and Ernest Sosa, 2003, Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues, Malden, MA: Blackwell.
- Carter, Joseph Adam, 2009, “Anti-Luck Epistemology and Safety’s (Recent) Discontents”,, Philosophia 38(3): 517–532. doi:10.1007/s11406-009-9219-z
- Code, Lorraine, 1984, “Toward a ‘Responsibilist’ Epistemology”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 45(1): 29–50. doi:10.2307/2107325
- Driver, Julia, 1989, “The Virtues of Ignorance”, Journal of Philosophy, 86(7): 373–84. doi: 10.2307/2027146
- Greco, John, 1994, “Virtue Epistemology and the Relevant Sense of ‘Relevant Possibility’”, Southern Journal of Philosophy, 32(1): 61–77. doi:10.1111/j.2041-6962.1994.tb00703.x
- Grimm, S.R., 2001, “Ernest Sosa, Knowledge and Understanding” Philosophical Studies, 106(3): 171–191. doi:10.1023/A:1013354326246
- Haddock, Adrian, Alan Millar and Duncan Pritchard (eds.), 2009, Epistemic Value, Oxford: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199231188.001.0001
- Henderson, David K., 1994, “Epistemic Competence”, Philosophical Papers, 23(3): 139–167. doi:10.1080/05568649409506420
- –––, 2008, “Testimonial Belief and Epistemic Competence”, Noûs, 42(2): 190–221. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0068.2008.00678.x
- Henderson, David and Terry Horgan, 2009, “Epistemic Virtues and Cognitive Dispositions”, in Gregor Damschen, Robert Schnepf, and Karsten Stüber, (eds.), Debating Dispositions: Issues in Metaphysics, Epistemology and Philosophy of Mind, Berlin: DeGruyter, pp. 296–319.
- Hibbs, Thomas S., 2001, “Aquinas, Virtue and Recent Epistemology”, Review of Metaphysics, 52(3): 573–594.
- Hookway, Christopher, 1993, “Mimicking Foundationalism: on Sentiment and Self-control”, European Journal of Philosophy, 1(2): 155–173. doi:10.1111/j.1468-0378.1993.tb00030.x
- –––, 1994, “Cognitive Virtues and Epistemic Evaluations”, International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 2(2): 211–227. doi:10.1080/09672559408570791
- Kelp, Christoph, 2009, “Pritchard on Virtue Epistemology”, International Journal of Philosophical Studies, 17(4): 583–587. doi:10.1080/09672550903164426
- –––, 2009, “Knowledge and Safety”, Journal of Philosophical Research, 34: 21–31. doi:10.5840/jpr_2009_1
- –––, 2009, “Pritchard on Knowledge, Safety and Cognitive Achievements”, Journal of Philosophical Research, 34: 51–53. doi:10.5840/jpr_2009_6
- Lepock, Christopher, 2011, “Unifying the Intellectual Virtues”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 83(1): 106–128. doi:10.1111/j.1933-1592.2010.00425.x
- Kvanvig, J., 2011, “Virtue Epistemology”, in the Routledge Companion to Epistemology, Duncan Pritchard and Sven Bernecker (eds.), London: Routledge.
- Montmarquet, James A., 1987, “Epistemic Virtue”, Mind, 96(384): 482–497. doi:10.1093/mind/XCVI.384.482
- Napier, Stephen E., 2008, Virtue Epistemology: Motivation and Knowledge, New York: Continuum Press.
- Pritchard, Duncan, 2003, “Virtue Epistemology and Epistemic Luck”, Metaphilosophy, 34(1–2): 106–30. doi:10.1111/1467-9973.00263
- –––, 2006, What is This Thing Called Knowledge?, London: Routledge.
- –––, 2009, Knowledge, New York: Palgrave Macmillan.
- –––, 2010, “Cognitive Ability and the Extended Cognition Thesis”, Synthese, 175(S1): 133–151. doi:10.1007/s11229-010-9738-y
- Sosa, Ernest, 1985, “The Coherence of Virtue and the Virtue of Coherence: Justification in Epistemology”, Synthese, 64(1): 3–28.
- –––, 1993, “Proper Functionalism and Virtue Epistemology”, Noûs, 27(1): 51–65. doi:10.2307/2215895
- –––, 1997, “How to Resolve the Pyrrhonian Problematic: A Lesson form Descartes”, Philosophical Studies, 85(2–3): 229–249. doi:10.1023/A:1004254711671
- –––, 1999, “How to Defeat Opposition to Moore”, Noûs (Philosophical Perspectives), 33(S13): 141–55. doi:10.1111/0029-4624.33.s13.7
- –––, 2003, “Beyond Internal Foundations to External Virtues”, in Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues, Malden, MA: Blackwell.
- Taliaferro, Charles, 2001, “The Virtues of Embodiment”, Philosophy, 76(1): 111–125. doi:10.1017/S0031819101000079
- Vaesen, Krist, 2011, “Knowledge Without Credit, Exhibit 4: Extended Cognition”, Synthese, 181(3): 515–529. doi:10.1007/s11229-010-9744-0
- Wood, W. Jay, 1998, Epistemology: Becoming Intellectually Virtuous, Grand Rapids, MI: Intervarsity Press.
- Zagzebski, Linda, 1997, “Virtue in Ethics and Epistemology”, American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, 71(Supplement): 1–17. doi: 10.5840/acpaproc19977110
- –––, 2005, “Virtue Epistemology” in the Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, New York: Routledge.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Inzlicht, Michael, 2016, “Reckoning with the past”, February 29, Inzlicht 2016 available online (accessed April 22, 2016).
- Engber, Daniel, 2016, “Everything is crumbling”, Slate, March 6, Engber 2016 available online (accessed April 22, 2016).
- Virtue Epistemology, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy, by Jason Baehr.
- Intellectual Virtues Academy (IVA), a school in Long Beach, California
We are grateful to Adam Carter, Dennis Whitcomb, Miranda Fricker, and Jose Medina for feedback on a draft of this entry. Mark Alfano carried out some of the research leading to this publication while he was affiliated as Visitor at the School of Philosophy, Australian National University. John Turri’s research was supported by the Social Sciences and Humanities Research Council of Canada, the Ontario Ministry of Economic Development and Innovation, and the Canada Research Chairs program.