Notes to Intersections Between Pragmatist and Continental Feminism

1. The two figures on this list who are considered part of the canon of American philosophy but who are not pragmatists are Whitehead (a process philosopher and British citizen) and Royce (a neo-Hegelian idealist philosopher). Composed in the United States, Whitehead’s process philosophy bears a strong affinity with Dewey’s and James’s pragmatist ontologies, and for that reason, I include continental feminists who draw from his work, such as Donna Haraway, in this essay. I should also mention that Peirce, the “father” of American pragmatism, had an uneasy relationship with the field as it was developed by James and Dewey. In his later writings, Peirce abandoned the term “pragmatism” for that of “pragmaticism,” which he hoped was “ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers” (2000b, 108). Thus like “continental philosophy,” “American pragmatist philosophy” should be understood as something of an umbrella term.

2. For feminist responses to Rorty’s neo-pragmatism that are more skeptical, to varying degrees, of its value for feminism, see Bickford 1993; Fraser 1990a and 1990b; Leland 1988; Lovibond 1992; Schultz 1999; and Wilson 1992. See also Rorty 1991 and 1993 for his two published essays that explicitly address the intersections of pragmatism and feminism.

3. For an additional account of resources that Peirce’s pragmatism offers feminism (but that does not incorporate continental philosophy), see Moen (1991).

4. Kristeva also draws on Peirce’s semiotic categories to develop her notion of “semanalysis” as a theory of the speaking subject. She implicitly disagrees with de Lauretis, however, about the value of his work, (somewhat ironically) accusing him of a narrowness similar to that of which de Lauretis accuses her. Kristeva credits Peirce for having already indicated “[t]he fact that the sign can create an open system of transformation and generation” (1986b, 71) and for having “already been drawn by what [Hegelian] dialectics seemed to promise” (1986a, 31), which is the negativity that she alleges her semiotic account to finally have provided. Nonetheless, she claims that Peirce’s semiosis is part of “[o]ne phase of semiology [that] is now over” (27) because it, like other semiotic systems before Kristeva’s, allegedly is guilty of “the reduction of signifying practices [which include the body and history of the speaking subject] to their systematic aspect” (1986a, 27; emphasis in original).

5. See Sullivan (2001a) for a brief history of pragmatist feminism.

6. For a discussion on Dewey and Haraway on the issue of science, see Gatens-Robinson (1991). For an argument that pragmatism needs to incorporate the insights of feminism, especially that of Irigaray, into its metaphysics, see Kruse (1991). For an account of how Dewey’s pragmatism can help feminists think a utopic future as dynamic and evolving, rather than static and essentialist, see McKenna (2001).

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