Two competing conceptions of fallacies are that they are false but popular beliefs and that they are deceptively bad arguments. These we may distinguish as the belief and argument conceptions of fallacies. Academic writers who have given the most attention to the subject of fallacies insist on, or at least prefer, the argument conception of fallacies, but the belief conception is prevalent in popular and non-scholarly discourse. As we shall see, there are yet other conceptions of what fallacies are, but the present inquiry focuses on the argument conception of fallacies.
Being able to detect and avoid fallacies has been viewed as a supplement to criteria of good reasoning. The knowledge of fallacies is needed to arm us against the most enticing missteps we might take with arguments—so thought not only Aristotle but also the early nineteenth century logicians Richard Whately and John Stuart Mill. But as the course of logical theory from the late nineteenth-century forward turned more and more to axiomatic systems and formal languages, the study of reasoning and natural language argumentation received much less attention, and hence developments in the study of fallacies almost came to a standstill. Until well past the middle of the twentieth century, discussions of fallacies were for the most part relegated to introductory level textbooks. It was only when philosophers realized the ill fit between formal logic, on the one hand, and natural language reasoning and argumentation, on the other, that the interest in fallacies has returned. Since the 1970s the utility of knowing about fallacies has been acknowledged (Johnson and Blair 1993), and the way in which fallacies are incorporated into theories of argumentation has been taken as a sign of a theory’s level of adequacy (Biro and Siegel 2007, van Eemeren 2010).
In modern fallacy studies it is common to distinguish formal and informal fallacies. Formal fallacies are those readily seen to be instances of identifiable invalid logical forms such as undistributed middle and denying the antecedent. Although many of the informal fallacies are also invalid arguments, it is generally thought to be more profitable, from the points of view of both recognition and understanding, to bring their weaknesses to light through analyses that do not involve appeal to formal languages. For this reason it has become the practice to eschew the symbolic language of formal logic in the analysis of these fallacies; hence the term ‘informal fallacy’ has gained wide currency. In the following essay, which is in four parts, it is what is considered the informal-fallacy literature that will be reviewed. Part 1 is an introduction to the core fallacies as brought to us by the tradition of the textbooks. Part 2 reviews the history of the development of the conceptions of fallacies as it is found from Aristotle to Copi. Part 3 surveys some of the most recent innovative research on fallacies, and Part 4 considers some of the current research topics in fallacy theory.
- 1. The core fallacies
- 2. History of Fallacy Theory
- 3. New approaches to fallacies
- 4. Current issues in fallacy theory
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1. The core fallacies
Irving Copi’s 1961 Introduction to Logic gives a brief explanation of eighteen informal fallacies. Although there is some variation in competing textbooks, Copi’s selection captured what for many was the traditional central, core fallacies. In the main, these fallacies spring from two fountainheads: Aristotle’s Sophistical Refutations and John Locke’s An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690). By way of introduction, a brief review of the core fallacies, especially as they appear in introductory level textbooks, will be given. Only very general definitions and illustrations of the fallacies can be given. This proviso is necessary first, because, the definitions (or identity conditions) of each of the fallacies is often a matter of contention and so no complete or final definition can be given in an introductory survey; secondly, some researchers wish that only plausible and realistic instances of each fallacy be used for illustration. This also is not possible at this stage. The advantage of the stock examples of fallacies is that they are designed to highlight what the mistake associated with each kind of fallacy is supposed to be. Additional details about some of the fallacies are found in Sections 2 and 3. As an initial working definition of the subject matter, we may take a fallacy to be an argument that seems to be better than it really is.
1. The fallacy of equivocation is an argument which exploits the ambiguity of a term or phrase which has occurred at least twice in an argument, such that on the first occurrence it has one meaning and on the second another meaning. A familiar example is:
The end of life is death.
Happiness is the end of life.
So, death is happiness.
‘The end of life’ first means ceasing to live, then it means purpose. That the same set of words is used twice conceals the fact that the two distinct meanings undermine the continuity of the reasoning, resulting in a non-sequitur.
2. The fallacy of amphiboly is, like the fallacy of equivocation, a fallacy of ambiguity; but here the ambiguity is due to indeterminate syntactic structure. In the argument:
The police were told to stop drinking on campus after midnight.
So, now they are able to respond to emergencies much better than before
there are several interpretations that can be given to the premise because it is grammatically ambiguous. On one reading it can be taken to mean that it is the police who have been drinking and are now to stop it; this makes for a plausible argument. On another reading what is meant is that the police were told to stop others (e.g., students) from drinking after midnight. If that is the sense in which the premise is intended, then the argument can be said to be a fallacy because despite initial appearances, it affords no support for the conclusion.
3 & 4. The fallacies of composition and division occur when the properties of parts and composites are mistakenly thought to be transferable from one to the other. Consider the two sentences:
- Every member of the investigative team was an excellent researcher.
- It was an excellent investigative team.
Here it is ‘excellence’ that is the property in question. The fallacy of composition is the inference from (a) to (b) but it need not hold if members of the team cannot work cooperatively with each other. The reverse inference from (b) to (a)—the fallacy of division—may also fail if some essential members of the team have a supportive or administrative role rather than a research role.
5. The fallacy of begging the question (petitio principii) can occur in a number of ways. One of them is nicely illustrated with Whately’s (1875 III §13) example: “to allow everyman an unbounded freedom of speech must always be, on the whole, advantageous to the State; for it is highly conducive to the interest of the Community, that each individual should enjoy a liberty perfectly unlimited, of expressing his sentiments.” This argument begs the question because the premise and conclusion are the very same proposition, albeit expressed in different words. It is a disguised instance of repetition which gives no reason for its apparent conclusion.
Another version of begging the question can occur in contexts of argumentation where there are unsettled questions about key terms. Suppose, for example, that everyone agrees that to murder someone requires doing something that is wrong, but not everyone agrees that capital punishment is a form of ‘murder’; some think it is justified killing. Then, should an arguer gives this argument:
Capital punishment requires an act of murdering human beings.
So, capital punishment is wrong.
one could say that this is question-begging because in this context of argumentation, the arguer is smuggling in as settled a question that remains open. That is, if the premise is accepted without further justification, the arguer is assuming the answer to a controversial question without argument.
Neither of these versions of begging the question are faulted for their invalidity, so they are not charged with being non-sequitors like most of the core fallacies; they are, however, attempted proofs that do not transparently display their weakness. This consideration, plus its ancient lineage back to Aristotle, might explain begging the question’s persistent inclusion among fallacies. But, given our allegiance to the modern conception of logic as being solely concerned with the following-from relation, forms of begging the question should be thought of as epistemic rather than logical fallacies.
Some versions of begging the question are more involved and are called circular reasoning. They include more than one inference. Descartes illustrated this kind of fallacy with the example of our belief in the Bible being justified because it is the word of God, and our belief in God’s existence being justified because it is written in the Bible. The two propositions lead back and forth to each other, in a circle, each having only the support of the other.
6. The fallacy known as complex question or many questions is usually explained as a fallacy associated with questioning. For example, in a context where a Yes or No answer must be given, the question, “Are you still a member of the Ku Klux Klan?” is a fallacy because either response implies that one has in the past been a member of the Klan, a proposition that may not have been established as true. Some say that this kind of mistake is not really a fallacy because to ask a question is not to make an argument.
7. There are a number of fallacies associated with causation, the most frequently discussed is post hoc ergo propter hoc, (after this, therefore because of this). This fallacy ascribes a causal relationship between two states or events on the basis of temporal succession. For example,
Unemployment decreased in the fourth quarter because the government eliminated the gasoline tax in the second quarter.
The decrease in unemployment that took place after the elimination of the tax may have been due to other causes; perhaps new industrial machinery or increased international demand for products. Other fallacies involve confusing the cause and the effect, and overlooking the possibility that two events are not directly related to each other but are both the effect of a third factor, a common cause. These fallacies are perhaps better understood as faults of explanation than faults of arguments.
8. The fallacy of ignoratio elenchi, or irrelevant conclusion, is indicative of misdirection in argumentation rather than a weak inference. The claim that Calgary is the fastest growing city in Canada, for example, is not defeated by a sound argument showing that it is not the biggest city in Canada. A variation of ignoratio elenchi, known under the name of the straw man fallacy, occurs when an opponent’s point of view is distorted in order to make it easier to refute. For example, in opposition to a proponent’s view that (a) industrialization is the cause of global warming, an opponent might substitute the proposition that (b) all ills that beset mankind are due to industrialization and then, having easily shown that (b) is false, leave the impression that (a), too, is false. Two things went wrong: the proponent does not hold (b), and even if she did, the falsity of (b) does not imply the falsity of (a).
There are a number of common fallacies that begin with the Latin prefix ‘ad’ (‘to’ or ‘toward’) and the most common of these will be described next.
9. The ad verecundiam fallacy concerns appeals to authority or expertise. Fundamentally, the fallacy involves accepting as evidence for a proposition the pronouncement of someone who is taken to be an authority but is not really an authority. This can happen when non-experts parade as experts in fields in which they have no special competence—when, for example, celebrities endorse commercial products or social movements. Similarly, when there is controversy, and authorities are divided, it is an error to base one’s view on the authority of just some of them. (See also 2.4 below.)
10. The fallacy ad populum is similar to the ad verecundiam, the difference being that the source appealed to is popular opinion, or common knowledge, rather than a specified authority. So, for example:
These days everyone (except you) has a car and knows how to drive;
So, you too should have a car and know how to drive.
Often in arguments like this the premises aren’t true, but even if they are generally true they may provide only scant support for their conclusions because that something is widely practised or believed is not compelling evidence that it is true or that it should be done. There are few subjects on which the general public can be said to hold authoritative opinions. Another version of the ad populum fallacy is known as “playing to the gallery” in which a speaker seeks acceptance for his view by arousing relevant prejudices and emotions in his audience in lieu of presenting it with good evidence.
11. The ad baculum fallacy is one of the most controversial because it is hard to see that it is a fallacy or even that it involves bad reasoning. Ad baculum means “appeal to the stick” and is generally taken to involve a threat of injury of harm to the person addressed. So, for example,
If you don’t join our demonstration against the expansion of the
park, we will evict you from your apartment;
So, you should join our demonstration against the expansion of the park.
Such threats do give us reasons to act and, unpleasant as the interlocutor may be, there seems to be no fallacy here. In labour disputes, and perhaps in international relations, using threats such as going on strike, or cutting off trade routes, are not normally considered fallacies, even though they do involve intimidation and the threat of harm. However, if we change to doxastic considerations, then the argument that you should believe that candidate \(X\) is the one best suited for public office because if you do not believe this you will be evicted from your apartment, certainly is a good instance of irrelevant evidence.
12. The fallacy ad misericordiam is a companion to the ad baculum fallacy: it occurs not when threats are out of place but when appeals for sympathy or pity are mistakenly thought to be evidence. To what extent our sympathy for others should influence our actions depends on many factors, including circumstances and our ethical views. However, sympathy alone is generally not evidence for believing any proposition. Hence,
You should believe that he is not guilty of embezzling those paintings; think of how much his family suffered during the Depression.
Ad misericordiam arguments, like ad baculum arguments, have their natural home in practical reasoning; it is when they are used in theoretical (doxastic) argumentation that the possibility of fallacy is more likely.
13. The ad hominem fallacy involves bringing negative aspects of an arguer, or their situation, to bear on the view they are advancing. There are three commonly recognized versions of the fallacy. The abusive ad hominem fallacy involves saying that someone’s view should not be accepted because they have some unfavorable property.
Thompson’s proposal for the wetlands may safely be rejected because last year she was arrested for hunting without a license.
The hunter Thompson, although she broke the law, may nevertheless have a very good plan for the wetlands.
Another, more subtle version of the fallacy is the circumstantial ad hominem in which, given the circumstances in which the arguer finds him or herself, it is alleged that their position is supported by self-interest rather than by good evidence. Hence, the scientific studies produced by industrialists to show that the levels of pollution at their factories are within the law may be undeservedly rejected because they are thought to be self-serving. Yet it is possible that the studies are sound: just because what someone says is in their self-interest, does not mean it should be rejected.
The third version of the ad hominem fallacy is the tu quoque. It involves not accepting a view or a recommendation because the espouser him- or herself does not follow it. Thus, if our neighbor advises us to exercise regularly and we reject her advice on the basis that she does not exercise regularly, we commit the tu quoque fallacy: the value of advice is not wholly dependent on the integrity of the advisor.
We may finish our survey of the core fallacies by considering just two more.
14. The fallacy of faulty analogy occurs when analogies are used as arguments or explanations and the similarities between the two things compared are too remote to support the conclusion.
If a child gets a new toy he or she will want to play with it;
So, if a nation gets new weapons, it will want to use them.
In this example (due to Churchill 1986, 349) there is a great difference between using (playing with) toys and using (discharging) weapons. The former is done for amusement, the latter is done to inflict harm on others. Playing with toys is a benign activity that requires little justification; using weapons against others nations is something that is usually only done after extensive deliberation and as a last resort. Hence, there is too much of a difference between using toys and using weapons to conclude that a nation, if it acquires weapons, will want to use them as readily as children will want to play with their toys.
15. The fallacy of the slippery slope generally takes the form that from a given starting point one can by a series of incremental inferences arrive at an undesirable conclusion, and because of this unwanted result, the initial starting point should be rejected. The kinds of inferences involved in the step-by-step argument can be causal, as in:
You have decided not to go to college;
If you don’t go to college, you won’t get a degree;
If you don’t get a degree, you won’t get a good job;
If you don’t get a good job, you won’t be able to enjoy life;
But you should be able to enjoy life;
So, you should go to college.
The weakness in this argument, the reason why it is a fallacy, lies in the second and third causal claims. The series of small steps that lead from an acceptable starting point to an unacceptable conclusion may also depend on vague terms rather than causal relations. Lack of clear boundaries is what enables the puzzling slippery slope arguments known as “the beard” and “the heap.” In the former, a person with a full beard eventually becomes beardless as hairs of the beard are removed one-by-one; but because the term ‘beard’ is vague it is unclear at which intermediate point we are to say that the man is now beardless. Hence, at each step in the argument until the final hair-plucking, we should continue to conclude that the man is bearded. In the second case, because ‘heap’ is vague, it is unclear at what point piling scattered stones together makes them a heap of stones: if it is not a heap to begin with, adding one more stone will not make it a heap, etc. In both these cases apparently good reasoning leads to a false conclusion.
Many other fallacies have been named and discussed, some of them quite different from the ones mentioned above, others interesting and novel variations of the above. Some of these will be mentioned in the review of historical and contemporary sources that follows.
2. History of Fallacy Theory
The history of the study of fallacies begins with Aristotle’s work, On Sophistical Refutations. It is among his earlier writings and the work appears to be a continuation of the Topics, his treatise on dialectical argumentation. Although his most extensive and theoretically detailed discussion of fallacies is in the Sophistical Refutations, Aristotle also discusses fallacies in the Prior Analytics and On Rhetoric. Here we will concentrate on summarizing the account given in the Sophistical Refutations. In that work, four things are worth noting: (a) the different conceptions of fallacy; (b) the basic concepts used to explain fallacies; (c) Aristotle’s explanation of why fallacies can be deceptive; and (d) his enumeration and classification of fallacies.
At the beginning of Topics (I, i), Aristotle distinguishes several kinds of deductions (syllogisms). They are distinguished first on the basis of the status of their premises. (1) Those that begin from true and primary premises, or are owed to such, are demonstrations. (2) Those which have dialectical premises—propositions acceptable to most people, or to the wise—are dialectical deductions. (3) Deductions that start from premises which only appear to be dialectical, are fallacious deductions because of their starting points, as are (4) those “deductions” that do have dialectical premises but do not really necessitate their conclusions. Other fallacies mentioned and associated with demonstrations are (5) those which only appear to start from what is true and primary (Top., I, i 101a5). What this classification leaves out are (6) the arguments that do start from true and primary premises but then fail to necessitate their conclusions; two of these, begging the question and non-cause are discussed in Prior Analytics (II, 16, 17). It is the “fallacious deductions” characterized in (4), however, that come closest to the focus of the Sophistical Refutations. Nevertheless, in many of the examples given what stands out is that the premises are given as answers in dialogue and are to be maintained by the answerer, not necessarily that they are dialectical in the sense of being common opinions. This variation on dialectical deductions Aristotle calls examination arguments (SR 2 165b4).
2.1.2 The basic concepts
There are three closely related concepts needed to understand sophistical refutations. By a deduction (a syllogism) Aristotle meant an argument which satisfies three conditions: it “is based on certain statements made in such a way as necessarily to cause the assertion of things other than those statements and as a result of those statements” (SR 1 165a1–2). Thus an argument may fail to be a syllogism in three different ways. The premises may fail to necessitate the conclusion, the conclusion may be the same as one of the premises, and the conclusion may not be caused by (grounded in) the premises. The concept of a proof underlying Sophistical Refutations is similar to what is demanded of demonstrative knowledge in Posterior Analytics (I ii 71b20), viz., that the premises must be “true, primary, immediate, better known than, prior to, and causative of the conclusion,” except that the first three conditions do not apply to deductions in which the premises are obtained through questioning. A refutation, Aristotle says, is “a proof of the contradictory” (SR 6, 168a37)—a proof of the proposition which is the contradictory of the thesis maintained by the answerer. In a context of someone, S, maintaining a thesis, T, a dialectical refutation will consist in asking questions of S, and then taking S’s answers and using them as the premises of a proof via a deduction of not-T: this will be a refutation of T relative to the answerer (SR 8 170a13). The concept of contradiction can be found in Categories: it is those contraries which are related such that “one opposite needs must be true, while the other must always be false” (13b2–3). A refutation will be sophistical if either the proof is only an apparent proof or the contradiction is only an apparent contradiction. Either way, according to Aristotle, there is a fallacy. Hence, the opening of his treatise: “Let us now treat of sophistical refutations, that is, arguments which appear to be refutations but are really fallacies and not refutations” (SR 1 164a20).
2.1.3 The appearance condition
Aristotle observed that “reasoning and refutation are sometimes real and sometimes not, but appear to be real owing to men’s inexperience; for the inexperienced are like those who view things from a distance” (SR, 1 164b25). The ideas here are first that there are arguments that appear to be better than they really are; and second that people inexperienced in arguments may mistake the appearance for the reality and thus be taken in by a bad argument or refutation. Apparent refutations are primarily explained in terms of apparent deductions: thus, with one exception, Aristotle’s fallacies are in the main a catalogue of bad deductions that appear to be good deductions. The exception is ignoratio elenchi in which, in one of its guises, the deduction contains no fallacy but the conclusion proved only appears to contradict the answerer’s thesis.
Aristotle devotes considerable space to explaining how the appearance condition may arise. At the outset he mentions the argument that turns upon names (SR 1 165a6), saying that it is the most prolific and usual explanation: because there are more things than names, some names will have to denote more than one thing, thereby creating the possibility of ambiguous terms and expressions. That the ambiguous use of a term goes unnoticed allows the illusion that an argument is a real deduction. The explanation of how the false appearance can arise is in the similarity of words or expressions with different meanings, and the smallness of differences in meaning between some expressions (SR 7 169a23–169b17).
2.1.4 List and classification
Aristotle discusses thirteen ways in which refutations can be sophistical and divides them into two groups. The first group, introduced in Chapter 4 of On Sophistical Refutations, includes those Aristotle considers dependent on language (in dictione), and the second group, introduced in Chapter 5, includes those characterized as not being dependent on language (extra dictionem). Chapter 6 reviews all the fallacies from the view point of failed refutations, and Chapter 7 explains how the appearance of correctness is made possible for each fallacy. Chapters 19–30 advise answerers on how to avoid being taken in by sophistical refutations.
The fallacies dependent on language are equivocation, amphiboly, combination of words, division of words, accent and form of expression. Of these the first two have survived pretty much as Aristotle thought of them. Equivocation results from the exploitation of a term’s ambiguity and amphiboly comes about through indefinite grammatical structure. The one has to do with semantical ambiguity, the other with syntactical ambiguity. However, the way that Aristotle thought of the combination and division fallacies differs significantly from modern treatments of composition and division. Aristotle’s fallacies are the combinations and divisions of words which alter meanings, e.g., “walk while sitting” vs. “walk-while-sitting,” (i.e., to have the ability to walk while seated vs. being able to walk and sit at the same time). For division, Aristotle gives the example of the number 5: it is 2 and 3. But 2 is even and 3 is odd, so 5 is even and odd. Double meaning is also possible with those words whose meanings depend on how they are pronounced, this is the fallacy of accent, but there were no accents in written Greek in Aristotle’s day; accordingly, this fallacy would be more likely in written work. What Aristotle had in mind is something similar to the double meanings that can be given to ‘unionized’ and ‘invalid’ depending on how they are pronounced. Finally, the fallacy that Aristotle calls form of expression exploits the kind of ambiguity made possible by what we have come to call category mistakes, in this case, fitting words to the wrong categories. Aristotle’s example is the word ‘flourishing’ which may appear to be a verb because of its ‘ing’ ending (as in ‘cutting’ or ‘running’) and so belongs to the category of actions, whereas it really belongs in the category of quality. Category confusion was, for Aristotle, the key cause of metaphysical mistakes.
There are seven kinds of sophistical refutation that can occur in the category of refutations not dependent on language: accident, secundum quid, consequent, non-cause, begging the question, ignoratio elenchi and many questions.
The fallacy of accident is the most elusive of the fallacies on Aristotle’s list. It turns on his distinction between two kinds of predication, unique properties and accidents (Top. I 5). The fallacy is defined as occurring when “it is claimed that some attribute belongs similarly to the thing and to its accident” (SR 5 166b28). What belongs to a thing are its unique properties which are counterpredicable (Smith 1997, 60), i.e., if \(A\) is an attribute of \(B\), \(B\) is an attribute of \(A\). However, attributes that are accidents are not counterpredicates and to treat them as such is false reasoning, and can lead to paradoxical results; for example, if it is a property of triangles that they are equal to two right angles, and a triangle is accidentally a first principle, it does not follow that all first principles have two right angles (see Schreiber 2001, ch. 7).
Aristotle considers the fallacy of consequent to be a special case of the fallacy of accident, observing that consequence is not convertible, i.e., “if \(A\) is, \(B\) necessarily is, men also fancy that, if \(B\) is, \(A\) necessarily is” (SR 5 169b3). One of Aristotle’s examples is that it does not follow that “a man who is hot must be in a fever because a man who is in a fever is hot” (SR 5 169b19). This fallacy is sometimes claimed as being an early statement of the formal fallacy of affirming the consequent.
The fallacy of secundum quid comes about from failing to appreciate the distinction between using words absolutely and using them with qualification. Spruce trees, for example, are green with respect to their foliage (they are ‘green’ with qualification); it would be a mistake to infer that they are green absolutely because they have brown trunks and branches. It is because the difference between using words absolutely and with qualification can be minute that this fallacy is possible, thinks Aristotle.
Begging the question is explained as asking for the answer (the proposition) which one is supposed to prove, in order to avoid having to make a proof of it. Some subtlety is needed to bring about this fallacy such as a clever use of synonymy or an intermixing of particular and universal propositions (Top. VIII, 13). If the fallacy succeeds the result is that there will be no deduction: begging the question and non-cause are directly prohibited by the second and third conditions respectively of being a deduction (SR 6 168b23).
The fallacy of non-cause occurs in contexts of ad impossibile arguments when one of the assumed premises is superfluous for deducing the conclusion. The superfluous premise will then not be a factor in deducing the conclusion and it will be a mistake to infer that it is false since it is a non-cause of the impossibility. This is not the same fallacy mentioned by Aristotle in the Rhetoric (II 24) which is more akin to a fallacy of empirical causation and is better called false cause (see Woods and Hansen 2001).
Aristotle’s fallacy of many questions occurs when two questions are asked as if they are one proposition. A proposition is “a single predication about a single subject” (SR 6 169a8). Thus with a single answer to two questions one has two premises for a refutation , and one of them may turn out to be idle, thus invalidating the deduction (it becomes a non-cause fallacy). Also possible is that extra-linguistic part-whole mistakes may happen when, for example, given that something is partly good and partly not-good, the double question is asked whether it is all good or all not-good? Either answer will lead to a contradiction (see Schreiber 2000, 156–59). Despite its name, this fallacy consists in the ensuing deduction, not in the question which merely triggers the fallacy.
On one interpretation ignoratio elenchi is considered to be Aristotle’s thirteenth fallacy, in which an otherwise successful deduction fails to end with the required contradictory of the answerer’s thesis. Seen this way, ignoratio elenchi is unlike all the other fallacies in that it is not an argument that fails to meet one of the criteria of a good deduction, but a genuine deduction that turns out to be irrelevant to the point at issue. On another reading, ignoratio elenchi is not a separate fallacy but an alternative to the language dependent / language independent way of classifying the other twelve fallacies: they all fail to meet, in one way or another, the requirements of a sound refutation.
[A] refutation is a contradiction of one and the same predicate, not of a name but of a thing, and not of a synonymous name but of an identical name, based on the given premises and following necessarily from them (the original point at issue not being included) in the same respect, manner and time. (SR 5 167a23–27)
Each of the other twelve fallacies is analysed as failing to meet one of the conditions in this definition of refutation (SR 6). Aristotle seems to favour this second reading, but it leaves the problem of explaining how refutations that miss their mark can seem like successful refutations. A possible explanation is that a failure to contradict a given thesis can be made explicit by adding the negation of the thesis as a last step of the deduction, thereby insuring the contradiction of the thesis, but only at the cost (by the last step) of introducing one of the other twelve fallacies in the deduction.
2.1.5 Different interpretations
I have given only the briefest possible explanation of Aristotle’s fallacies. To really understand them a much longer engagement with the original text and the secondary sources is necessary. The second chapter of Hamblin’s (1970) book is a useful introduction to the Sophistical Refutations, and a defence of the dialectical nature of the fallacies. Hamblin thinks that a dialectical framework is indispensable for an understanding of Aristotle’s fallacies and that part of the poverty of contemporary accounts of fallacies is due to a failure to understand their assumed dialectical setting. This approach to the fallacies is continued in contemporary research by some argumentation theorists, most notably Douglas Walton (1995) who also follows Aristotle in recognizing a number of different kinds of dialogues in which argumentation can occur; Frans van Eemeren and Rob Grootendorst (2004) who combine dialectical and pragmatic insights with an ideal model of a critical discussion; and Jaakko Hintikka who analyses the Aristotelian fallacies as mistakes in question-dialogues (Hintikka 1987; Bachman 1995.) According to Hintikka (1997) it is an outright mistake to think of Aristotle’s fallacies primarily as mistaken inferences, either deductive or inductive. A non-dialogue oriented interpretation of Aristotle fallacies is found in Woods and Hansen (1997 and 2001) who argue that the fallacies (apparent deductions) are basic to apparent refutations, and that Aristotle’s interest in the fallacies extended beyond dialectical contests, as is shown by his interest in them in the Prior Analytics and the Rhetoric (II 24). What gives unity to Aristotle’s different fallacies on this view is not a dialogue structure but rather their dependence on the concepts of deduction and proof. The most thorough recent study of these questions is in Schreiber (2003), who emphasizes Aristotle’s concern with resolving (exposing) fallacies and argues that it is Aristotelian epistemology and metaphysics that is needed for a full understanding of the fallacies in the Sophistical Refutations.
Francis Bacon deserves a brief mention in the history of fallacy theory, not because he made any direct contribution to our knowledge of the fallacies but because of his attention to prejudice and bias in scientific investigation, and the effect they could have on our beliefs. He spoke of false idols (1620, aphorisms 40–44) as having the same relation to the interpretation of nature that fallacies have to logic. The idol of the tribe is human nature which distorts our view of the natural world (it is a false mirror). The idol of the cave is the peculiarity of each individual man, our different abilities and education that affect how we interpret nature. The idols of the theatre are the acquired false philosophies, systems and methods, both new and ancient, that rule men’s minds. These three idols all fall into the category of explanations of why we may misperceive the world. A fourth of Bacon’s idols, the idol of the market place, is the one that comes closest to the Aristotelian tradition as it points to language as the source of our mistaken ideas: “words plainly force and overrule the understanding, and throw all into confusion, and lead men away into numberless empty controversies and idle fancies” (1620, aphorism 43). Although Bacon identifies no particular fallacies in Aristotle’s sense, he opens the door to the possibility that there may be false assumptions associated with the investigation of the natural world. The view of The New Organon is that just as logic is the cure for fallacies, so will the true method of induction be a cure for the false idols.
2.3 Arnauld and Nicole
Antoine Arnauld and Pierre Nicole were the authors of Logic, or the Art of Thinking (1662), commonly known as the Port-Royal Logic. According to Benson Mates (1965, 214) it “is an outstanding early example of the ‘how to think straight’ genre.” The work includes chapters on sophisms, with the justification that “examples of mistakes to be avoided are often more striking than the examples to be imitated” (Bk. III, xix). The Port-Royal Logic does not continue Aristotle’s distinction between fallacies that are dependent on language and those that are not; instead there is a division between sophisms associated with scientific subjects (ibid.)—these are nearly all from the Sophistical Refutations—and those committed in everyday life and ordinary discourse (Bk III, xx). The division is not exclusive, with some of the sophisms fitting both classes.
The Port-Royal Logic includes eight of Aristotle’s original thirteen fallacies, several of them modified to fit the bent to natural philosophy rather than dialectical argumentation. Several kinds of causal errors are considered under the broad heading, non causa pro causa and they are illustrated with reference to scientific explanations that have assigned false causes for empirical phenomena. Also identified as a common fallacy of the human mind is post hoc, ergo propter hoc: “This happened following a certain thing, hence that thing must be its cause” (Bk. III, xix 3). Begging the questions is included and illustrated, interestingly, with examples drawn from Aristotelian science. Two new sophisms are included: one is imperfect enumeration, the error of overlooking an alternative, the other is a faulty (incomplete) induction, what we might call hasty generalization. Although the discussions here are brief, they mark the entry of inductive fallacies into the pool of present day recognized fallacies. Ignoratio elenchi retains its dialogical setting but is extended beyond the mere failure to contradict a thesis, “to attribut[ing] to our adversaries something remote from their views to gain an advantage over them, or to impute to them consequences we imagine can be drawn from their doctrines, although they disavow and deny them” (Bk. III, xix 1). The other Aristotelian fallacies included are accident, combination and division, secundum quid and ambiguity.
The sophisms of everyday life and ordinary discourse are eight in number and two of them, the sophisms of authority and manner, should be noticed. In these sophisms, external marks of speakers contribute to the persuasiveness of their arguments. Although authority is not to be doubted in church doctrines, in matters that God has left to the discernment of humans we can be led away from the truth by being too deferential. Here we find one of the earliest statements of the modern appeal to false authority: people are often persuaded by certain qualities that are irrelevant to the truth of the issue being discussed. Thus there are a number of people who unquestioningly believe those who are the oldest and most experienced, even in matters that depend neither on age nor experience, but only on mental insight (Bk. III, xx 6). To age and experience Arnauld and Nicole add noble birth as an unwarranted source of deference in matters intellectual (Bk. III, xx 7), and towards the end of their discussion they add the sophism of manner, cautioning that “grace, fluency, seriousness, moderation and gentleness” is not necessarily a mark of truth (Bk. III, xx 8). The authors seem to have the rhetorical flourishes of royal courtiers especially in mind.
It is John Locke who is credited with intentionally creating a class of ad-arguments, and inadvertently giving birth to the class of ad-fallacies. In An Essay Concerning Human Understanding (1690), he identified three kinds of arguments, the ad verecundiam, ad ignorantiam, and ad hominem arguments, each of which he contrasted with ad judicium arguments which are arguments based on “the foundations of knowledge and probability” and are reliable routes to truth and knowledge. Locke did not speak of ad-arguments as fallacies—that was left to others to do later—but rather as kinds of arguments “that men, in their reasoning with others, do ordinarily make use of to prevail on their assent; or at least so to awe them as to silence their opposition.” (Bk IV, xvii, 19–22).
Two of the ad arguments have developed beyond how Locke originally conceived them. His characterization of the ad verecundiam is considered the locus classicus of appeal-to-authority arguments. When it is a fallacy it is either on the ground that authorities (experts) are fallible or for the reason that appealing to authority is an abandonment of an individual’s epistemic responsibility. It seems unlikely, however, that Locke thought we should never rely on the expertise and superior knowledge of others when engaged in knowledge-gathering and argumentation. This leads us to consider what kind of authority Locke might have had in mind. In addition to epistemic and legal (command) authority there is also what might be called social authority, demanding respect and deference from others due to one’s higher social standing, something much more a part of seventeenth-century society than it is a part of ours. The language that Locke used in connection with the ad verecundiam, words like ‘eminency’, ‘dignity’, ‘breach of modesty’, and ‘having too much pride’ suggests that what he had in mind was the kind of authority that demands respect for the social standing of sources rather than for their expertise; hence, by this kind of authority a person could be led to accept a conclusion because of their modesty or shame, more so than for the value of the argument (see Goodwin 1998, Hansen 2006). Hence, we understand Locke better when we translate ad verecundiam literally, as “appeal to modesty.”
The argumentum ad hominem, as Locke defined it, has subsequently developed into three different fallacies. His original description was that it was a way “to press a man with consequences drawn from his own principles or concessions.” That is, to argue that an opponent’s view is inconsistent, logically or pragmatically, with other things he has said or to which he is committed. Locke’s observation was that such arguments do not advance us towards truth, but that they can serve to promote agreement or stall disagreement. To argue that way is not a fallacy but an acceptable mode of argumentation. Henry Johnstone (1952) thought it captured the essential character of philosophical argumentation. The modern descendants of the Lockean ad hominem are the abusive ad hominem which is an argument to the effect that a position should not be accepted because of some telling negative property of its espouser; the circumstantial ad hominem, an argument to the effect that someone’s position should be rejected because circumstances suggest that their view is the result of self-interested bias; and finally, the tu quoque ad hominem argument which attempts to deflect a criticism by pointing out that it applies equally to the accuser. Recent scholarship suggests that these post-Lockean kinds of ad hominem arguments are sometimes used fairly, and sometimes fallaciously; but none of them is what Locke described as the argumentum ad hominem.
Ad ignorantiam translates as “appeal to ignorance.” Locke’s characterization of this kind of argument is that it demands “the adversary to admit what they allege as a proof, or to assign a better.” The ignorance in question is comparative, it is not that the opponent has no evidence, it is that s/he has no better evidence. However, the inability of an opponent to produce a better argument is not sufficient reason to think the proponent’s argument must be accepted. Modern versions of this kind of argument take it as a fallacy to infer a proposition to be true because there is no evidence against it (see Krabbe, 1995).
The introduction and discussion of the ad-arguments appears almost as an afterthought in Locke’s Essay. It is found at the end of the chapter, “Of Reason,” in which Locke devotes considerable effort to criticizing syllogistic logic. Reasoning by syllogisms, he maintained, was neither necessary nor useful for knowledge. Locke clearly thought that the three ad-arguments were inferior to ad judicium arguments, but he never used the term ‘fallacy’ in connection with them, although he did use it in connection with errors of syllogistic reasoning.
Was Locke the first to discuss these kinds of arguments? Hamblin (1970, 161–62) and Nuchelmans (1993) trace the idea of ad hominem arguments back to Aristotle, and Locke’s remark that the name argumentum ad hominem was already known has been investigated by Finocchiaro (1974) who finds the term and the argument kind in Galileo’s writings more than a half-century before the Essay Concerning Human Understanding. And Arnauld and Nicole’s discussion of the sophism of authority, that “people speak the truth because they are of noble birth or wealthy or in high office,” which seems to be part of Locke’s ad verecundiam, was most likely known to him. Subsequently more ad-arguments were added to the four that Locke identified (see Watts, and Copi, below).
Isaac Watts in his Logick; or, The Right Use of Reason (1724), furthered the ad-argument tradition by adding three more arguments: argumentum ad fidem (appeal to faith), argumentum ad passiones (appeal to passion), and argumentum ad populum (a public appeal to passions). Like Locke, Watts does not consider these arguments as fallacies but as kinds of arguments. However, the Logick does consider sophisms and introduces “false cause” as an alternative name for non causa pro causa which here, as in the Port-Royal Logic, is understood as a fallacy associated with empirical causation. According to Watts it occurs whenever anyone assigns “the reasons of natural appearances, without sufficient experiments to prove them” (1796, Pt. III, 3 i 4). Another sophism included by Watts is imperfect enumeration or false induction, the mistake of generalizing on insufficient evidence. Also, the term ‘strawman fallacy’ may have its origins in Watts’s discussion of ignoratio elenchi: after having dressed up the opinions and sentiments of their adversaries as they please to make “images of straw”, disputers “triumph over their adversary as though they had utterly confuted his opinions” (1796, Pt. III 3 i 1).
Jeremy Bentham’s Handbook of Political Fallacies (1824) was written in the years leading up to the first Reform Bill (1832). His interest was in political argumentation, particularly in exposing the different means used by parliamentarians and law makers to defeat or delay reform legislation. Hence, it was not philosophy or science that interested him, but political debate. Fallacies he took to be arguments or topics that would through the use of deception produce erroneous beliefs in people (1824, 3). These tactics he (or his editor) divided into four classes: fallacies of authority, danger, delay and confusion. Bentham was aware of the developing ad-fallacies tradition since each of the thirty or so fallacies he described is also labelled as belonging either to the kind ad verecundiam (appeal to shame or modesty), ad odium (appeal to hate or contempt), ad metum (appeal to fear or threats), ad quietem (appeal to rest or inaction), ad judicium, and ad socordiam (appeal to postponement or delay). Most of Bentham’s fallacies have not become staples of fallacy theory but many of them show interesting insights into the motives and techniques of debaters (see e.g., Rudanko’s (2005, 2009) analyses of the ad socordiam).
Bentham’s Handbook has not taken a central place in the history of fallacy studies (Hamblin 1970, 165–69); nevertheless, it is historically interesting in several respects. It discusses authority at length, identifying four conditions for reliable appeals to authority and maintaining that the failure of any one of them cancels the strength of the appeal. Fallacies of authority in political debate occur when authority “is employed in the place of such relevant arguments as might have been brought forward” (1824, 25). Bentham’s fear is that debaters will resort to “the authority” of traditional beliefs and principles instead of considering the advantages of the reform measures under discussion.
Under the heading “fallacies of danger” Bentham named a number of what he called vituperative fallacies—imputations of bad character, bad motive, inconsistency, and suspicious connections—which have as their common characteristic, “the endeavour to draw aside attention from the measure to the man, in such a way as to cause the latter’s badness to be imputed to the measure he supports, or his goodness to his opposition” (1824, 83). This characterization fits well with the way we have come to think of the ad hominem fallacy as a view disparaged by putting forth a negative characterization of its supporter or his circumstances.
Bentham places the fallacies in the immediate context of debate, identifying ways in which arguers frustrate the eventual resolution of disagreements by using insinuations of danger, delaying tactics, appeals to questionable authorities and, generally, confusing issues. Modern argumentation theorists who hold that any impediment to the successful completion of dialogical discussions is a fallacy, may find that their most immediate precursor was Bentham (see Grootendorst 1997).
Book III of Richard Whately’s Elements of Logic (1826) is devoted to giving an account of fallacies based on “logical principles,”. Whately was instrumental in the revival of interest in logic at the beginning of the nineteenth century and, being committed to deductivism, he maintained that only valid deductive inferences counted as reasoning. Thus, he took every fallacy to belong to either the class of deductive failures (logical fallacies) or the class of non-logical failures (material fallacies).
By ‘fallacy’ Whately meant “any unsound mode of arguing, which appears to demand our conviction, and to be decisive of the question at hand, when in fairness it is not”’ (Bk. III, intro.). The logical fallacies divide into the purely logical and the semi-logical fallacies. The purely logical fallacies are plain violations of syllogistic rules like undistributed middle and illicit process. The semi-logical fallacies mostly trade on ambiguous middle terms and are therefore also logical fallacies, but their detection requires extra-logical knowledge including that of the senses of terms and knowledge of the subject matter (Bk. III, §2); they include, among others, the fallacies of ambiguity, and division and composition. The non-logical, material fallacies are also divided into two classes: fallacies with premises ‘unduly assumed,’ and fallacies of irrelevant conclusions. Begging the question fits under the heading of a non-logical, material fallacy in which a premise has been unduly assumed, and ignoratio elenchi is a non-logical, material fallacy in which an irrelevant conclusion has been reached. The ad-arguments are all placed under the last division as variants of ignoratio elenchi, but they are said to be fallacies only when they are used unfairly. Whately’s version of the ad hominem argument resembles Locke’s in that it is an ex concessis kind of argument: one that depends on the concessions of the person with whom one is arguing. From the concessions, one might prove that one’s opponent is ‘committed to p,’ but an attempt to make it seem as if this constitutes a proof of the absolute (non-relative) proposition ‘p’ would be a fallacy. This kind of ad hominem fallacy can be seen as falling under the broader ignoratio elenchi category because what is proved is not what is needed.
The creation of the category of non-logical fallacies was not really a break with Aristotle as much as it was a break with what had become the Aristotelian tradition. Aristotle thought that some fallacies were due to unacceptable premises although these are not elaborated in Sophistical Refutations (see section 2.1.1 above). Whately’s creation of the category of non-logical fallacies solved the problem of what to do with begging the question which is not an invalid form of argument, and it also created a place in fallacy taxonomy for the ad-fallacies.
John Stuart Mill’s contribution to the study of fallacies is found in Book V of his comprehensive A System of Logic, Ratiocinative and Inductive, first published in 1843. It stands out most strikingly for placing the study of fallacies within his framework of inductive reasoning, a direct rejection of Whately’s deductivist approach to reasoning and fallacies. Mill held that only inductive reasoning counts as inferring and accordingly he introduces new categories as well as a new classification scheme for fallacies.
Mill drew a division between the moral and the intellectual causes of fallacies. The former are aspects of human nature such as biases and indifference to truth which incline us to make intellectual mistakes. These dispositions are not themselves fallacies. It is the intellectual errors, the actual taking of insufficient evidence as sufficient, that are fallacious. The various ways in which this can happen are what Mill took as the basis for classifying fallacies. “A catalogue of the varieties of evidence which are not real evidence,” he wrote, “is an enumeration of fallacies” (1891, Bk.V iii §1).
Mill divided the broad category of argument fallacies into two groups: those in which the evidence is distinctly conceived and those in which it is indistinctly conceived. Fallacies falling under evidence indistinctly conceived (Bk. V, vii) were further described as fallacies of confusion. These result from an indistinct conception of the evidence leading to a mistaking of its significance and thereby to an unsupported conclusion. Some of the traditional Aristotelian fallacies such as ambiguity, composition and division, petitio principii, and ignoratio elenchi, are placed in this category. Although Mill followed Whately closely in his exposition of the fallacies of confusion, he does not mention any ad-arguments in connection with ignoratio elenchi.
As for the category of fallacies of evidence distinctly conceived, it too is divided. The two sub-classes are fallacies of ratiocination (deduction) and fallacies of induction. The deductive fallacies (Bk.V, vi) are those that explicitly break a rule of the syllogism, such as the three-term rule. But also included are the conversion of universal affirmatives and particular negatives (“All PS” does not follow from “All SP,” and “Some P not S” does not follow from “Some S not P”). Also included in this category is the secundum quid fallacy.
The other sub-class of fallacies distinctly conceived bring out what is distinctive about Mill’s work on the fallacies: that it is the first extensive attempt to deal with fallacies of induction. He divided inductive fallacies into two further groups: fallacies of observation (V, iv) and fallacies of generalization (Bk. V, v). Fallacies of observation can occur either negatively or positively. Their negative occurrence consists in non-observation in which one has overlooked negatively relevant evidence. This is similar to what the Port-Royal Logic considered a faulty enumeration, and one of Mill’s examples is the continued faith that farmers put in the weather forecasts found in almanacs despite their long history of false predictions. Observation fallacies occur positively when the mistake is based on something that is seen wrongly, i.e., taken to be something that it is not. Such mal-observations occur when we mistake our inferences for facts, as in our inference that the sun rises and sets (Bk. V, iv, 5).
Fallacies of generalization, the other branch of inductive fallacies, result from mistakes in the inductive process which can happen in several ways. As one example, Mill pointed to making generalizations about what lies beyond our experience: we cannot infer that the laws that operate in remote parts of the universe are the same as those in our solar system (Bk. V, v, 2). Another example is mistaking empirical laws stating regularities for causal laws—his example was because women as a class have not hitherto equalled men as a class, they will never be able to do so (Bk. V, v, 4). Also placed in the category of fallacies of generalization is post hoc ergo propter hoc, which tends to single out a single cause when there are in reality many contributing causes (Bk. V, v, 5). Analogical arguments are identified as a false basis for generalizations; they are “at best only admissible as an inconclusive presumption, where real proof is unattainable” (Bk. V, v, 6).
Mill also included what he calls fallacies of inspection, or a priori fallacies (Bk. V, iii) in his survey of fallacies. These consist of non-inferentially held beliefs, so they fit the belief conception of fallacies rather than the argument conception. Among Mill’s examples of a priori fallacies are metaphysical assumptions such as that distinctions of language correspond to distinctions in nature, and that objects cannot affect each other at a distance. Even the belief in souls or ghosts is considered an a priori fallacy. Such beliefs will not withstand scrutiny, thought Mill, by the inductive method strictly applied.
A System of Logic is the most extensive work on fallacies since Aristotle’s Sophistical Refutations. Mill’s examples are taken from a wide range of examples in science, politics, economics, religion and philosophy. His classificatory scheme is original and comprehensive. Frederick Rosen (2006) argues that Mill’s pre-occupation with the detection and prevention of fallacies is part of what motivates the celebrated second chapter of On Liberty. Despite these considerations, the Logic is not much referenced by fallacy theorists.
Irving Copi’s Introduction to Logic—an influential text book from the mid-twentieth century—defines a fallacy as “a form of argument that seems to be correct but which proves, upon examination, not to be so.” (1961, 52) The term ‘correct’ is sufficiently broad to allow for both deductive invalidity, inductive weakness, as well as some other kinds of argument failure. Of the eighteen informal fallacies Copi discusses, eleven can be traced back to the Aristotelian tradition, and the other seven to the burgeoning post-Lockean ad-fallacy tradition.
The first division in Copi’s classification is between formal and informal fallacies. Formal fallacies are invalid inferences which “bear a superficial resemblance” to valid forms of inference, so these we may think of as deductive fallacies. They include affirming the consequent, denying the antecedent, the fallacy of four terms, undistributed middle, and illicit major. Informal fallacies are not characterized as resembling formally valid arguments; they gain their allure some other way. One division of informal fallacies is the fallacies of relevance which are “errors in reasoning into which we may fall because of carelessness and inattention to our subject matter” (1961, 53). This large class of fallacies includes accident, converse accident, false cause, petitio principii, complex question, ignoratio elenchi, ad baculum, ad hominem abusive, ad hominem circumstantial, ad ignorantiam, ad misericordiam, ad populum, and ad verecundiam. The other division of informal fallacies is called fallacies of ambiguity and it includes equivocation, amphiboly, accent, composition and division.
It seems that Copi took Whately’s category of semi-logical fallacies and moved them under a new heading of ‘informal fallacies,’ presumably for the reason that extra-logical knowledge is needed to uncover their invalidity. This has the result that the new wide category of informal fallacies is a mixed bag: some of them are at bottom logical failures (equivocation, composition, ad misericordiam) and some are logically correct but frustrate proof (begging the question, ignoratio elenchi). Copi’s classification, unlike Whately’s which sought to make a distinction on logical grounds, may be seen as based on three ways that fallacies resemble good arguments: formal fallacies have invalid forms that resemble valid forms, fallacies of ambiguity resemble good arguments through the ambiguity of terms, and fallacies of relevance exploit psychological (non-logical) associations. Hence, we may think of Copi’s divisions as between logical, semantic and psychological fallacies.
Copi’s treatment of the fallacies is a fair overview of the traditional list of fallacies, albeit he did not pretend to do any more than give an introduction to existing fallacy-lore for beginning logic students. Hamblin (1970, ch. 1) criticized Copi’s work, along with that of several others, and gave it the pejorative name, “the standard treatment of fallacies.” His criticisms rang true with many of his readers, thereby provoking contempt for the traditional treatment of fallacies as well as stimulating research in what we may call the new, or post-Hamblin, era, of fallacy studies. Let us next consider some of these developments.
3. New approaches to fallacies
3.1 Renewed interest
A common complaint since Whately’s Elements of Logic is that our theory and teaching of fallacies are in want of improvement—he thought they should be put on a more logical footing to overcome the loose and vague treatments others had proffered.
It is on Logical principles therefore that I propose to discuss the subject of Fallacies. … the generality of Logical writers have usually followed so opposite a plan. Whenever they have to treat of anything that is beyond the mere elements of Logic, they totally lay aside all reference to the principles they have been occupied in establishing and explaining, and have recourse to a loose, vague, and popular kind of language … [which is] … strangely incongruous in a professional Logical treatise. (1875, III, intro.)
Charles Hamblin’s 1970 book, Fallacies, revives Whately’s complaint. We may view Fallacies as the dividing line between traditional approaches to the study of fallacies and new, contemporary approaches. At the time of its publication it was the first book-length work devoted to fallacies in modern times. The work opens with a critique of the standard treatment of fallacies as it was found in mid-twentieth century textbooks; then, in subsequent chapters, it takes a historical turn reviewing Aristotle’s approach to fallacies and exploring the tradition it fostered (as in the previous section of this entry). Other historically-oriented chapters include one on the Indian tradition, and one on formal fallacies. Hamblin’s more positive contributions to fallacy studies are concentrated in the book’s later chapters on the concept of argument, formal dialectics, and equivocation.
What Hamblin meant by “the standard treatment of fallacies” was:
The typical or average account as it appears in the typical short chapter or appendix of the average modern textbook. And what we find in most cases, I think it should be admitted, is as debased, worn-out and dogmatic a treatment as could be imagined—incredibly tradition bound, yet lacking in logic and in historical sense alike, and almost without connection to anything else in modern Logic at all. (1970, 12)
Let us consider what came before Hamblin as the traditional approach to fallacies and what comes after him as new approaches. The new approaches (since the 1970’s) show a concern to overcome Hamblin’s criticisms, and they also vie with each to produce the most defensible alternative to the traditional approach. One thing that nearly all the new approaches have in common is that they reject what Hamblin presents as the nearly universally accepted definition of “fallacy” as an argument “that seems to be valid but is not so” (1970, 12). Although this definition of fallacy is not nearly as widely accepted as Hamblin intimated (see Hansen 2002), others have taken to calling it “the standard definition of fallacies” and for convenience we can refer to it as SDF. SDF has three necessary conditions: a fallacy (i) is an argument, (ii) that is invalid, and (iii) appears to be valid. These can be thought of as the argument condition, the invalidity condition and the appearance condition. All three conditions have been brought into question.
3.2 Doubts about fallacies
Maurice Finocchiaro continued Hamblin’s criticism of the modern textbook treatment of fallacies, observing that they contain very few examples of actual fallacies, leading him to doubt the validity of ‘fallacy’ as a genuine logical category. Although he allows that errors in reasoning are common in real life, he thinks that “types of logically incorrect arguments”—fallacies—are probably not common (1981, 113). For that reason Finocchiaro prefers to speak of fallacious arguments—by which he means arguments in which the conclusion fails to follow from the premises—rather than fallacies (1987, 133). He further distances himself from SDF by not considering the appearance condition.
Finocchiaro distinguishes six ways in which arguments can be fallacious. (1) Formal fallaciousness is simply the case where the conclusion does not follow validly from the premises; this type of error can be demonstrated by producing a suitable analogous counter-example in which the premises are true and the conclusion is false. (2) Explanatory fallaciousness occurs when a specified conclusion follows with no more certainty from the given premises than does a rival conclusion; it occurs most often in the context of proposing explanatory hypotheses. (3) Presuppositional fallaciousness occurs in those cases where an argument depends on a false presupposition; this kind of fallaciousness is demonstrated by making a sound argument showing the presupposition to be false. (4) Positive fallaciousness occurs when the given premises, complemented by other propositions taken as true, are shown to support a conclusion inconsistent with the given conclusion. (5) Semantical fallaciousness results from the ambiguity of terms; the conclusion will follow if the sense given to the term in the premises makes the premises false, but if the other sense is ascribed to the term, making the premises true, the conclusion does not follow (it becomes an instance of formal fallaciousness). (6) Finally, Finocchiaro singles out persuasive fallaciousness, in which the conclusion does not follow from the premises because it is the same as one of the premises. As a test of completeness of this six-fold division of fallaciousness, Finocchiaro (1987) observes that it is adequate to classify all the kinds of errors which Galileo found in the arguments of the defenders of the geocentric view of the solar system.
Gerald Massey (1981) has voiced a strong objection to fallacy theory and the teaching of fallacies. He argues that there is no theory of invalidity—no systematic way to show that an argument is invalid other than to show that it has true premises and a false conclusion (1981, 164). Hence, there is an asymmetry between proving arguments valid and proving them invalid: they are valid if they can be shown to be an instance of a valid form, but they are not proved invalid by showing that they are an instance of an invalid form, because both valid and invalid arguments instantiate invalid forms. Thus, showing that a natural language argument is an instance of an invalid form does not preclude the possibility that it is also an instance of a valid form, and therefore valid. Since upholders of SDF maintain that fallacies are invalid arguments, Massey’s asymmetry thesis has the consequence that no argument can be convicted of being a fallacy on logical grounds.
3.3 The informal logic approach to fallacies
The informal logic approach to fallacies is taken in Johnson and Blair’s Logical Self-Defence, a textbook first published in 1977. It was prompted in part by Hamblin’s indictment of the standard treatment and it further develops an initiative taken by Kahane (1971) to develop university courses that were geared to everyday reasoning. Johnson and Blair’s emphasis is on arming students to defend themselves against fallacies in everyday discourse, and a fundamental innovation is in their conception of a good argument. In place of a sound argument—a deductively valid argument with true premises—Johnson and Blair posit an alternative ideal of a cogent argument, one whose premises are acceptable, relevant to and sufficient for its conclusion. Acceptability replaces truth as a premise requirement, and the validity condition is split in to two different conditions, premise relevance and premise sufficiency. Acceptability is defined relative to audiences—the ones for whom arguments are intended—but the other basic concepts, relevance and sufficiency, although illustrated by examples, remain as intuitive, undefined concepts (see Tindale, 2007). Premise sufficiency (strength) is akin to probability in that it is a matter of degree but Johnson and Blair do not pursue giving it numerical expression.
The three criteria of a cogent argument, individually necessary and jointly sufficient, lead to a conception of fallacy as “any argument that violates one of the criteria of good argument … and is committed frequently in argumentative discourse” (1993, 317–18). This shares only one condition with SDF: that a fallacy is an argument. (Deductive) validity is replaced with the broader concept sufficiency, and the appearance condition is not included. Johnson (1987) argued that the appearance condition makes the occurrence of fallacies too subjective since how things appear may vary from perceiver to perceiver, and it should therefore be replaced by a frequency requirement. To be a fallacy, a mistake must occur with sufficient frequency to be worth our attention.
The adoption of the concept of a cogent argument as an ideal has several consequences. The category of fallacies with problematic premises (reminiscent of Whately’s “premises unduly assumed”) shows a concern with argument evaluation over and beyond logical or inference evaluation, drawing the informal logic approach away from purely logical concerns towards an epistemic conception of fallacies. Having both sufficiency and relevance as criteria (instead of the single validity criterion) has the benefit of allowing the making of nuanced judgments about the level of premise support: for example, we might say that an argument’s premises, although insufficient, are nevertheless positively relevant to the conclusion. Irrelevant premise fallacies are those with no premise support at all, whereas insufficient premise fallacies are those in which there is some support, but not enough of it. The informal logicians’ conception of fallacies is meant to be broader and more suitable to natural language argumentation than would be a conception tied only to deductive invalidity.
Johnson and Blair concern themselves exclusively with informal fallacies. Many of the familiar Aristotelian fallacies that are part of the standard treatment are missing from their inventory (e.g., accident, composition and division) and the ones retained find themselves in new categories: begging the question and ambiguity are together under the heading of Problematic Premise; appeals to authority and popularity are placed under the heading of Hasty Conclusion fallacies; ad hominem is among the fallacies that belong in the third category, Fallacies of Irrelevant Reason. This new list of fallacies has a different bent than many earlier lists, being more geared to deal with arguments in popular, everyday communication than philosophical or scientific discourse; this is evident both by the omission of some of the traditional fallacies as well as by the introduction of new ones, such as dubious assumption, two wrongs, slippery slope, and faulty analogy.
The kinds of mistakes one can make in reasoning are generally thought to be beyond enumeration and, hence, it has been maintained that there can be no complete stock of fallacies that will guard against every kind of mistake. Johnson and Blair’s approach is responsive to this problem in that it allows the names of the classes of fallacies — ‘unacceptable premise,’ ‘irrelevant reason’ and ‘hasty conclusion’ — to stand for fallacies themselves, fallacies broad-in-scope; i.e., to serve “both as general principles of organization, and as back-ups to fill in any gaps between specific labels belonging within each genus” (1993, 52). Hence, any violation of one of the criteria of a cogent argument can be considered a fallacy.
In addition to this alternative theoretical approach to fallacies built on the three criteria of a cogent argument—an approach also taken up by others—informal logic’s contribution to fallacy studies lies in its attempts to provide better analyses of fallacies, a programme pursued by a large number of researchers, including Govier (1982) on the slippery slope, Wreen (1989) on the ad baculum, Walton (1991) on begging the question, Brinton (1995) on the ad hominem, Freeman (1995) on the appeal to popularity, and Pinto (1995) on post hoc ergo propter hoc.
3.4 The formal approach to informal fallacies
John Woods also despairs of the standard treatment but he sees in it something of importance; namely that the fallacies most often reviewed in introductory level logic textbooks “are a kind of caricature of their associated improprieties, which lie deeply imbedded in human practice” (Woods 1992, 25). The fallacies are then behavioural symptoms of kinds of irrationality to which humans are highly susceptible, and that makes them an important subject for study because they say something about human nature. Therefore, the problem with the standard treatment, according to Woods, is not that it is a misdirected research programme, but rather that it has been poorly carried out, partly because logicians have failed to appreciate that a multi-logical approach is necessary to understand the variety of fallacies. This idea, pursued jointly by Woods and Douglas Walton (1989), is that, for many of the fallacies standard formal logic is inadequate to uncover the unique kind of logical mistakes in question—it is too coarse conceptually to reveal the unique character of many of the fallacies. To get a satisfactory analysis of each of the fallacies they must be matched with a fitting logical system, one that has the facility to uncover the particular logical weakness in question. Inductive logic can be employed for analysis of hasty generalization and post hoc ergo propter hoc; relatedness logic is appropriate for ignoratio elenchi; plausible reasoning theory for the ad verecundiam, and dialectical game theory for begging the question and many questions. Woods (1992, 43) refers to this approach to studying the fallacies as methodological pluralism. Thus, like the informal logicians, there is here an interest in getting the analyses of each of the fallacies right, but the Woods and Walton approach involves embracing formal methods, not putting them aside.
Woods (2013) has continued his research on fallacies, most recently considering them in the context of what he calls a naturalized logic (modelled on Quine’s naturalized epistemology). The main point of this naturalizing move is that a theory of reasoning should take into account the abilities and motivations of reasoners. Past work on the fallacies has identified them as failing to satisfy the rules of either deductive or inductive logic, but Woods now wants to consider the core fallacies in light of what he calls third-way reasoning (comparable to non-monotonic reasoning), an account of the cognitive practices that closely resemble our common inferential practices. From the perspective of third-way reasoning the “rules” implicit in the fallacies present themselves as heuristic directives to reasoners rather than as fallacies; hence, it may be that learning from feedback (having errors corrected) is less trouble than learning the rules to avoid fallacies in the first place (Woods 2013, p. 215). Woods illustrates his point by recalling many of the fallacies he originally identified in his 1992 paper, and subjecting them to this revised model of analysis thereby overturning the view that these types of argument are always to be spurned.
3.5 The epistemic approach to fallacies
SDF may be seen as closely tied to the logical approach to fallacies—the fault in arguments it singles out is their deductive invalidity. But this conception of fallacies turns out to be inadequate to cover the variety of the core fallacies in two ways: it is too narrow because it excludes begging the question which is not invalid, and it is too wide because it condemns good but non-deductive arguments as fallacies (given that they also satisfy the appearance condition) because they are invalid. Even if we replace the invalidity condition in SDF with some less stringent standard of logical weakness which could overcome the “too wide” problem, it would still leave the difficulty of accounting for the fallacy of begging the question unsolved.
Siegel and Biro (1992, 1995) hold an epistemic account of fallacies, contrasting their view with dialectical/rhetorical approaches, because matters extraneous to arguments, such as being a practice that leads to false beliefs or not being persuasive, are not in their view a sufficient condition to make an argument a fallacy. They take the position that “it is a conceptual truth about arguments that their central … purpose is to provide a bridge from known truths or justified beliefs to as yet unknown … truths or as yet unjustified beliefs” (1992, 92). Only arguments that are “epistemically serious” can accomplish this; that is, only arguments that satisfy the extra-formal requirement that premises are knowable independently of their conclusions, and are more acceptable epistemically than their conclusions, can fulfill this function. A purely logical approach to argument will not capture this requirement because arguments of the same valid form, but with different contents, may or may not be epistemically serious, depending on whether the premises are epistemically acceptable relative to the conclusion.
Modifying Biro’s (1977, 265–66) examples we can demonstrate how the requirement of epistemic seriousness plays out with begging the question. Consider these two arguments:
All men are mortal;
Obama is a man;
So, Obama is mortal.
All members of the committee are old Etonians;
Fortesque is a member of the committee;
Fortesque is an old Etonian.
In the first argument the premises are knowable independently of the conclusion. The major premise can be deduced from other universal premises about animals, and the minor premise, unlike the conclusion which must be inferred, can be known by observation. Hence, this argument does not beg the question. However, in the second argument (due to Biro, 1977) given the minor premise, the major cannot be known to be true unless the conclusion is known to be true. Consequently, on the epistemic approach to fallacies taken by Biro and Siegel, the second argument, despite the fact that it is valid, is non-serious, it begs the question, and it is a fallacy. If there was some independent way of knowing whether the major premise was true, such as that it was a bylaw that only old Etonians could be committee members, the argument would be a serious one, and not beg the question.
Biro and Siegel’s epistemic account of fallacies is distinguishable in at least three ways. First, it insists that the function of arguments is epistemic, and therefore anything that counts as a fallacy must be an epistemic fault, a breaking of a rule of epistemic justification. But since logical faults are also epistemic faults, the epistemic approach to fallacies will include logical fallacies, although these must also be explicable in terms of epistemic seriousness. Second, since the epistemological approach does not insist that all justification must be deductive, it allows the possibility of their being fallacies (as well as good arguments) by non-deductive standards, something precluded by SDF. Finally, we notice that the appearance condition is not considered a factor in this discussion of fallacies.
Ulrike Hahn and Mike Oaksford (2006a, 2006b) see themselves as contributing to the epistemic approach to fallacy analysis by developing a probabilistic analysis of the fallacies. It is part of their programme for a normative theory of natural language argumentation. They are motivated by what they perceive as the shortcomings in other approaches. The logical (deductive) approach falls short in that it simply divides arguments into valid and invalid arguments thereby failing to appreciate that natural language arguments come in various degrees of strength. The alternative approaches to fallacies, given by procedural (dialectical) and consensual accounts, they criticize on the basis that they fail to address the central problem raised by the fallacies: that of the strength of the reason-claim complex. In Hahn and Oaksford’s view the strength or weakness of the classical fallacies (they are concerned mostly with the post-Aristotelian ones) is not a result of their structure or their context of use. It is instead a matter of the relationship between the evidence and the claim (the contents of the premises and the conclusion). Evaluation of this relationship is thought to be best captured by a probabilistic Bayesian account; accordingly, they adapt Bayes’ theorem to arguments evaluation with the proviso that the probabilities are subjective degrees of belief, not frequencies. “An argument’s strength,” they write, “is a function of an individual’s initial level of belief in the claim, the availability and observation of confirmatory (or disconfirmatory) evidence, and the existence and perceived strength of competing hypotheses” (Corner, et al. 1145). With Korb (2003) they view a fallacy as an argument with a low probability on the Bayesian model.
Since the variance in input probabilities will result in a range of outputs in argument strength, this probabilistic approach has the potential to assign argument strengths anywhere between 0 and 1, thereby allowing that different tokens of one argument type can vary greatly in strength, i.e., some will be fallacies and others not. Also, and this seems to concur with our experience, different arguers may disagree on the strength of the same arguments since they can differ in the assignments of the initial probabilities. Hahn and Oaksford also claim as advantages for their normative theory that it gives guidance for persuasion since it takes into account the initial beliefs of audiences. Moreover, their approach contributes to the study of belief change; that is, to what extent our confidence in the conclusion changes with the availability of new evidence.
3.6 Dialectical/dialogical approaches to fallacies
Some of the most active new researchers on fallacies take a dialectical and/or dialogical approach. This can be traced back to Hamblin (1970, ch. 8) and Lorenzen’s (1969) dialogue theory. The panacea for fallacies that Whately recommended was more logic; Hamblin, however, proposed a shift from the logical to the dialectical perspective.
[W]e need to extend the bounds of Formal Logic; to include features of dialectical contexts within which arguments are put forward. To begin with, there are criteria of validity of argument that are additional to formal ones: for example, those that serve to proscribe question-begging. To go on with, there are prevalent but false conceptions of the rules of dialogue, which are capable of making certain argumentative moves seem satisfactory and unobjectionable when, in fact, they conceal and facilitate dialectical malpractice. (Hamblin 1970, 254)
The proposal here is to shift the study of fallacies from the contexts of arguments to the contexts of dialogues (argumentation), formulate rules for reasonable dialogue activity, and then connect fallacies to failures of rule-following. Barth and Martens’s paper (1977), which studied the argumentum ad hominem by extending Lorenzen’s dialogue tableaux method to include the definitions of the concepts “line of attack” and “winning strategy,” leads to a conception of fallacies as either failures to meet one of the necessary conditions of rational dialogical argumentation, or failures to satisfy sufficient conditions as specified by production rules of the dialogical method (1977, 96).
The Barth and Martens paper is a bridge between the earlier (quasi-) formal and subsequent informal dialectical theories, and is explicitly acknowledged as a major influence by the Pragma-dialectical theory, the brainchild of Frans van Eemeren and Rob Grootendorst (1984). Rather than beginning from a logical or epistemological perspective they start with the role of argumentation in overcoming interpersonal disagreements. The Pragma-dialecticians propose that inter-personal argumentation can be analysed as two-party-discussions having four analytical stages: a confrontation stage in which the participants become aware of the content of their disagreement; an opening stage in which the parties agree (most likely implicitly) to shared starting points and a set of rules to govern the ensuing discussion; an argumentation stage wherein arguments and doubts about arguments are expressed and recognized; and a final stage in which a decision about the initial disagreement is made, if possible, based on what happened in the argumentation stage.
The Pragma-dialectical theory stipulates a normative ideal of a critical discussion which serves both as a guide to the reconstruction of natural language argumentation, as well as a standard for the evaluation of the analysed product of reconstruction. A set of ten rules has been proposed as constitutive of the critical-discussion ideal, and the proponents of the theory believe that rational arguers would accept them. If followed by both parties to the disagreement, the rules constrain the argumentation decision procedure such that any resolution reached will be deemed reasonable, and “every violation of any of the rules of the discussion procedure for conducting a critical discussion” will be a fallacy (2004, 175). The rules range over all the four stages of argumentation: at the confrontation stage there is a rule which says one may not prevent the other party from expressing their view; for the argumentation stage there is a rule which requires argumentation to be logically strong and in accord with one or another of three general argumentation schemes; at the closing stage there is a rule that the participants themselves are to decide which party was successful based on the quality of the argumentation they have made: if the proponent carries the day, the opponent should acknowledge it, and vice versa.
The Pragma-dialectical theory proposes that each of the core fallacies can be assigned a place as a violation of one of the rules of a critical discussion. For example, the ad baculum fallacy is a form of intimidation that violates the rule that one may not attempt to prevent one’s discussion partner from expressing their views; equivocation is a violation of the rule that formulations in arguments must be clear and unambiguous; post hoc ergo propter hoc violates the rule that arguments must be instances of schemes correctly applied. Moreover, on this theory, since any rule violation is to count as a fallacy this allows for the possibility that there may be hitherto unrecognized “new fallacies.” Among those proposed are declaring a standpoint sacrosanct because that breaks the rule against the freedom to criticize points of view, and evading the burden of proof which breaks the rule that you must defend your standpoint if asked to do so (see van Eemeren 2010, 194).
Clearly not all the rules of critical discussions apply directly to arguments. Some govern other goal-frustrating moves which arguers can make in the course of settling a difference of opinion, such as mis-allocating the burden of proof, asking irrelevant questions, suppressing a point of view, or failing to clarify the meaning of one’s argumentation. In short, the Pragma-dialectical rules of a critical discussion are not just rules of logic or epistemology, but rules of conduct for rational discussants, making the theory more like a moral code than a set of logical principles. Accordingly, this approach to fallacies rejects all three of the necessary conditions of SDF: a fallacy need not be an argument, thus the invalidity condition will not apply either, and the appearance condition is excluded because of its subjective character (Van Eemeren and Grootendorst 2004, 175).
The Pragma-dialectical analysis of fallacies as rule-breakings in a procedure for overcoming disagreements has recently been expanded to take account of the rhetorical dimension of argumentation. Pragma-dialectics takes the rhetorical dimension to stem from an arguer’s wish to have their view accepted which leads dialoguers to engage in strategic maneuvering vis-à-vis their dialogue partners. However, this desire must be put in balance with the dialectical requirement of being reasonable; that is, staying within the bounds of the normative demands of critical discussions. The ways of strategic maneuvering identified are basically three: topic selection, audience orientation, and the selection of presentational devices, and these can be effectively deployed at each stage of argumentation (Van Eemeren 2010, 94). “All derailments of strategic maneuvering are fallacies,” writes van Eemeren (2010, 198), “in the sense that they violate one or more of the rules for critical discussion and all fallacies can be viewed as derailments of strategic maneuvering.” This means that all fallacies are ultimately attributable to the rhetorical dimension of argumentation since, in this model, strategic maneuvering is the entry of rhetoric into argumentation discussions. “Because each fallacy has, in principle, sound counterparts that are manifestations of the same mode of strategic maneuvering” it may not appear to be a fallacy and it “may pass unnoticed” (Van Eemeren 2010, 199). Nevertheless, Pragma-dialectics prefers to keep the appearance condition outside the definition of ‘fallacy’, treating the seeming goodness of fallacies as a sometime co-incidental property, rather than an essential one.
Argumentation evaluation on the Pragma-dialectical approach is done with an eye to a single ideal model of argumentation. This approach has been challenged by Douglas Walton who has written more about fallacies and fallacy theory than anyone else. He has published individual monographs on many of the well-known fallacies, among them, Begging the Question (1991), Slippery Slope Arguments (1992), Ad Hominem Arguments (1998), and a comprehensive work on fallacy theory, A Pragmatic Theory of Fallacy (1995). Over the years his views have evolved. He has referred to his theory as “the Pragmatic theory,” and like the Pragma-dialectical theory it has a dialectical/dialogical basis; however, Walton envisions a number of distinct normative dialectical frameworks (persuasion dialogue, inquiry dialogue, negotiation dialogue, etc.) rather than the single model of a critical discussion proposed by Pragma-dialectics. Postulating different kinds of dialogues with different starting points and different goals, thinks Walton, will bring argumentation into closer contact with argumentation reality. At one point Walton had the idea that fallacies happened when there was an illicit shift from one kind of a dialogue to another (1995, 118–23), for example, using arguments appropriate for a negotiation dialogue in a persuasion dialogue, but more recently he has turned to other ways of explicating fallacies.
Although Walton recognizes the class of formal fallacies, his main interest is in informal fallacies, especially the ones associated with argumentation schemes. The idea of an argumentation scheme is central to Walton’s theory. Schemes are patterns of commonly used kinds of defeasible reasoning/argumentation such as appeals to expert opinion and ad hominem arguments. Schemes do not identify fallacies but rather argument kinds that are sometimes used fairly, and, other times, fallaciously. With each kind of scheme is associated a set of critical questions which guide us in deciding whether a given use of an argument is correct, weak or fallacious. So, if we consider:
\(E\) is an expert in subject area \(S\);
\(E\) asserts \(p\) based on \(E\)’s knowledge of \(S\);
to be the scheme for the appeal-to-expertise kind of argument, then there will be a question for each premise: Is \(E\) really an expert in \(S\)? Did \(E\) say \(p\) when s/he was acting in her/his professional capacity? (… or did s/he blurt it out while drunk at an association party?). If the answer to both questions is Yes, then the argument creates a presumption for the conclusion—but not a guarantee, for the reasoning is defeasible: other information may come to light that will override the presumption. If one of the questions cannot be answered clearly this is an indication that the argument is weak, and answering No to either of the two questions cancels the presumption for the conclusion, i.e., makes the argument into a bad argument from expert opinion. If the bad argument has “a semblance of correctness about it in [the] context, and poses a serious obstacle to the realization of the goal of the dialog,” then it is a fallacy (2011, 380).
The definition of fallacy Walton proposes (1995, 255) has five parts. A fallacy:
- an argument (or at least something that purports to be an argument) that
- falls short of some standard of correctness;
- is used in a context of dialogue;
- has a semblance of correctness about it; and
- poses a serious problem to the realization of the goal of the dialogue.
Here we find that Walton has relaxed two of the necessary conditions of SDF. Purporting to be an argument is enough (it doesn’t really have to be an argument), while falling short of a standard (one that will vary with the kind of dialogue under consideration) replaces the invalidity condition. However, the appearance condition, here expressed as fallacies having a semblance of correctness about them, remains in full force. The two extra conditions added to fallacy are that they occur only in contexts of dialogue and that they frustrate the realization of the goal of the kind of dialogue in which they occur. In insisting on this dialogical dimension, Walton is in full sympathy with those who think that fallacies can only be rightly analysed within a dialectical framework similar to the ones Aristotle originally studied, and later better defined by Hamblin and Lorenzen. Walton volunteers a shorter version of the definition of a fallacy as “a deceptively bad argument that impedes the progress of a dialogue” (1995, 256).
Walton divides fallacies into two kinds: paralogisms and sophisms. A paralogism is “the type of fallacy in which an error of reasoning is typically committed by failing to meet some necessary requirement of an argumentation scheme” whereas “the sophism type of fallacy is a sophistical tactic used to try to unfairly get the best of a speech partner in an exchange of arguments” (2010, 171; see also 1995, 254). Paralogisms are instances of identifiable argumentation schemes, but sophisms are not. The latter are associated more with infringing a reasonable expectation of dialogue than with failing some standard of argument, (2011, 385; 2010, 175). A further distinction is drawn between arguments used intentionally to deceive and arguments that merely break a maxim of argumentation unintentionally. The former count as fallacies; the latter, less condemnable, are blunders (1995, 235).
Among the informal paralogisms Walton includes: ad hominem, ad populum, ad misericordiam, ad ignorantiam, ad verecundiam, slippery slope, false cause, straw man, argument from consequences, faulty analogy, composition and division. In the category of sophisms he places ad baculum, complex question, begging the question, hasty generalization, ignoratio elenchi, equivocation, amphiboly, accent, and secundum quid. He also has a class of formal fallacies very much the same as those identified by Whately and Copi. The largest class in Walton’s classification is the one associated with argumentation schemes and ad-arguments, and these are the ones that he considers to be the most central fallacies. Nearly all the Aristotelian fallacies included find themselves relegated to the less studied categories of sophisms. Taking a long look at the history of fallacies, then, we find that the Aristotelian fallacies are no longer of central importance. They have been replaced by the fallacies associated with the ad-arguments.
Another recent approach comes from virtue argumentation theory (modelled on virtue epistemology). Virtue argumentation theory is characterized by a distinct set of virtues thought to be essential to good argumentation: willingness to engage in argumentation, willingness to listen to others and willingness to modify one’s own position (see, e.g., Cohen 2009). These may be supplemented with epistemic virtues and even in some cases moral virtues. Although virtues and vices are dispositions of arguers and fallacies are arguments, it is claimed that good argumentation generally results from the influence of argumentation virtues and bad argumentation (including the fallacies) arise because of the vices of arguers.
Taking the Aristotelian view that virtues are a mean between opposite kinds of vices, fallacious arguments can be seen as resulting from arguers moving in one or another direction away from a mean of good argumentation. Aberdein (2013, 2016) especially has developed this model for understanding many of the fallacies. We can illustrate the view by considering appeals to expertise: the associated vices might be too little respect for reliable authorities at one extreme and too much deference to authorities at the other extreme. Aberdein develops the fallacies-as-argumentation-vices analysis in some detail for other of the ad-arguments and sketches how it might be applied to the other core fallacies, suggesting it can profitably be extended to all of them.
All the fallacies, it is claimed, can be fitted in somewhere in the classification of argumentational vices, but the converse is not true although it is possible to bring to light other shortcomings to which we may fall prey in argumentation. Another aspect of the theory is that it distributes argumentation vices among both senders and audiences. Speakers may infect their arguments with vices when they are, for example, closed minded or lack respect for persons, and audiences can contribute to fallaciousness by letting their receptivity be influenced by naïvety, an over-reliance on common sense, or an unfounded bias against a speaker. Perhaps the development of the virtue argumentation theory approach to fallacies provides a supplement to Mill’s theory of fallacies. He distinguished (1891, V, i, 3) what he called the moral (dispositional) and intellectual causes of fallacy. The study of the argumentative vices envisioned above seems best included under the moral study of fallacies as the vices can be taken to be the presdisposing causes to commit intellectual mistakes, i.e., misevaluations of the weight of evidence.
4. Current issues in fallacy theory
4.1 The nature of fallacies
A question that continues to dog fallacy theory is how we are to conceive of fallacies. There would be advantages to having a unified theory of fallacies. It would give us a systematic way of demarcating fallacies and other kinds of mistakes; it would give us a framework for justifying fallacy judgments, and it would give us a sense of the place of fallacies in our larger conceptual schemes. Some general definition of ‘fallacy’ is wanted but the desire is frustrated because there is disagreement about the identity of fallacies. Are they inferential, logical, epistemic or dialectical mistakes? Some authors insist that they are all of one kind: Biro and Siegel, for example, that they are epistemic, and Pragma-dialectics that they are dialectical. There are reasons to think that all fallacies do not easily fit into one category.
Together the Sophistical Refutations and Locke’s Essay are the dual sources of our inheritance of fallacies. However, for four reasons they make for uneasy bedfellows. First, the ad fallacies seem to have a built-in dialectical character, which, it can be argued, Aristotle’s fallacies do not have (they are not sophistical refutations but are in sophistical refutations). Second, Aristotle’s fallacies are logical mistakes: they have no appropriate employment outside eristic argumentation whereas the ad-fallacies are instances of ad-arguments, often appropriately used in dialogues. Third, the appearance condition is part of the Aristotelian inheritance but it is not intimately connected with the ad-fallacies tradition. A fourth reason that contributes to the tension between the Aristotelian and Lockean traditions in fallacies is that the former grew out of philosophical problems, largely what are logical and metaphysical puzzles (consider the many examples in Sophistical Refutations), whereas the ad-fallacies are more geared to social and political topics of popular concern, the subject matter that most intrigues modern researchers on fallacy theory.
As we look back over our survey we cannot help but observe that fallacies have been identified in relation to some ideal or model of good arguments, good argumentation, or rationality. Aristotle’s fallacies are shortcomings of his ideal of deduction and proof, extended to contexts of refutation. The fallacies listed by Mill are errors of reasoning in a comprehensive model that includes both deduction and induction. Those who have defended SDF as the correct definition of ‘fallacy’ take logic simpliciter or deductive validity as the ideal of rationality. Informal logicians view fallacies as failures to satisfy the criteria of what they consider to be a cogent argument. Defenders of the epistemic approach to fallacies see them as shortfalls of the standards of knowledge-generating arguments. Finally, those who are concerned with how we are to overcome our disagreements in a reasonable way will see fallacies as failures in relation to ideals of debate or critical discussions.
The standard treatment of the core fallacies has not emerged from a single conception of good argument or reasonableness but rather, like much of our unsystematic knowledge, has grown as a hodgepodge collection of items, proposed at various time and from different perspectives, that continues to draw our attention, even as the standards that originally brought a given fallacy to light are abandoned or absorbed into newer models of rationality. Hence, there is no single conception of good argument or argumentation to be discovered behind the core fallacies, and any attempt to force them all into a single framework, must take efforts to avoid distorting the character originally attributed to each of them.
4.2 The appearance condition
From Aristotle to Mill the appearance condition was an essential part of the conception of fallacies. However, some of the new, post-Hamblin, scholars have either ignored it (Finocchiaro, Biro and Siegel) or rejected it because appearances can vary from person to person, thus making the same argument a fallacy for the one who is taken in by the appearance, and not a fallacy for the one who sees past the appearances. This is unsatisfactory for those who think that arguments are either fallacies or not. Appearances, it is also argued, have no place in logical or scientific theories because they belong to psychology (van Eemeren and Grootendorst, 2004). But Walton (e.g., 2010) continues to consider appearances an essential part of fallacies as does Powers (1995, 300) who insists that fallacies must “have an appearance, however quickly seen through, of being valid.” If the mistake in an argument is not masked by an ambiguity that makes it appear to be a better argument than it really is, Powers denies it is a fallacy.
The appearance condition of fallacies serves at least two purposes. First, it can be part of explanations of why reasonable people make mistakes in arguments or argumentation: it may be due in part to an argument’s appearing to be better than it really is. Second, it serves to divide mistakes into two groups: those which are trivial or the result of carelessness (for which there is no cure other than paying better attention), and those which we need to learn to detect through an increased awareness of their seductive nature. Without the appearance condition, it can be argued, no division can be made between these two kinds of errors: either there are no fallacies or all mistakes in argument and/or argumentation are fallacies; a conclusion that some are willing to accept, but which runs contrary to tradition. One can also respond that there is an alternative to using the appearance condition as the demarcation property between fallacies and casual mistakes, namely, frequency. Fallacies are those mistakes we must learn to guard against because they occur with noticeable frequency. To this it may be answered that ‘noticeable frequency’ is vague, and is perhaps best explained by the appearance condition.
On the more practical level, there continues to be discussion about the value of teaching the fallacies to students. Is it an effective way for them to learn to reason well and to avoid bad arguments? One reason to think that it is not effective is that the list of fallacies is not complete, and that even if the group of core fallacies was extended to incorporate other fallacies we thought worth including, we could still not be sure that we had a complete prophylactic against bad arguments. Hence, we are better off teaching the positive criteria for good arguments/ argumentation which give us a fuller set of guidelines for good reasoning. But some (Pragma-dialectics and Johnson and Blair) do think that their stock of fallacies is a complete guard against errors because they have specified a full set of necessary conditions for good arguments/argumentation and they hold that fallacies are just failures to meet one of these conditions.
Another consideration about the value of the fallacies approach to teaching good reasoning is that it tends to make students overly critical and lead them to see fallacies where there are not any; hence, it is maintained we could better advance the instilling of critical thinking skills by teaching the positive criteria of good reasoning and arguments (Hitchcock, 1995). In response to this view, it is argued that, if the fallacies are taught in a non-perfunctory way which includes the explanations of why they are fallacies—which normative standards they transgress—then a course taught around the core fallacies can be effective in instilling good reasoning skills (Blair 1995).
Recently there has been renewed interest in how biases are related to fallacies. Correia (2011) has taken Mill’s insight that biases are predisposing causes of fallacies a step further by connecting identifiable biases with particular fallacies. Biases can influence the unintentional committing of fallacies even where there is no intent to be deceptive, he observes. Taking biases to be “systematic errors that invariably distort the subject’s reasoning and judgment,” the picture drawn is that particular biases are activated by desires and emotions (motivated reasoning) and once they are in play, they negatively affect the fair evaluation of evidence. Thus, for example, the “focussing illusion” bias inclines a person to focus on just a part of the evidence available, ignoring or denying evidence that might lead in another direction. Correia (2011, 118) links this bias to the fallacies of hasty generalization and straw man, suggesting that it is our desire to be right that activates the bias to focus more on positive or negative evidence, as the case may be. Other biases he links to other fallacies.
Thagard (2011) is more concerned to stress the differences between fallacies and biases than to find connections between them. He claims that the model of reasoning articulated by informal logic is not a good fit with the way that people actually reason and that only a few of the fallacies are relevant to the kinds of mistakes people actually make. Thagard’s argument depends on his distinction between argument and inference. Arguments, and fallacies, he takes to be serial and linguistic, but inferences are brain activities and are characterized as parallel and multi-modal. By “parallel” is meant that the brain carries out different processes simultaneously, and by “multi-modal” that the brain uses non-linguistic and emotional, as well as linguistic representations in inferring. Biases (inferential error tendencies) can unconsciously affect inferring. “Motivated inference,” for example, “involves selective recruitment and assessment of evidence based on unconscious processes that are driven by emotional considerations of goals rather than purely cognitive reasoning” (2011, 156). Thagard volunteers a list of more than fifty of these inferential error tendencies. Because motivated inferences result from unconscious mental processes rather than explicit reasoning, the errors in inferences cannot be exposed simply by identifying a fallacy in a reconstructed argument. Dealing with biases requires identification of both conscious and unconscious goals of arguers, goals that can figure in explanations of why they incline to particular biases. “Overcoming people’s motivated inferences,” Thagard concludes, “is therefore more akin to psychotherapy than informal logic” (157), and the importance of fallacies is accordingly marginalized.
In response to these findings, one can admit their relevance to the pedagogy of critical thinking but still recall the distinction between what causes mistakes and what the mistakes are. The analysis of fallacies belongs to the normative study of arguments and argumentation, and to give an account of what the fallacy in a given argument is will involve making reference to some norm of argumentation. It will be an explanation of what the mistake in the argument is. Biases are relevant to understanding why people commit fallacies, and how we are to help them get past them, but they do not help us understand what the fallacy-mistakes are in the first place—this is not a question of psychology. Continued research at this intersection of interests will hopefully shed more light on both biases and fallacies.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
Other Internet Resources
- Curtis, Gary N., Fallacy Files
- Dowden, Bradley, Fallacies, entry in the Internet Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
- Hansen, H.V., and C. Fioret, 2016. A searchable bibliography of fallacies—2016, Informal Logic, 36: 432–72.
- Informal Logic, an open-access journal.
- Labossiere, Michael C., Fallacies, hosted by The Nizkor Project.
- RAIL, a blog about Reasoning, Argumentation, and Informal Logic.
The author would like to thank the executive and subject editors who suggested a way to improve the discussion of begging the question.