Cultural Evolution

First published Sun Dec 23, 2007; substantive revision Tue May 1, 2018

In the broadest terms, theories of evolution seek to explain why species are the ways they are. For many evolutionists, this means explaining the possession by species of characteristic adaptations. It also means explaining diversity within species. The general mark of modern theories of cultural evolution is their insistence on the significance of cultural inheritance—particularly various forms of learning from others—for both of these questions. The prima-facie case for cultural evolutionary theories is irresistible. Members of our own species are able to survive and reproduce in part because of habits, know-how and technology that are not only maintained by learning from others, they are initially generated as part of a cumulative project that builds on discoveries made by others. And our own species also contains sub-groups with different habits, know-how and technologies, which are once again generated and maintained through social learning. Social learning is also an important agent of adaptation, and perhaps of speciation, in animals. The question is not so much whether cultural evolution is important, but how theories of cultural evolution should be fashioned, and how they should be related to more traditional understandings of organic evolution.

1. What is Cultural Evolution?

Theories of cultural evolution need to be distinguished from theories within evolutionary psychology, even though both may involve an application of evolutionary ideas to the explanation of cultural phenomena. The evolutionary psychologist (e.g. Tooby and Cosmides 1992) tends to assume that the most important inheritance mechanism in all species—our own included—is genetic inheritance. Evolutionary psychology regards the human mind as evolving through a conventional process of natural selection acting on genetically inherited variation. For example, an evolutionary psychologist might explain the widespread taste among humans for fatty foods in terms of the importance in our species’ distant past of consuming as much fat as possible on those rare occasions when the circumstances presented themselves. Such a hypothesis can also help to explain novel cultural trends: the recent increase in obesity is explained as the result of a novel environmental change—the increased availability of cheap, high-fat foods—acting in concert with a once-adaptive, now dangerous, gustatory preference. So evolutionary psychology is hardly silent about culture and cultural change. Even so, cultural evolutionary theorists tend to place far more stress on the role of non-genetic inheritance, and specifically of cultural inheritance mediated via learning, as a factor playing a positive, creative role in adapting species to their social and biological environments.

Darwin believed, as do biologists today, that natural selection can explain the origin of many complex adaptive traits. In Darwin’s original presentation of natural selection, he requires that parent organisms differ in their abilities to survive and reproduce, and that offspring resemble their parents in terms of the traits that promote or inhibit these abilities (Darwin 1859). This explanatory schema is largely neutral regarding what mechanism accounts for parent-offspring resemblance. For example, offspring might learn skills from their parents, and thereby come to resemble them behaviourally. From the perspective of natural selection explanations, it does not matter why offspring resemble parents, only that they do resemble them.

Darwin’s theory of natural selection explains adaptation by appealing to what we now call vertical transmission—the inheritance of parental traits by offspring. As we have seen, cultural processes such as learning might, in principle, underpin this form of inheritance. But we do not learn only from our parents—we also learn from peers, authority-figures and so forth. This is known as oblique transmission. Once we acknowledge the possibility that learning can underpin natural selection, we also acknowledge that a theory of evolution—a theory which seeks to explain change, including adaptive change in a population—may also need to be further expanded to encompass oblique transmission. The admittance of oblique transmission into evolutionary theory necessitates far more radical revisions to traditional Darwinian models of evolution. This is because oblique transmission opens up the possibility that some traits may spread through a population in spite of the fact that they reduce the fitness of the individuals who bear them.

While large amounts of work in cultural evolution have focused on the human species, there is also a growing body of work assessing the implications of learning for adaptation and speciation in many other species including chimpanzees (Whiten et al. 1999), whales (Rendell and Whitehead 2001), fish and birds among many others (Laland and Hoppitt 2003). Moreover, this work on non-human species also helps to refine and to answer a series of questions about why humans, compared with other species, seem so conspicuously good at building, maintaining and refining collective storehouses of adaptive cultural capital (Henrich 2015, Laland 2016).

2. Natural Selection and Cultural Inheritance

In a classic early work of cultural evolution, Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman (1981) ask (among other things) how we can explain declining birth rates among Italian women in the nineteenth century. These women went from having around five children on average to having only two. It would be extremely implausible to argue that this occurred as result of natural selection (Sober 1991, 482). It would be implausible, for example, to argue that the fitness of women with smaller families was greater than the fitness of women with larger families. True enough, an individual’s long-term fitness (measured in terms of numbers of grandchildren, or great-grandchildren) may sometimes be augmented by having a few strong offspring rather than lots of weak ones (Lack 1954). But surely Italian women could have raised more than two children to be healthy adults. Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman instead argue that the practice of having fewer children spread through Italy because women acquired the trait both from peers and from individuals from their mother’s generation, through modes of cultural transmission. Forms of oblique transmission are required to explain this transition, because if cultural transmission were always vertical, then the trait of having greater numbers of offspring would be maintained in the population by natural selection, albeit selection acting via cultural inheritance.

One might react to this with confusion: why is a body of theory needed to make these claims? Of course we acquire traits from others by learning. And of course those others from whom we learn can include peers as well as parents. In part, we can respond to this bewilderment by pointing to the virtues of clarifying the conditions required for cultural inheritance to overcome natural selection. Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman argue that if women simply acquired whichever preference for family size was the most widely adopted in their local cultural environment, then cultural inheritance would not have enough of an effect to overcome natural selection. Women must be disposed to acquire the preference for small family size even when it is present in only a small proportion of their cultural circle, if small family size is to replace large family size in the population as a whole. This is an illuminating claim, and it takes a quantitative model to show it.

This question of what benefit is to be had from setting these sorts of claims in a quantitative theory will be raised in more detail later in this article. For the moment, note that one may also ask why it should be the case that we are able to learn from non-parents at all, given the adaptive costs of such a disposition. If the tendency of Italian women to learn from their peers has led them to reduce their fitness by reducing their family size, why did natural selection allow such learning dispositions to become established in the first place? Boyd and Richerson, two other pioneers in cultural evolutionary theory, claim that the overall adaptive benefits of learning from non-parents in fact outweigh the overall adaptive costs (Richerson and Boyd 2005, Ch. 4). They give several reasons for this view. Suppose an inventive (or lucky) individual is able to discover some behaviour, or technique, which augments fitness. If other individuals in the population can copy that behaviour, then their fitness will probably be augmented, too. It will often be difficult for individuals to ascertain which behaviours in fact augment fitness, hence which behaviours should be copied. The problem, then, is how to tune a learning mechanism so that beneficial behaviours are copied, while non-beneficial behaviours are not.

Boyd and Richerson suggest that prestige bias can overcome this problem: if individuals copy techniques from those who are in prestigious positions, then this increases the chances that they will copy techniques that are, in fact, beneficial. As they put it, “Determining who is a success is much easier than determining how to be a success” (Richerson and Boyd, 2005, 124). Moreover, evidence has been accumulating for the reality of prestige bias. Henrich and Broesch (2011) have argued, based on fieldwork in Fiji, that an individual’s perceived success in a single domain of activity (for example, yam cultivation) predicts whether that individual will be asked for advice in other domains (for example, fishing). In other words, they claim that individuals are accorded a broad form of prestige, which affects their likelihood of serving as a cultural model. The value of prestige bias relies on the supposition that those individuals who are able to get themselves into prestigious positions have a better than average tendency to make use of fitness-enhancing techniques. This heuristic will not be failsafe: after all, not every technique a prestigious individual uses will also augment fitness, and some individuals may be accorded prestige without good cause. But the question which settles the plausibility of natural selection explaining prestige bias is not whether prestige bias will sometimes lead to the copying of maladaptive techniques; the question, rather, is whether individuals who learn from the prestigious will tend to be fitter on average than individuals who either do not learn at all, or who are equally likely to learn from any member of the population, regardless of their social status.

Richerson and Boyd (2005, 120–22) suggest that other learning heuristics may be adaptive. One of these is standardly referred to by cultural evolutionists as conformist bias. To say that someone has conformist bias is to say that the person in question has a tendency to imitate those behaviours, beliefs or other dispositions that are present among a high frequency of individuals in the population. More precisely, this bias is usually defined as a heightened, or exaggerated, tendency to imitate the most common behaviour. That is because if (for example) the great majority of people eat with chopsticks, and just a few eat with a knife and fork, then choosing whom to imitate at random will also be likely to lead to imitation of the majority chopstick behaviour. Under these circumstances purely random choice of whom to imitate is likely to lead one to choose a chopstick user as a model. So if 70 percent of individuals in some population use chopsticks, then an imitator only has conformist bias in the strict sense favoured by cultural evolutionists if the imitator has a chance greater than 70 percent of acquiring the behaviour of chopstick use.

Richerson and Boyd argue (along with many others in the field) that conformist learning is adaptive, in the sense that it provides an individual learner with behaviours that are appropriate to novel situations. More specifically, they argue that it is more adaptive in this regard than not imitating others at all, and more adaptive than imitating randomly-chosen members of a population. Conformist learning, they say, can help with the acquisition of behaviours appropriate to a new biological environment: when moving into a new habitat, with unknown plants and animals, it is best to eat the foods the locals eat, for one thereby avoids poisoning. But it can also lead to the generation of socially appropriate behaviours, which will obviate ostracism or attack. Harris and Corriveau’s (2011) empirical work concludes that while young children are unselective with regard to what they learn, they are far more selective regarding whom they learn from. Moreover, they argue that children tend to seek out cultural conformists as individuals whom they should trust. These findings offer some support for the existence of a form of conformist bias, although Lewens (2015) has suggested that both the theoretical and empirical cases for conformist bias may not be as strong as first meets the eye.

These examples show the nature of the interaction between cultural evolutionary thinking and more traditional natural selection thinking. Natural selection acting on genetic variation can establish dispositions to learn from non-kin in spite of the fact that under some circumstances these dispositions lead to the proliferation of maladaptive traits. It is worth noting that this aspect of much cultural evolutionary thinking retains a strong methodological affinity with the evolutionary psychological approach it is sometimes contrasted with (Lewens 2015). Learning dispositions themselves are often understood by cultural evolutionists as genetically inherited adaptations, produced in response to adaptive problems faced by our earlier ancestors. Some recent critics of cultural evolutionary thinking (e.g. Heyes 2012, and especially Heyes 2018) consequently argue that it is not cultural enough, for it tends to downplay the possibility that learning dispositions themselves might be inherited through forms of learning. All agree, though, that once these learning dispositions are in place, we should not assume that every trait in a population must be explained by reference to the biological fitness benefit it has conferred in the past. Evolutionary adaptationists tend to ask, of any given trait, what effect might have led natural selection to favour that trait. Even if an adaptationist stance of this sort is justifiable for learning mechanisms (and cultural evolutionists typically are adaptationists in this respect) this does not mean that an adaptationist stance is justifiable for learned traits.

3. Historical Pedigree

The notion that culture itself evolves, and that Darwinian insights can be applied to understanding cultural change, is by no means new. A very early example of cultural evolutionary thinking comes from William James:

A remarkable parallel, which to my mind has never been noticed, obtains between the facts of social evolution and the mental growth of the race, on the one hand, and of zoological evolution, as expounded by Mr Darwin, on the other. (James 1880, 441)

James’s paper is primarily concerned with using what he regards as a proper understanding of Darwinism to undermine the “so-called evolutionary philosophy of Mr Herbert Spencer” (ibid., 422). Spencer had argued that ‘great men’ were of secondary importance in determining the course of history, on the grounds that ‘Before he can remake his society, his society must make him’ (from Spencer’s Study of Sociology, quoted in ibid., 449). The great man needs to be made, and society does this. Hence ultimately it is society itself that explains social change.

James argues that the central key to Darwin’s natural selection mechanism is to decouple the causes of variation from the causes of selection (see Lewens, 2007, Ch. 2). Variations are produced by unknown causes, and the environment selects among them. Variations themselves (for James’s Darwin) are inexplicable. The same is true of great men: ‘The causes of production of great men lie in a sphere wholly inaccessible to the social philosopher. He must simply accept geniuses as data, just as Darwin accepts his spontaneous variations’ (James, 1880, 445). Great men, like spontaneous variations, are essential and inexplicable elements of the evolutionary process. Just as Darwin’s theory credits environment and variation with distinctive, yet vital, roles, so both great men and the social environment are important for the explanation of social change:

This social evolution is a resultant of the interaction of two wholly distinct factors: the individual, deriving his peculiar gifts from the play of physiological and infra-social forces, but bearing all the power of initiative and origination in his own hands; and second, the social environment, with its power of adopting or rejecting both him and his gifts. Both factors are essential to change. (Ibid., 448)

There are problems associated with any effort to trace the pedigree of cultural evolutionary theories back to Darwin himself. One of the reasons for this is that cultural evolutionary theories often define themselves in opposition to those which claim that genetic inheritance is the only significant inheritance mechanism. Clearly one cannot cast Darwin as a cultural evolutionist in this manner, for he had no notion of genetic inheritance to oppose. Having said this, Darwin did believe that what was learned in one generation could be inherited in later generations. But far from distinguishing cultural inheritance from organic inheritance, Darwin thought that all inheritance should be explained by the transmission of ‘gemmules’. These were understood to be particles produced throughout the body, of a character specific to the body part that produces them. Darwin believed that gemmules then travelled to the gonads, where they were transmitted to offspring in the sex cells. Darwin claimed that gemmules were produced throughout the body in order to explain the inheritance of acquired characteristics. So in one sense Darwin is in alignment with modern cultural evolutionists—he believed that characteristics learned during the life of a parent could be transmitted to offspring. But in another sense Darwin is opposed to modern cultural evolutionists, for rather than distinguishing between different interacting inheritance systems (e.g. cultural and genetic inheritance), Darwin tends to use the transmission of gemmules to explain the inheritance of all types of trait.

There are other respects in which one might choose to regard Darwin as a proto-cultural evolutionist. Darwin sometimes integrates discussion of technological evolution into his broader discussions of natural selection. In the Descent of Man, Darwin pauses to discuss technical innovation, arguing that successful innovations will usually be imitated, thereby increasing the success of a group as a whole, increasing the size of that group, and consequently increasing the chances of inventive members being born into it (Darwin 1877, 154). This explanation combines natural selection’s central concern with reproductive output, and cultural evolution’s central concern with imitation. Darwin writes:

…if some one man in a tribe, more sagacious than the others, invented a new snare or weapon…the plainest self-interest, without the assistance of much reasoning power, would prompt the other members to imitate him; and all would thus profit…If the new invention were an important one, the tribe would increase in number, spread, and supplant other tribes…In a tribe thus rendered more numerous there would always be a rather greater chance of the birth of other superior and inventive members. (Darwin 1877, 154)

Finally, Darwin endorses the view, widely favoured these days, that natural selection need not act on organisms. Rather, natural selection is substrate-neutral. A natural selection process can occur whenever certain abstract conditions—these days often expressed as differential reproduction with inheritance—are met. Darwin explicitly endorses the view that natural selection can act on entities other than organisms in the context of language change, a cultural phenomenon. This position is briefly explored in the Origin of Species, and further expanded in the Descent of Man. In this work, he endorses the opinion of Max Müller:

A struggle for life is constantly going on amongst the words and grammatical forms in each language. The better, the shorter, the easier forms are constantly gaining the upper hand, and they owe their success to their own inherent value. (Darwin 1877, 113)

Darwin asserts that this is no mere analogy: “The survival or preservation of certain favoured words in the struggle for existence is natural selection” (1877, 113). This claim—that cultural entities of various sorts can undergo natural selection processes in their own right—is not a necessary feature of a theory of cultural evolution. Cultural evolutionary theory in general requires only a systematic effort to model the effects of cultural inheritance, and one might decide that thinking in terms of natural selection acting on units of culture is not the best way of doing this. We will investigate these issues in more detail later in this article.

We have already mentioned Herbert Spencer, and Spencer is sometimes regarded as a key early advocate of efforts to apply evolutionary thinking to human culture (e.g. Jablonka and Lamb 2005, 21–22). As early as 1855, in his Principles of Psychology, Spencer proposed a form of evolutionary epistemology, arguing for a third way between empiricism’s emphasis on the necessity of experience for knowledge, and rationalism’s insistence on the importance of a priori knowledge. Spencer reasoned that if the experiences of past generations were imprinted on human minds, then it would be true both that some forms of knowledge in current generations were a priori, and also that this knowledge had its origins in experience, albeit the experience of our ancestors. Darwin himself had made a brief note along similar lines in his M notebook: ‘Plato…says in Phaedo that our ‘necessary ideas’ arise from the preexistence of the soul, are not derivable from experience.—read monkeys for preexistence.’ (Barrett et al. 1987, 551) Much later in the twentieth century, Konrad Lorenz would argue for a similar set of views in his efforts to see the Kantian a priori through the lens of evolutionary biology, and natural selection more specifically (Lorenz 1941). There is an important difference between Darwin and Lorenz, which these superficial similarities might hide. Darwin’s comments do not presuppose the action of natural selection as the mechanism by which these adaptive ideas become common in the species; rather, the mechanism of use-inheritance is what explains the preservation of concepts and techniques that are seen to work well.

Although Spencer is sometimes credited with initiating the application of evolutionary thinking to culture, Spencer’s contributions in this domain and others are often regarded as scientifically worthless (although see Jablonka and Lamb 2005, 372–3 for an exception). Ernst Mayr, for example, claimed that ‘It would be quite justifiable to ignore Spencer totally in a history of biological ideas because his positive contributions were nil’ (Mayr 1982, 386). Spencer is usually treated harshly for his adherence to the importance of ‘use-inheritance’, according to which habits initially learned are eventually inherited automatically in offspring. This form of inheritance would be classed by many as ‘Lamarckian’, in contrast to the ‘Darwinian’ forms of inheritance that are typically placed in the foreground in presentations of modern evolutionary theory.

Some recent modern theorists have argued that Lamarckian inheritance should not be dismissed out of hand (e.g. Jablonka and Lamb 1995). Whatever we think of this move, the tendency to praise Darwin while damning Spencer often overlooks the fact that Darwin, too, believed in the biological significance of use-inheritance, and it figured strongly in his own views of cultural evolution. Spencer is also criticised for his ‘social Darwinist’ beliefs, but Darwin, too, was a social Darwinist of sorts, and held evolutionary views regarding race, social degeneration and other such topics that most would dismiss today (see Lewens 2007, chapter eight). As we have seen, Darwin’s theory of pangenesis was developed partly in order to explain what he took to be the phenomena of use-inheritance, and a general account of use-inheritance played an important role in Darwin’s cultural evolutionary account of human moral progress. Indeed, at one point in the Descent of Man, Darwin quotes Spencer at length and with approval:

Our great philosopher, Herbert Spencer, has recently explained his views on the moral sense. He says, “I believe that the experiences of utility organised and consolidated through all past generations of the human race, have been producing corresponding modifications, which, by continued transmission and accumulation, have become in us certain faculties of moral intuition—certain emotions corresponding to right and wrong conduct, which have no apparent basis in the individual experience of utility.” (Darwin 1877, 148)

4. Memes

Serious efforts to construct cultural evolutionary theories can be traced to the work of Lumsden and Wilson (1981), Cavalli-Sforza and Feldman (1981), and Boyd and Richerson (1985). All of these authors have attempted, in one way or another, to produce formal models that can integrate the effects of cultural inheritance into more standard biological models of evolution. We have already looked at some of the claims of these theorists, but before looking at their work in more detail, let us look at the theory of memetics. This theory, originally put forward by Richard Dawkins (1976), is perhaps the best known attempt to apply evolutionary thinking to culture; that said, while it has enjoyed considerable popular attention, it has not become well established in scientific circles. Instead, the school of Boyd and Richerson has been far more successful, for reasons that are explained below.

The meme theory seeks to draw a very strong analogy between evolution at the cultural level, and biological evolution. It begins with an abstract characterisation of selection as a process requiring entities that reproduce, such that parents resemble offspring. Memetics takes the view, popularised by Dawkins, that entities which have the ability to make faithful copies of themselves—so-called ‘replicators’—are required to explain this trans-generational resemblance. In standard biological models of evolution it is assumed that genes are the relevant replicators. Genes make copies of themselves, and this ability explains why offspring organisms resemble their parents. If culture is to evolve, it therefore becomes necessary to find some form of cultural replicator that explains cultural inheritance. Memes play this role. Dawkins gives a list of some exemplary memes: ‘tunes, ideas, catch-phrases, clothes fashions, ways of making pots or of building arches.’ Note that while it is sometimes assumed that all memes are ideas (and vice versa) Dawkins’s list includes other types of thing, such as ways of making pots, which are techniques.

Dawkins’s claim is that ideas, for example, can be conceptualised as entities that hop from mind to mind, making copies of themselves as they go. On the face of things, this seems an attractive proposition. Just as genes make copies of themselves at different rates according to their effects on the organisms that bear them and on their local environments, so ideas make copies of themselves at different rates according to their effects on the organisms that bear them and on their local environments. In a community of scientists, for example, different hypotheses are entertained, and some come to be believed more widely than others. A hypothesis that begins in the mind of one or two scientists thereby spreads, until it is widely held in the research community. Another hypothesis quickly dies. We can perhaps characterise the features that make some hypotheses likely to spread, and others likely to perish. ‘Fit’ hypotheses may have predictive power, or simplicity, or they may integrate well with existing bodies of theory. Note that what this example shows is that taking the meme’s-eye perspective does not literally show that we are being manipulated by selfish cultural replicators. One can describe scientific change as a struggle between selfish memes, but one can also describe just the same process in terms of scientists choosing to accept, or to reject, theories by reference to familiar criteria of explanatory power, theoretical elegance and so forth. It is only an incidental feature of the metaphor of memetic selfishness that appears to deprive humans of control over which ideas they do, and do not, accept.

5. Problems with Memes

There are various problems associated with memetic views, most of which focus on limitations of the gene/meme analogy. These worries are sometimes raised by theorists from the social sciences who are hostile to evolutionary theories of culture. But they are also raised quite frequently by cultural evolutionists who argue that the meme concept is not the right way to ground a theory of cultural evolution: it is essential to bear in mind, then, that cultural evolutionary theories in general do not require the meme theory to be true (see Henrich et al. 2008). Here are some of the most frequently encountered arguments against the meme concept (the remainder of this section draws on Lewens, 2007, Ch. 7):

Cultural units are not replicators: Replicators, remember, are supposed to be units that make copies of themselves. Some critics of the meme concept argue that there is no known mechanism that could explain how memes are copied. But this is a mistake. An idea can be copied simply through observation and inference: agent B can observe the behaviour of agent A, infer that A holds some belief X, and thereby come to hold the same belief as A. Ideas can also be copied using linguistic communication. Agent A might be convinced of belief X, she tells B about it, and B comes to believe X too. In both cases one can say that belief X makes a copy of itself, albeit via language, inference, and so forth. A more pressing worry for memetics is that imitation is usually too error-prone to underpin replication. If I make a cake on the basis of a secret family recipe, you eat the cake, and you then attempt to make another one, then the chances are that the recipe you hit upon will not, in fact, be exactly the same as the one I used, even if you are able to make a similar-tasting cake. Another significant worry for memetics is that when the same ideas do spread through a population, it is rarely because they are literally copied from each other. Sperber argues that cultural reproduction is rarely meme-like, but instead makes use of what he calls ‘attractors’—culturally shared patterns of thought, which enable representations to spread through a population without literal copying. Sticking with the cake example, perhaps you eat a slice of my Victoria sponge, you like it, and you decide to make one for yourself. Perhaps the recipe you use is very similar to mine. But you have not figured out by tasting my cake which ingredients needed to go in and in what order. Rather, you already knew how to make a Victoria sponge. Eating my cake simply triggered the use of a recipe that was already in your repertoire. In this case, the recipe has appeared in my head, and because of this it has appeared in yours, but not because your recipe is a copy of mine. Sperber argues that memetics is mistaken because most cases of the spread of ideas are like this:

… most cultural items are ‘re-produced’ in the sense that they are produced again and again—with, of course, a causal link between all these productions—but are not reproduced in the sense of being copied from one another…Hence they are not memes, even when they are close ‘copies’ of one another (in a loose sense of ‘copy’, of course). (Sperber 2000, 164–65)

Both of these concerns raise serious problems for the generality of memetics: not all ideas are replicators, hence not all ideas are memes. Whether this shows the meme concept to be useless depends on whether there are insights to be had by distinguishing cultural inheritance that is meme-like from cultural inheritance that is not (Sterelny 2006a).

Cultural units do not form lineages: A closely-related criticism of memetics draws on the fact that while in genetic replication we can trace a new copy of a gene back to a single parent, ideas are rarely copied from a single source in a way that allows us to trace clear lineages (Boyd and Richerson 2000). Memeticists are fond of analysing religious belief in terms of the spread of memes. But while religious beliefs may well spread through populations of humans, it seems unlikely that we will always be able to trace token instances of faith back to one source. Instead, individuals often acquire belief in God through exposure to several believers in their local community. In these circumstances, belief in God is not caused by one identifiable earlier token of the same type. Within the realm of biological evolution, an understanding of Mendel’s laws has been important in explaining some aspects of evolutionary dynamics. Mendel’s laws rely on an understanding of genes as discrete, transmitted units. But if token ideas can appear in an individual in virtue of that individual’s exposure to several sources, then this makes it unlikely that anything close to Mendel’s laws will be discovered within cultural evolution. This suggests a practical limitation on enquiry that may result from this difference between ideas and genes. Criticisms of this form have been put especially forcefully by William Wimsatt (1999), who argues that the creative and inferential abilities of human users make it the case that any given idea, or item of technology, can have fluctuating numbers of cultural parents over time. This is because the causal sources of its reproduction may vary. Belief in God may sometimes be caused by exposure to a single charismatic evangelist, it may sometimes be caused by the joint inculcation of two biological parents, and it may sometimes be caused by immersion in a diffuse community of theists. Ideas and items of technology also have no stable analogue to the genome, or germline, because different elements within cycles of technological reproduction, including ideas, behaviours of artisans, and material elements of technologies themselves, can all temporarily acquire the status of replicators depending on the attention that human agents happen to be paying to them. Accidental variations in one’s mental plan for constructing a pot, or in one’s actions in producing the pot, or in the made pot itself, can all conceivably be reproduced when another artisan comes to make a resembling item. Wimsatt uses these disanalogies to highlight the formidable problems facing any effort to use population genetic models in the explanation of cultural change.

Culture cannot be atomised into discrete units: Ideas stand in logical relations to each other. Whether an individual is able to acquire some belief, for example, depends on their related conceptual competencies. It is impossible to believe in the theory of relativity without understanding it, and one cannot understand it without holding many additional beliefs relating to physics. The same is true for non-technical beliefs. Depending on which religion one is talking about, belief in God is likely to be related to various other beliefs concerning forgiveness, retribution, love and so forth. This has led some critics to argue that it is a mistake to take a view of culture which atomises it into discrete units, assigning replicative power to them individually. The anthropologist Adam Kuper complains that ‘Unlike genes, cultural traits are not particulate. An idea about God cannot be separated from other ideas with which it is indissolubly linked in a particular religion’ (Kuper 2000, 180). Memeticists are likely to respond by saying that although ideas are inter-linked, this does not undermine the meme-gene analogy: O’Brien et al. (2010) have argued that a more mature view of the role of genes in evolution and development re-instates the meme-gene parallel. For there is a sense in which genes, too, need to be studied in a context that takes other genes, and their broader developmental and environmental settings, into account. A DNA sequence can have different effects in different organisms, depending on the network of relations it enters into with other genetic and developmental resources. Just as the significance of belief in God can vary with social context, with the result that it can make little sense to think of ‘belief in God’ as a meme, so the function of some DNA sequence can vary with organic context, with the result that it makes little sense to identify some sequence type as a gene for the purposes of evolutionary analysis.

These criticisms focus on whether there truly are memes. But there are also criticisms of the usefulness of the meme concept, regardless of whether memes exist. As was already indicated above, one might worry that memetics merely offers a cosmetic re-packaging of a familiar set of stories about cultural change. Perhaps science is composed of replicating entities struggling against various selection pressures, but what insight does this offer us, if in the end it presents us with nothing more than an alternative idiom in which to describe the various factors that affect the evaluation of scientific hypotheses? Perhaps clothes fashions are memes, but even if that is the case, one still needs to explain what makes one clothing meme fitter than another, and the fear is that once spelled out this will quickly boil down to a well-known appeal to consumer psychology.

6. Cultural Evolution without Memes

The most serious and most respected efforts to apply evolutionary thinking to culture begin from a different starting point to memetics (although see Shennan 2008, 2011 for significant work that takes the meme’s-eye view). Meme theorists tend to begin with a general characterisation of evolution by natural selection, namely as a process that requires differential competition between replicators. Hence the meme theorist looks for some strict analogue to the gene in the cultural realm, which can play the replicator role. Dawkins implies that it is only because humans are subject to colonisation by replicators other than genes that human evolution escapes the tyranny of the gene. On this view, memes are required in order to free our species from a form of biological determinism.

The alternative to this view begins with the observation that cultural inheritance is important, and it seeks to integrate cultural inheritance into traditional evolutionary models. But this general motivation leaves open the issue of whether cultural evolution requires the existence of cultural replicators. Clearly one can accept many of the criticisms of the meme concept, and still attempt to model the effects of cultural inheritance. Rather than seeking to show that there are cultural replicators, one can instead seek to build models that allow for error-prone learning, and that acknowledge that an individual’s beliefs are often the result of exposure to many sources, rather than copying from just one source. The interest of cultural evolutionary models in this tradition is sometimes simply to show how cultural change of various sorts—not necessarily adaptive cultural change—can subsequently affect genetic evolution, and vice versa. This is the general goal of models of gene-culture co-evolution. But cultural evolutionary models also aim to assess the role of cultural inheritance in the construction of adaptation: here, cultural evolutionary theorists are not merely seeking to explain distributions of traits in populations, they are seeking to explain the appearance of valuable cultural novelties (Godfrey-Smith 2012).

One might think that even if cultural change does not require cultural replicators, at least adaptive cultural change does. The general Darwinian scheme for explaining adaptation demands reliable inheritance—it demands that once a fitness-augmenting mutation arises, it can be retained in future generations. If cultural learning is error-prone, or if individuals acquire cultural traits by taking an average of many different models, then one might think that if some individual is able to discover a fitness-enhancing behaviour, that trait will be lost to future generations either because it is mis-copied, or because it is combined with other less adaptive traits to produce an averaged mish-mash of a behaviour.

All of these inferences have been challenged by recent cultural evolutionary theory. Cultural evolutionists agree that at the level of the population, cumulative evolution requires that fitness-enhancing cultural traits are preserved in the offspring generation. However, they deny that this requires faithful transmission between individuals. A formal model from Henrich and Boyd (2002) suggests that conformist bias can overcome the effects of error-prone learning to produce reliable inheritance at the population level. Conformist bias was defined, in section 2 above, as the tendency of individuals to adopt the most common representation in a population. Henrich and Boyd cite evidence that conformist bias is a real phenomenon (although again see Lewens 2015 for scepticism about the case for conformism). Henrich and Boyd’s theoretical model assumes that individuals are poor at inferring the representations of others. Even so, they argue that when we look to the population level, conformist bias helps to correct the effects of such errors, producing a population-wide distribution of representations in the offspring generation that is close to the population-wide distribution of representations in the parent generation. Henrich and Boyd explain the reason for this. In general, error-prone transmission has a tendency to produce a mixture of different representations. In a population that already contains several different representations at significant frequencies, the effect of error on a population-wide distribution of representations is therefore low. In a population in which one representation is common, the effects of error are much more significant. But if we add conformist bias, we increase the chances of a commonly held representation remaining commonly held in future generations, even with error-prone imitation.

Boyd and Henrich acknowledge that this does not make population-level distributions perfectly reliably inherited. But this does not show that cumulative evolution acting on cultural inheritance is impossible. At the genetic level, highly faithful copying processes allow even very small selective forces to preserve adaptive variation. Less faithful copying demands stronger selective forces if adaptive variation is not to be lost. Boyd and Henrich are confident that selective forces in the cultural realm are stronger than selective forces in the genetic realm. The moral, once again, is that it is important not to focus too closely on genetic evolution as a model for cultural evolution.

Memetics tends to be driven by a desire to see cultural analogies to genetic evolution. Cultural evolutionary models in the manner of Boyd and Henrich are driven instead by a desire to find ways of understanding how cultural inheritance affects evolutionary processes. These sorts of cultural evolutionary models do not assume that cultural inheritance works in the same way as genetic inheritance. Indeed, they are free to model cultural inheritance in ways that depart quite markedly from genetic inheritance. Yet they remain recognisably evolutionary in style, primarily because they seek to explain the changes in trait frequencies in a population over time. They do this by making broad assumptions about how individuals acquire cultural traits—for example, they may assume that an individual’s representations are the product of learning from a variety of peers, or that they arise from attending particularly to authority figures—and by assessing how such rules will play out at the population level. Moreover, these rules for cultural acquisition are not merely conjectured, they are given experimental backing. Cultural evolutionary theorists seek to document the effects of various empirically supported forms of bias, such as prestige bias. Just as Darwin’s own theory of evolution by natural selection remained largely conjectural until supplemented by empirical work showing how inheritance worked, and by statistical work focusing on the population-level consequences of inheritance, selection, mutation and other forces, so cultural evolutionary theory has gained its insights from a similar combination of empirical and mathematical approaches.

7. The Explanatory Role of Cultural Evolutionary Theories

At the beginning of this entry it was claimed that the case for cultural evolution was irresistible. No one can deny that cultural inheritance is an important factor in explaining how our species has changed over time. Cultural inheritance is not merely a process that acts in parallel to genetic evolution, it is intertwined with genetic evolution. Cultural changes bring about alterations to the environment, which in turn affect both how genes act in development, and what selection pressures act on genes. In spite of all this, one might still worry that it is a mistake to understand the importance of culture using the tools of evolutionary theory. This is because one may be sceptical of the existence of a theory that is both general enough to cover all forms of cultural change, and informative enough to be enlightening.

There is no doubt that it is often important to remind overly-enthusiastic orthodox Darwinians of the importance of culture. For example, it seems that the increased incidence of lactose-tolerance among human populations has arisen as a consequence of a cultural innovation—namely dairy farming. The relatively recent appearance of this genetically-controlled adaptation demonstrates that human physiological nature is something that continues to change, and it also demonstrates the causal impact of culture on genes (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 191–92). Such examples by themselves show the rashness of any view that claims either that human nature has remained fixed since the Stone Age, or that genes are somehow in the evolutionary driving seat. Yet none of this shows that we can develop a general, informative theory of cultural evolution. One might fear that in the end cultural change, and the influence of cultural change on other aspects of the human species, are best understood through a series of individual narratives. Our brief examination of memetics illustrated this concern. We gain no real explanatory insight if we are told that ideas spread through populations, some more successfully than others. We want to know what makes some ideas fitter than others. And it is not clear that there will be any general rules that can help us to answer this question. In the biological realm we need detailed accounts of local environmental circumstances, species-specific physiology and anatomy, and so forth, to tell us what makes one organic variant fitter than another. Similarly, in the cultural realm we will need to look at local psychological dispositions to explain why some ideas are more likely to spread than others. So any explanatory value to be had from memetics is parasitic on conventional work done in psychology. And if individual preferences are subject to change over time, then there may be no general and informative theory of cultural evolution to be had; rather, we will have to settle for local explanations that look to shifting preferences. Rather than provide a new scientific framework for an understanding of culture, memetics will tend to degenerate into conventional narrative cultural history.

In the remaining sections I distinguish five broad sets of responses to this line of argument, each of which picks up on a different explanatory element of mainstream evolutionary theory (Lewens 2012). They can be yoked together to provide a broad justification for the payoffs of a cultural evolutionary perspective (Lewens 2015). First, Boyd and Richerson argue that informative insights arise out of cultural evolution’s ‘population thinking’ (Richerson and Boyd 2005). Second, Sperber and collaborators have endorsed this populational approach, while further insisting on the explanatory value of the notion of cultural ‘attractors’ in pinpointing why traditions are sustained over time (Sperber 1996, Morin 2016). Third, Richerson, Boyd, Henrich and others have stressed the importance of cumulative cultural adaptation, alongside a specific set of explanatory puzzles that these phenomena present (Richerson and Boyd 2005, Henrich 2015). Fourth, Sterelny (2001, 2003, 2006a, 2006b, 2007, 2012) and Wimsatt (1999) argue that illuminating insights regarding the general conditions required for evolvability also apply in the cultural realm. Fifth, many have argued that cultural evolutionary theories can provide insights into the historical patterns of cultural change, in much the same way that evolutionary biological tools have enabled us to reconstruct the branching (or perhaps reticulated) history of life. We will look at each line of defence in turn. For a much fuller account of the value of cultural evolutionary thinking, and indeed for a thorough and accessible introduction to the theory as a whole, Alex Mesoudi’s (2011) book is an excellent place to look. Meanwhile, Sterelny (2017) and Lewens (2015) offer overviews of some of the main conceptual divisions within the field.

8. Population Thinking

‘Population thinking’ means many things to many people. For Boyd and Richerson it denotes any effort to abstract from a characterisation of individual psychological profiles, in a way that allows an exploration of the consequences of these individual-level dispositions for population-level properties. We have already seen an example of this sort of population thinking in action. It is far from obvious that conformist bias among individuals can enable population-level inheritance in spite of individual-level errors in copying. To show that these properties of individual psychology (conformist bias and error-prone learning) combine to yield population-level inheritance requires some abstract mathematical modelling. And the establishment of this population-level consequence is important, for it enables the investigator to revise the constraints one might naively think must bear on cultural inheritance if cumulative cultural evolution is to occur.

In a useful article, Elliott Sober (1991) suggests that theories of cultural evolution may have limited value for the work of social scientists, on the grounds that social scientists are primarily interested in explaining what makes individuals likely to adopt one idea, rather than another. They want to know, for example, why nineteenth-century Italian women decided that they would rather have two children than five, not what the population-level consequences of their decisions might be. Richerson and Boyd respond by saying that Sober’s argument assumes, erroneously, that ‘we are all good intuitive population thinkers’ (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 97). In Sober’s original article he points out that population thinking might save cultural evolutionary models from vacuity in just this way:

So the question about the usefulness of these models of cultural evolution to the day-to-day research of social scientists comes to this: Are social scientists good at intuitive population thinking? If they are, then their explanations will not be undermined by precise models of cultural evolution. If they are not, then social scientists should correct their explanations (and the intuitions on which they rely) by studying these models. (Sober 1991, 492)

Many of Richerson and Boyd’s models are enlightening. As we have seen, it takes work to show that cumulative cultural adaptation does not require replication. Note, however, in favour of Sober’s scepticism, that the most interesting cultural evolutionary models are often those which show the general circumstances under which it is possible for cultural inheritance to be effective in producing adaptation. Boyd and Richerson’s claim in favour of the importance of prestige bias is primarily an effort to show how natural selection might have favoured cultural learning. Sober’s concern is with whether models such as these will also affect ‘the day-to-day research of social scientists’, who are not so interested in establishing such general conditions for cumulative cultural evolution, but who are instead interested in understanding particular episodes of social and cultural change. Even here, Richerson and Boyd’s population thinking may have some bite. They seek, for example, to explain the disappearance of important technologies on Tasmania. Drawing on the work of Joseph Henrich, they suggest (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 138) that the maintenance of technologies and the associated behaviours required to produce and operate them may require a population that is large enough for the rate of innovation to offset the degradation that results from error-prone imitation. If Boyd and Richerson are right about this episode in the history of Tasmania, then we may be able to explain the differences in the abilities of the Tasmanians, compared with other peoples, to maintain a set of technologies, merely by citing population size, rather than other forms of social or cultural difference. Note, finally, that Henrich’s model, like any populational model, must proceed by making highly simplified assumptions about the properties of the individual entities that make up the larger population. This invites a generic series of criticisms aimed at any effort at abstract modelling: Henrich’s model has been criticized by those who doubt the robustness of its assumptions and its match with empirical data (see Read 2006 for such criticism, Kline and Boyd 2010 for a response, and Houkes 2012 for a useful philosophical overview). At the same time, this abstraction constitutes a potential strength of the populational approach, for it offers us the possibility of understanding a complex system without needing comprehensive information about all of its parts.

9. Cultural Attraction

Sperber and other advocates of the approach to cultural evolution known as ‘cultural epidemiology’ share Richerson and Boyd’s focus on a populational approach to understanding culture (Sperber 1996). As they put it, “the overall general framework for the study and modelling of cultural evolution should be that of ‘population thinking’ … ” (Claidiere et al 2014). They argue that any successful execution of this populational approach requires that we explain the distributions of cultural items by paying close attention to what they call cultural ‘attractors’. Moreover, they argue that this approach frequently (although not always) gives rise to explanations that elude approaches grounded in forms of cultural selection.

As indicated earlier, Sperber argues that the simple notion of copying is only rarely appropriate to explain why broadly similar cultural items propagate in a stable manner through a population. For example, when emotional states spread through communities—perhaps at times of national mourning—it is often the case that one individual’s grief is causally initiated by that of another. But the second individual does not closely imitate, or copy, the emotional state of the first, even if the second emotional state resembles—and hence is a ‘reproduction’ of—the first. Instead, a shared set of background emotional dispositions, perhaps coupled to shared norms for public behaviour, conspire to reconstruct a second emotional state that is similar to the first. Such states, which are the broadly stable outcomes of these reconstructive processes, are examples of cultural ‘attractors’.

An attractor should not simply be equated with an idea that is psychologically attractive to individuals (Sperber 1996, Buskell 2017). Instead, it is a more abstract notion corresponding to any more-or-less stable outcome of processes of cultural reproduction. Very many different ‘factors of attraction’ can potentially underpin such stable reproduction. For example, if a widely-encountered engineering problem has only a few effective solutions, which are also easy to figure out, then we should expect those solutions to appear again and again, even if individuals are not attempting to copy the innovations of others in detail. In other words, factors of attraction need not be psychological at all, and can instead correspond to physical or ecological constraints. Shared bodies of information, shared preferences and shared emotional or inferential biases might also explain why some cultural variants re-appear with regularity. Some such attractors may be grounded in evolved cognitive dispositions shared by almost everyone. When drawing on these factors of attraction, Sperber and like-minded colleagues have often declared explicit debts to evolutionary psychology (Sperber 1996). Yet attractors can also be more local, corresponding to more narrowly shared cognitive dispositions or biases, common only to small communities. Such dispositions can explain reproduction that is only reliable across narrowly specified cultural contexts. Work in this tradition (e.g. Morin 2016) aims to answer the charge that the cultural evolutionary approach is vacuous via the detailed delineation of such factors of attraction, and their populational consequences, at various spatial and temporal scales.

10. Cumulative Culture

Some theorists begin their presentations of cultural evolutionary theory by arguing that cultural change meets the conditions for evolution by natural selection stressed by Darwin. They argue, for example, that in the realm of culture we find ample variation—there are alternative ways of making pots, alternative designs for kayaks, and so forth—that there are differences in the likelihood of these variants being preserved or multiplied in future generations—dependent on whether the pots in question look attractive, whether the different forms of kayak are easy to handle—and that there is adequately faithful reproduction as these techniques or designs travel from one individual to another. In other words, we find some version of variation, differential fitness and inheritance instantiated in the cultural context, as well as in the organic realm that Darwin primarily focused on. One of the risks of approaching the cultural evolution project in this abstract manner, which begins with the hunt for general similarities between the cultural and organic domains, has already been touched on. While we secure the general claim that a form of natural selection applies in the cultural domain, we can lose sight of what specific explanatory problems a theory of cultural evolution is supposed to address.

As we have seen, other presentations of cultural evolution begin in a more pragmatic, problem-driven fashion. In some cases they begin with explanatory puzzles similar to those that led Darwin to formulate his principle of natural selection in the first place. Darwin was concerned to explain how structures could arise which fit organisms so remarkably well to their conditions of existence. Cultural evolutionists frequently draw attention to a variety of adaptive cultural traits, whose origination seems inexplicable in terms of individual innovation alone. Henrich (2015, 97–100), for example, makes good use of the example of manioc processing. Manioc (also called cassava) is a good source of starch, but it needs to be processed to make it safe to eat. Without this processing it can release poisonous hydrogen cyanide. According to Henrich, while unprocessed manioc tastes bitter, the bitter taste is not a good indicator of its safety: bitterness disappears in the preparation process before it becomes safe to eat. Worse, while unprocessed manioc is poisonous, it is hard to discover that this is the case, because the symptoms of poisoning only appear well after eating unsafe manioc. Henrich argues that it is hard to see how any single insightful individual could have invented this processing technology. Instead, a more gradual process of cumulative cultural adaptation, spread across the population, must be invoked. In this kind of work, cultural analogues of organic selection processes are invoked because they promise a ‘hidden hand’ explanation for the appearance of adaptation, in contexts where explanations that rely on foresight seem unavailable. In other words, the rationale for turning to selection is the same in both the cultural and organic domains.

A second example of a more pragmatic, problem-driven invocation of cultural selection can be found in the ‘Tribal Social Instincts’ hypothesis. As Darwin (1877, 134) noted, humans are regularly moved to act in ways that benefit others, even when those others are not members of extended families. He suggested that we are moved by sympathy for others, and that the ultimate explanation for why we have such fellow-feeling can be explained as a result of a process of selection, albeit one that acts at the level of what he calls ‘tribes’. This explanation has been updated across a long series of publications by Richerson, Boyd and others, who also aim to explain the very widespread tendencies of modern humans to share valuable resources across broad social networks (e.g. Richerson and Boyd 2005, Richerson et al. 2016). Their view is that the resources of more mainstream evolutionary theory are not up to this explanatory task. Kin selection is insufficient, they say, because humans regularly share with people outside their immediate family groups. Moreover, they take the view that the Pleistocene social groups in which (they believe) these sharing behaviours evolved were probably too large for reciprocal altruism to explain their emergence. Their favoured explanatory hypothesis is a complex one, involving interaction between what they call ‘cultural group selection’ and natural selection acting on genetic variation: “Selection on tribes can account for the innate foundation of our social psychology via the process of gene-culture coevolution” (Richerson and Boyd 2005).

They argue, based on a mixture of historical, ethnographic and theoretical work, for a scenario that begins with what they also call ‘tribes’—they consider these to be ethnolinguistic units of around 500 to 1500 people—competing against each other in ways that are aided by culturally transmissible differences in group properties. This competitive process eventually produces “culturally transmitted cooperative, group-oriented norms, and systems of rewards and punishments to ensure that such norms are obeyed” (Richerson and Boyd 2005). Once cultural transmission has established this social environment, natural selection acting on genetic variation then favours an innate psychology that is suited to this new, socially-inherited set of environmental problems.

The very idea of group selection is a controversial one. Many commentators have taken a sceptical view of group selection when underpinned by genetic inheritance, because of worries that competition based on genetic variation within groups will tend to undermine the effects of competition between groups. Several cultural evolutionists (e.g. Boyd and Richerson 2009, Henrich 2015) have argued that cultural inheritance processes are better able than processes of genetic inheritance to sustain between-group differences, for they believe there is good empirical and theoretical evidence that cultural processes can maintain within-group homogeneity in the face of various countervailing factors (immigration, unreliable imitation and so forth).

Needless to say, this work is contentious. It is possible to challenge the claims made about the innateness of the social psychological dispositions in question, the characterisation of likely Pleistocene social groups, the inability of more traditional evolutionary resources to explain our altruistic tendencies, and so forth (see Birch 2018). Such challenges are inevitable when a hypothesis is as ambitious as this one, and when it draws on such a variety of supporting sources of data. There are also conceptual concerns. A recent paper lists three different forms of cultural group selection, of which straightforward competition between groups is just one variant (Richerson et al. 2016). The authors also offer selective imitation (by individuals) of individuals in successful groups, and selective migration (by individuals) into successful groups, as two further types of cultural group selection. These are indeed additional ways by which behavioural traits that are of benefit to a group can increase in frequency in a larger population of groups. However, in the second two cases, trait frequencies are increased simply by individuals’ attraction to traits that they regard as bestowing collective benefits. Because of this, thinking of them as forms of group selection may introduce confusion (see also Morin 2016). Regardless of these worries, it is clear that the cultural group selection explanation for forms of altruistic behaviour marks a significant effort to synthesise theory and evidence across a wide set of domains.

11. Evolvability

A closely related way to vindicate models of cultural evolution looks to the question of the general features of inheritance systems that make for evolvability in a lineage. This project has been pioneered in recent years by Kim Sterelny (e.g., 2001, 2003, 2006a, 2006b, 2007, 2012). Once again, let us illustrate the general nature of these issues by beginning in the organic realm. Darwin’s theory is intended to explain adaptation. The basic conditions for natural selection do not, in spite of appearances, suffice for the appearance of functional traits. A system in which offspring resemble parents with respect to fitness-enhancing traits may not develop complex adaptations. The environment needs to cooperate: if selective pressures change very quickly then there will be no sustained environmental demands of the sort that might build complex adaptations over time. Development also matters. If ontogeny is set up in such a way that changes to any one trait tend to be accompanied by changes to all other traits, then the chances are that cumulative adaptation will be particularly hard to come by. For even in those cases where a mutation contributes positively to the function of one trait, the chances are that it will contribute negatively to overall fitness in virtue of its disruption of the functioning of other traits. Development also needs to make a wide range of variation available. If it is highly constrained, so that only a small number of forms are possible, then selection is not presented with a broad enough range of raw materials from which to fashion complex traits. It also seems that cumulative adaptation relies on the suppression of ‘outlaws’ (Sterelny 2001, 2006b). We saw in the previous section that group selection is often held to be an ineffective agent of group-level adaptation, on the grounds that it is vulnerable to ‘subversion from within’. This occurs when individual organisms go it alone, sabotaging complex features of group organisation in favour of their own fitness. Individual-level selection, in contrast, can build individual-level adaptations. This is because, by and large, genes in a given human organism share a ‘common fate’—they do not behave as though they were in direct competition, struggling for representation in future generations. When genes genuinely ‘go it alone’, for example by sabotaging meiosis so that some have greater chances of appearing in future generations than others, then the overall integrity of the organism can be compromised, and individual-level adaptation is undermined.

By applying these sorts of considerations to the cultural realm we can attempt to understand the likely costs and benefits associated with various different forms of cultural inheritance (vertical, oblique, meme-like and so forth). We can also perhaps come to an understanding of the different evolutionary forces that might bring these different forms of cultural inheritance into existence. And, in turn, these insights may facilitate comparative work that seeks to document the general conditions that are required for a species to make use of cultural inheritance in order to build complex adaptations such as tools. This way of thinking offers the promise, for example, of explaining why few, if any, non-human species are able to build progressively more and more complex cultural features in a cumulative manner (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 107; see also Laland 2017). The exploration of the significance of these conditions in the cultural realm is contentious, partly because the conditions for evolvability themselves are disputed (see Godfrey-Smith 2009). Boyd and Henrich’s work brings out the fact that although population-level inheritance is important for adaptation, parent-offspring resemblance is not, in fact, necessary. Questions relating to evolvability are also tied up with difficult issues relating to the units-of-selection debate (Okasha 2006). As we have seen, natural selection at a higher level of organisation may be required to generate mechanisms that suppress the ability of disruptive ‘outlaws’ to go it alone at lower levels of organisation. Does something like this occur in the cultural realm? Does selection on human groups act so as to limit the ability of individual humans to go it alone? In what ways might cultural inheritance be involved in these processes? These questions are complex, both in terms of how they should be posed and how they should be answered. But some of the most interesting work in cultural evolutionary theory may come from efforts to answer them.

Issues relating to evolvability are sometimes framed in terms of systems of information transfer. On this view, if offspring are to resemble parents, developmental information must be transmitted from one generation to the next. The question is what forms of information transmission system do this job. This mode of framing the issue is contentious, for it is not always clear how we are to understand the concept of information, and what it means for some causal contributor to development to count as an information-bearer, rather than some other kind of developmental participant, such as an information-reader, say, or a background condition for information transfer (see Oyama 2000 and Griffiths 2001 for discussion of these issues). This general way of thinking about inheritance has, however, been influential in characterising so-called ‘major evolutionary transitions’ (Maynard Smith and Szathmary 1995). Key transitions in the history of life are said to include the development of DNA-based inheritance, the emergence of chromosomes, the advent of the ‘genetic code’, and events such as the arrival of sociality and language. Maynard Smith and Szathmary propose that we can think of these events as modifications to the mechanisms of inter-generational information transmission.

Jablonka and Lamb (2005) argue that thinking in terms of information transmission systems also allows us to point out salient differences in the forms of social transmission underlying cultural evolution. They claim that only some forms of social transmission make use of a system of symbols. Consider, for example, that to say that some birds inherit their song by social transmission is not to say that birdsong is a symbolic system. Humans, on the other hand, trade in publicly-accessible symbols. Moreover, repositories of symbols, most obviously in the form of libraries and computer databases, are vital inheritance systems for humans, allowing the preservation and accumulation of knowledge across generations. Note, also, that there are different types of symbol system. In some cases the relationship between a symbol and what is represented is arbitrary. The is the case for a word like ‘man’, which does not look or sound like a human male. In other cases of iconic symbolism, the relationship is one of resemblance: a sign for the gents’ toilet looks like a man.

Jablonka and Lamb use the characteristic differences between typical modes of social inheritance in animals and humans to illuminate the impact our own symbolic transmission systems have on human cultural evolution (see also Deacon 1997). Although they argue that there can be non-linguistic symbolic systems (2005, 224), language exemplifies nicely the way in which systems of symbols contain elements that can be recombined in countless ways to yield a vast array of different meaningful messages. Repositories of symbolically stored information, such as books, can also be searched, annotated, edited and so forth, in ways that add to their power and versatility. This manner of thinking opens up a number of challenging issues. The question of the degree to which symbolic systems resemble other inheritance systems is an illuminating one. Consider, by way of example, Stegmann’s (2004) discussion of the sense in which the genetic code is ‘arbitrary’. One quickly realises that any attempt to say precisely what makes some inheritance system a symbolic system, and any attempt to differentiate between types of symbolic systems (linguistic, non-linguistic and so forth), will be exceptionally philosophically demanding.

12. Cultural Phylogenies

Many evolutionists have argued that biological tools can have great value when we wish to develop a historical view of the pattern of cultural change (see, for example, Gray at al 2007, Mace and Holden 2005: this section itself draws on Lewens 2012). A variety of biological methods have been developed that help us to uncover the structure of evolutionary trees: they help us to understand which taxa split from which others and when. It seems clear that cultural items of many kinds (most obviously languages, but also tools and techniques) also stand in recognizable genealogical relationships, and this has led many biological anthropologists to use phylogenetic methods borrowed or adapted from the biological sciences in order to reconstruct the history of borrowings in the cultural realm. Critics have sometimes followed Gould (1988) in arguing that these biological methods cannot be properly applied to the cultural realm, because cultural genealogies take the form of reticulated networks, rather than branching trees. Cultural change is indeed often highly reticulated: it is obvious that a complex object like a car is a confluence of numerous technical lineages, which come together to form the hi-fi system, the engine, the safety devices, and so forth. Moreover, as improvements are made to cars these new developments may be borrowed by innovators of bicycles, furniture, toys and other shifting constellations of artifacts.

These important observations need not undermine the project of cultural phylogeny. Much of biological evolution is also reticulated. Bacteria, for example, do not form genealogically isolated lineages, hybridization is rife among plants, and there is also considerable borrowing of elements of the genome between apparently isolated mammalian species. Of course this might show simply that phylogenetic modes of inference are doubly imperilled: they don’t work for much of the biological world either. But cultural evolutionists (e.g. Gray et al. 2007) are encouraged by inferential developments within biology itself, which aim to reconstruct partially reticulated trees by proposing so-called reconciliations of the conflicting trees that traditional methods often propose for species and genes.

This kind of work is important, in part because of the uses to which well-confirmed cultural phylogenies can be put. It may be easiest to illustrate their value via a simple example. On the face of things, looking for correlations is a reasonable (albeit fallible) way to discover causal relationships. If, for example, people who smoke often get lung cancer, and people with lung cancer are often smokers, then we have good evidence that smoking causes lung cancer (or perhaps that lung cancer causes smoking). But there can be strong correlations that do not indicate causation. If, for example, we find that there is a strong correlation in animals between making a moo sound and producing large quantities of milk, we should not conclude that one causes the other. Mooing and milk production go together because the creatures in question share ancestors in common, who both mooed and gave lots of milk. Of course, in the case of cows this fact of common ancestry is so obvious that we hardly notice how it informs our causal inference. But cultural phylogenies are unobvious. Russell Gray, among others, has long argued that when we understand them better, our knowledge of phylogenies can then confirm, or undermine, causal hypotheses that are claimed on the basis of correlation.

Gray and Watts (2017), for example, have scrutinised what is sometimes called the Supernatural Punishment Hypothesis. This is the hypothesis that belief in powerful gods, who inflict punishment on wrongdoers, tends to result in societies that are better able to harness the fruits of cooperation (see Norenzayan et al. 2016). Gray and Watts again caution that mere correlation between societies that believe in ‘moralising high gods’ and various measures of social complexity does not count strongly in favour of the Supernatural Punishment Hypothesis. We must also take into account the potentially confounding consequences of shared ancestry among the societies surveyed. Gray and Watts draw on Austronesian data to argue that belief in moralising high gods tends to be gained after, not before, the emergence of political complexity; so these data, they suggest, undermine the thought that moralising high gods drive this form of complexity. That said, they do find some support for a weaker supernatural punishment hypothesis based on belief in punishment interventions from natural spirits, ancestral spirits and mythical heroes, as well as from moralising high gods. In their view this type of belief facilitated, ‘the rise of political complexity’ without ‘helping sustain it’ (2017: 7848). Work such as this indicates the potential for cultural phylogenetics to inform broad-sweep hypotheses about not just the patterns, but also the causal processes, that have marked the cultural history of our species.

13. The Culture Concept in Cultural Evolution

How do theorists within the field of cultural evolution understand what ‘culture’ is (see Driscoll 2017 for general discussion)? Richerson and Boyd’s (2005) definition is fairly typical of the field as a whole, and is mirrored in definitions given by Mesoudi (2011) and Henrich (2015). Culture, they say, is ‘information capable of affecting individuals’ behavior that they acquire from other members of their species through teaching, imitation, and other forms of social learning’ (Richerson and Boyd 2005, 5). This raises the further question of what is meant by ‘social learning’. In an important overview of work on cultural evolution, Henrich gives a definition of this key notion for cultural evolutionary theory, and of the notion of ‘individual learning’ that it is regularly contrasted with: learning refers to any time an individual’s learning is influenced by others, and it includes many different kinds of psychological processes. Individual learning refers to situations in which individuals learn by observing or interacting directly with their environment... (Henrich 2015, 12)

One consequence of this way of defining things (a consequence which Henrich explicitly recognises) is that the two terms, ‘social learning’ and ‘individual learning’, are not exclusive. In a species like ours it is hardly ever the case that what an individual learns is free from influence by others. Even in extreme cases where we learn by probing our surroundings well away from social company, almost every aspect of the environments we interact with—and hence what we end up learning from those environments—has been affected by other people’s past actions. The structures and contents of our dwellings and workplaces, the constitutions of the domesticated plants and animals we interact with, the cultivated and engineered environments we live in, all have been affected by the activities of our predecessors.

The overlap between individual and social forms of learning has significance for research on non-human, as well as the human, species. The group of wild chimpanzees studied by Hobaiter et al. (2014) began to develop a new behaviour: previously they had used ‘sponges’, made from chewed-up leaves, to soak up drinking water. Some then began to make these sponges from moss instead. The researchers saw one individual develop this behaviour because she re-used an old moss sponge, which had previously been discarded by another chimp. But she did not do this because she had seen the sponge in use. One the one hand, this is a clear case of individual learning: from the chimp’s-eye view the discarded sponge was simply something she happened to have found lying around. On the other hand, this is manifestly a piece of social learning according to Henrich’s definition, for the past action of another chimp greatly eased the inventive burden in discovering that moss could be used as a sponge. Little wonder, then, that the study authors mention this example as part of ‘a growing literature that refutes a strong distinction between individual and social learning’ (2014). As that distinction blurs, so the further question of what culture consists in becomes less clear (Lewens 2017). For there are numerous ways in which activities of one generation can, by altering or maintaining stable features of biotic, social and technical environments, have an influence over what individuals in the following generations end up learning.

These phenomena are recognised by many prominent theorists of cultural evolution. Laland et al. stress this theme in their work on niche-construction—i.e. the role of organisms in fashioning their environments—when they remark that, ‘We inherit a world of our making...This is both our ecological and our cultural inheritance’ (2001). Sterelny’s work on the evolution of cognition (e.g. Sterelny 2012) also places stress on what he sometimes calls ‘scaffolded learning’. Like Hobaiter et al’s chimps, unskilled, ignorant or uninitiated human novices can find their epistemic burdens greatly eased by the ways in which the environments in which they learn are littered with the fruits of past activities of adepts.

Henrich, also, remarks that ‘...the least sophisticated forms of social learning occur simply as a by-product of being around others, and engaging in individual learning’. He reserves the term ‘cultural learning’ for the ‘more sophisticated subclass of social learning abilities in which individuals seek to acquire information from others...’ (2015, 12–13). Critics of these final comments (e.g. Clarke and Heyes 2017) have urged that we seek more detailed information concerning whether individual learning—which, as we have seen, can take place in felicitously structured environments—truly is less sophisticated than forms of learning that attend directly to the behaviours of others. We need to ask both whether there is an additional form of sophistication in the cognitive mechanisms that underpin social (compared with individual) learning, and also whether social learning has greater functionality, specifically with respect to the generation of increasingly refined behaviours, technologies, norms and institutions across populations. These are just the types of questions to which the methods of cultural evolutionary work—which combine populational modelling with work in cognitive science—are well placed to give answers.


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The author would like to thank a grant from the John Templeton Foundation for support in the most recent revision to this entry, as well as Beth Hannon for help in preparing revisions to an earlier version, and the European Research Council for financial support under the European Union’s Seventh Framework Programme (FP7/2007–2013)/ERC Grant Agreement 284123. The editors would like to thank both Christopher von Bülow and Sally Ferguson for carefully reading the entry and identifying a significant number of typographical errors for correction.

Copyright © 2018 by
Tim Lewens <>

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