Feminist Bioethics

First published Mon Jul 19, 2004; substantive revision Wed Dec 16, 2015

As feminist scholars and activists turned their attention to the rapidly expanding field of bioethics in the second half of the twentieth century, feminist bioethics began to emerge as a new area of academic interest. Utilizing the resources of feminist philosophy, social theory and related fields, feminists have critiqued and extended the prevailing framework(s) of mainstream bioethics. This article considers feminist criticism of mainstream bioethics, and chronicles the evolution and growth of feminist bioethics, considering the areas of scholarship and activism that have informed it; its emergence as a distinctive academic sub-field; its contributions to the analysis of substantive bioethical issues, bioethical theory and methodology; and current, emerging and future areas of activity.

1. Origins of Feminist Bioethics

1.1 The development of bioethics as an academic discipline

Bioethics and second wave feminism both independently gathered momentum during the 1960s, a pivotal era for social transformation in many areas of the world. Something that might be called the bioethics “movement” was first triggered by widespread protest against such gross abuses of medical authority as the Nazi doctors’ experiments on unconsenting concentration camp inmates, culminating in the Nuremberg Doctors’ Trial of 1946 (Weindling 2004), and the Tuskegee Syphilis Study, a forty-year study of poor black men with untreated syphilis in the American Deep South (Reverby 2009). Over the decades since then bioethics has blossomed into an interdisciplinary field that borrows from a cluster of interrelated areas of scholarship including philosophy, theology, law, medicine, and the social and biological sciences, and that (in the United States in particular) has become highly professionalized. Bioethics has generated a massive literature ranging over a broad array of moral problems that arise within biomedical and life science research, the healthcare professions, and the institutions and bodies that deliver healthcare services. Increasingly, its remit goes beyond what are traditionally deemed medical topics to include public health issues and areas of social care that interact with medical and life sciences. Its reach extends from the beginning to the end of human life, to areas of biology and genetics on which medicine draws, to research that seeks to expand the knowledge base of medicine; and many contemporary bioethicists are also interested in the societal impacts of the life sciences in general. In some countries bioethicists now also enjoy considerable professional prestige. Some serve on public policy panels and in medical school faculties, and others have been engaged as consultants to industry. Conferences introduce newcomers to the field and disseminate recent bioethical scholarship. Many professional medical and allied health organizations require bioethics training for certification, while regulations in the United States and other countries now expect medical schools to include research ethics in their curricula. A few bioethicists have even become media celebrities.

And as the field of bioethics has professionalized and diversified, questions have arisen about its direction and focus. Notwithstanding its early attention to instances of exploitation and abuse, some critics have discerned an increasing conservatism in bioethics that neglects the concerns of marginalized groups. These critics argue that with institutionalization, bioethics is losing sight of its radical origins (Holmes 1999; Purdy 2001; Eckenwiler and Cohn 2007). Bioethicists are tending to frame issues and formulate theory from the vantage point of privileged social and professional groups, even in the developing regions of the world as local bioethicists there seek a share in the prestige of high technology medicine (Salles and Bertomeu 2002; Luna 2006). During the 1980s, feminists in particular argued that bioethics was developing in a way that gave too little attention to gender-specific disparities in healthcare research and therapy, or to the effects of other power disparities, such as class and ethnicity, on quality of healthcare.

1.2 The emergence and early days of feminist bioethics

By the early 1990s, feminist bioethics had emerged as a distinctive academic concentration offering sustained critique of mainstream bioethics. These critiques evolved out of several lines of influence. One was the late twentieth century women’s health movement.. In the early years of second wave feminism, activist feminists directed attention to areas of health care where women’s interests were most obvious, and yet were severely neglected: access to birth control and abortion, pregnancy, and the control of representations of female sexuality. An upsurge of concern about sexist biases in medical research and practice was rekindled by the protest movements of the 1960s and awareness of the increasing medicalization and commodification of women’s bodies. Public notice of the widespread and, it has to be said, continuing under-representation of women in clinical trials increased that momentum (Baylis, Downie and Sherwin 1999). Feminists campaigned on clinical issues with direct relevance to women’s biology: for increased research into breast cancer, more convenient and cheaper contraceptive methods, more research into the physiology of menopause, and the avoidance of unnecessary surgical interventions (e.g., hysterectomies, cesarean sections, radical mastectomies) where less alternatives are available. These campaigns were supported by several advocacy groups in the United States, United Kingdom and elsewhere, and later on by a number of global women’s health movements. These groups and movements struggled to raise public awareness of women’s health issues, influence national health policy, and act as a counterbalance to the priorities of professional medicine and the pharmaceutical industry.

Engaging with these activist concerns, feminists drew on late twentieth century scholarship in feminist moral and social theory that utilizes sex, gender, and other marginalizing characteristics as categories of analysis that are bound up with power relations across public and private life. (Alison Jaggar’s 2001 Encyclopedia of Ethics entry on “Feminist Ethics” provides an excellent summary of many of the key features of second wave feminism that influenced feminist bioethics.) This research called attention to the need for theoretical grounding to provide a framework for practical strategies to curtail oppressive practices in medicine and healthcare. It is within this context of attention to practical issues combined with the drive to provide a conceptual underpinning for analysis and, ultimately, reform, that the emergence of feminist bioethics should be understood. Feminists working in bioethics today speak in many different voices, reflecting their disparate social positioning and academic backgrounds, and the new global reach of the field. Nonetheless, they share significant commonalities, both in their criticisms of dominant structures and in their efforts to build a more adequate framework that is responsive to the diversity of the circumstances of women and other groups. In doing so they call attention to neglected voices that are seldom represented within mainstream bioethics. Notably, feminist discourse highlights the way in which hierarchical rankings that categorize people by sex, race, ethnicity, age, disability, or susceptibility to genetic disease, can perpetuate unjust practices in health and social care, research, and public health. Some feminists integrate cross-disciplinary analysis of structural and social frameworks that divide and marginalize people with insights from the women’s health movement, others concentrate their analysis on a specific axis of oppressive practice, but all recognize interrelationships among such practices.

Feminist critique also addresses the fundamental theory of mainstream bioethics. Feminist-friendly bioethicists have noted systemic weaknesses in the explanatory framework that grounds the bioethical analysis of research and clinical practices and increasingly also of public health measures. Critics fault both the abstract character of much bioethical theory and inattention to such key components of morality as the contexts that frame health care and the relational networks that inform patient decision making. The tendency to ground theory in a set of abstract principles that are only subsequently applied to practical problems makes it easy to ignore (bio)ethically relevant particulars such as the unequal burden borne by women by virtue of their conventional reproductive and nurturing roles, or inequities between social and economic groups. Finally, some feminist theorists are developing alternative methodologies to remedy the epistemological shortcomings of the dominant bioethical model of reasoning.

2. Disseminating feminist bioethics

2.1 Early routes

By the 1980s bioethics as a discipline was growing, courses were proliferating and increasing the market for bioethics texts, but the marginalization of feminist perspectives persisted in both course texts and bioethics journals. Essays by feminists in the leading texts were limited primarily to treatment of reproductive issues such as abortion and maternal-fetal relations. Less initial attention was given to interconnections between these issues and more pervasive bioethical concerns such as the limits of physician authority, conflicts between commercial interests and patient wellbeing, or the conflation of moral and medical values. In these early days, feminist commentary on innovative reproductive interventions was also beginning to appear (e.g., Arditti, Klein and Minden 1984; Corea 1985; Stanworth 1987; Rapp 2000). In 1992 a collection of articles previously published in the journal Hypatia was brought out as Feminist Perspectives in Medical Ethics (Holmes and Purdy 1992). Susan Sherwin published No Longer Patient: Feminist Ethics and Health Care, the first book-length treatment of feminist bioethical theory (1992). To bring attention to disregard of feminist perspectives, Susan Wolf undertook a project at the Hastings Center which led to the anthology Feminism and Bioethics: Beyond Reproduction (1996). This collection incorporates feminist perspectives on many issues that had seldom been discussed in standard course texts, including the under-representation of women subjects in medical research, the pervasive influence of the abstract individualistic conception of personal autonomy, and stigmatizing portrayals of HIV-positive women. At around the same time Susan Bordo (1993) and Mary Mahowald (1993) published volumes critiquing medical and cultural attitudes toward women’s bodies. Susan Wendell’s The Rejected Body (1996) pressed this theme further, integrating the experiences of disabled people into discussions of bodily life. A further milestone in the development of feminist bioethics was the publication of Rosemary Tong’s Feminist Approaches to Bioethics: Theoretical Reflections and Practical Applications (1997).

Gradually, mainstream bioethics journals and organizations began to recognize feminist approaches. Several journals featured special issues by feminist scholars spanning a cluster of topics including AIDS, reconfiguration of the principle of autonomy, gender issues in psychiatry, and the global dimensions of feminist bioethics. Bioethics conferences in a number of countries began to schedule sessions that explicitly addressed feminist approaches and topics, and more feminists were included on the general program, while the market for more feminist-friendly teaching texts has expanded and publishers have been responsive (see e.g., Teays and Purdy 2001; Fulford, Dickenson and Murray 2002; Baylis, Downie, Hoffmaster and Sherwin 2004; Singer and Viens 2008). These and similar efforts resulted in feminist writings on an increasing diversity of substantive topics beginning to appear in bioethics journals and anthologies. Feminist critiques of bioethical theory also gained some currency, though they tended to be classified among “alternative” approaches (along with communitarianism, casuistry, and the ethics of care). Thus the healthcare priorities of women and other underserved groups still received disproportionally little bioethical attention. And despite these advances, concerns persisted that feminists were under-represented on governmental panels formulating public policy. The strategic importance of feminist involvement at the policy-making level to redress injustices and promote more equitable policy choices was emphasized by Sherwin and Baylis (2003), while other feminists have highlighted the need to reframe public policy and the research that underpins it to include the social impact of gender and other biases (Rogers 2006; Mahowald 2006).

2.2 International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (FAB) and International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (IJFAB)

Coinciding with the appearance of a critical mass of feminist bioethics scholarship, in 1993 the International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (FAB) was founded to provide a congenial home for feminists working in bioethics, to encourage international cross-fertilization, and to influence the agenda of mainstream bioethics. FAB aims to foster development of a more inclusive theory of bioethics at both the academic and grassroots levels. Three goals have been central: extension of bioethical theory to integrate feminist concerns; development of theory to include analyses not just of gender but also of class, ethnicity and other social categories; and creation of new strategies and methodologies that include socially marginalized experiences and perspectives. The articulation of these objectives represents an effort to systematize prevailing commonalities among feminists working in the field and stimulate further collaborative work. FAB’s central focus includes adaptation of the theoretical grounding of bioethics to more fully reflect key components of moral life, including power differences that structure physician/patient and researcher/subject relationships, the influence of wider social and institutional relationships, and cross-cultural perspectives on bioethical issues that reflect intersections between specific technologies and the social, political and economic structures within which they are embedded.

FAB has held its own Congress every 2 years since 1996, usually immediately before the World Congress of Bioethics (WCB) organized by the International Association of Bioethics, and taking themes which relate to the WCB theme but giving them a particularly feminist slant. Papers presented at these Congresses have been published in four anthologies (Donchin and Purdy 1999; Tong, Anderson and Santos 2001; Tong, Donchin and Dodds 2004; Scully, Baldwin-Ragaven and Fitzpatrick 2010), while another volume focusing on postmodern approaches includes a selection of papers from the 2000 FAB conference (Shildrick and Mykitiuk 2005).

To encourage more work in feminist bioethics and disseminate it more widely, in 2007 FAB established its own journal, the International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (IJFAB). IJFAB has provided a new forum within bioethics for feminist thought and debate. It is currently published semiannually, and the initial issue “Doing Feminist Bioethics” appeared in Spring 2008. IJFAB invites submissions approaching any problem or topic in bioethics from the resources of feminist scholarship for its open issues, and encourages proposals for special thematic issues that have covered topics such as research ethics, ethical issues in psychiatry, aging and long-term care, disability, vulnerability, transnational reproductive travel, food ethics, fitness, and climate change. IJFAB also invites individual commentaries or conversations among groups of scholars on contemporary problems in bioethics, as well as personal narratives that illuminate topics in bioethics. From its beginning, IJFAB has been committed to expanding the field of bioethics beyond a narrow focus on science and technology to include attention to public health and the social determinants of health, as well as broader issues such as food, the environment, labor, or globalization, that are directly related to community health. Further details on IJFAB can be found in Other Internet Resources.

In the following sections this article turns to consider substantive issues addressed by feminist bioethics; feminist bioethical work on bioethical theory; and feminist contributions to bioethical methodology.

3. Some Substantive Issues

What follows is not intended to be an exhaustive list of substantive topics, past and present, in feminist bioethics, but rather an indication of some central and longstanding areas of interest, directions in which these might be going, and examples of areas where feminist bioethics has brought a fresh and, feminists would argue, valuable perspective.

3.1 Reproduction, reproductive medicine and assisted reproductive technologies

The early years of feminist bioethics were dominated by a focus on reproductive issues, which were seen as being of particular salience to women and an area of life within which women are commonly discriminated against and oppressed. The focus is understandable, not least because it is often easier for non-feminist bioethicists to see reproductive issues as “feminist” simply by virtue of the fact that both biologically and socially they tend to affect women more than men. It is important to realize, however, that the early work on abortion, surrogacy or assisted conception is identified as feminist not simply because it addressed issues that reflect women’s interests, but because a feminist framework brought a distinctive approach to the examination of reproductive medicine and assisted conception: distinctive not just in taking the experiential perspective of women rather than men, but analytically in having an eye to the structural and interpersonal power differentials that shape both the experience and the delivery of these technologies in many different societies and cultures across the globe. For example, several authors have critiqued the oversimplified dichotomization between the popular slogans “pro-life” and “pro-choice” in the abortion debate (Sherwin 2008; Tooley et al. 2009). A key insight of feminist bioethics is that, because women bear a disproportionate share of the associated risks and burdens, new reproductive technologies are not gender neutral, a fact frequently ignored in debates about the ethics of assisted reproduction.

The assessment of the social and ethical implications of reproductive medical innovations persists, growing ever more complex with the proliferation of techniques to generate, test and manipulate embryos (e.g., Gupta 2000; Shanley 2001; Kukla 2005; Mullin 2005; Harwood 2007; the issue of Bioethics on reproductive autonomy edited by Carolyn McLeod 2009; Baylis and McLeod 2014). Two concerns remain paramount: that the availability of genetic testing and screening technologies in the context of reproductive medicine exerts pressure on women (and men) to utilize prenatal techniques to produce only “perfect” children (Rapp 2000; Rothman 2001) and that as it becomes easier to identify impairments prenatally, and prevent the birth of children with those impairments, the stigma experienced by disabled children and by their families will increase. Authors voice concern that future development of enhancement techniques, whether genetic or other, will exacerbate these tendencies and pose even greater threats to social equality, alongside the health benefits they may offer. Many of these issues overlap with others, such as the impact of caregiving responsibilities on the caregiver, and the effect of particular economic policies on socially marginalized groups.

Branching off from looking at reproductive issues per se is feminist bioethics’ significant and distinctive contributions to the bioethical analysis of the donation of reproductive tissues, for research or for reproductive purposes. Feminist bioethics’ insight into the politics of the use of eggs, embryos and other reproductive tissues in medicine and research, including stem cell research, a key topic in in the bioethical landscape of the last decade, opens up questions about the potential exploitation of women and women’s bodies—and the meaning of “exploitation” in complex worlds in which therapy and research overlap (Nisker et al. 2010; Tremain 2006). Donna Dickenson (2007) in particular is noted here for her extensive work on property and ownership of the body and body parts, as is Cathy Waldby for her examination of the global economy of reproductive tissues (Waldby and Mitchell 2006; Cooper and Waldby 2014).

3.2 Family and social care

A further area of strong feminist bioethical interest is the interaction between medicine, health status, and family and social care. Feminist bioethicists have argued that there are legitimate questions to be asked about the scope of and justification for claims about the forms of care offered, and the balance between individual, familial, state and commercial suppliers of medical and social care. These questions are being asked more widely in mainstream bioethics, prompted by longterm changes to the shape of family life across different societies and, as a result, the way families interact with medical and social care. At the same time, the demographic changes leading to aging populations are combining with economic and political forces to drive the retrenchment of health and welfare structures across many western countries. As a result, care responsibilities are increasingly falling back onto families, and implicitly onto traditional family structures in which responsibility for the care of dependent members is assumed to lie with women members of the family. Feminist critics have pressed for both empirical and normative consideration of familial versus societal responsibilities in the areas of health and other forms of care, asking critical questions about how these responsibilities come to exist and are enacted in a range of situations. In 2011 a group of leading scholars, both feminist and others, established an international consortium, the Network of Ethics of Families, specifically to provide a more robust theoretical ethical framework in this area (Verkerk et al. 2014, in Other Internet Resources).

Feminist scholars have also called for greater clarity about the meaning of care (or sometimes, dependency) work and who it is done by, warning against the conflation of the types of care performed by nurse, nurse-aides, home helps, and family members, and equally against the invisibility of the unpaid care work provided by family members compared to the world of (even relatively low-) paid care work. Noting the gendered nature of much longterm care work, a number of feminist bioethicists (Tong 2009; Lanoix 2013a,b) have been examining the ethics of the national and international arrangements of care for children, elderly and chronically ill people, and the associated development of international migrant care work (Weir 2008; Eckenwiler 2011, 2013).

3.3 Public health

Bioethics overall has seen an explosion of interest in public health ethics, distinct from the more clinically-focused ethical questions that dominated the field in its early decades. In many ways, the central perspectives and current concerns of public health ethics were long anticipated by feminist health care movements and feminist bioethics. Public health ethics is concerned with the multiple activities of public health, carried out by a range of health professionals and agents, and is necessarily concerned with health inequities both nationally and globally, how they operate and how they can be minimized or eradicated in public health, but also crucially bringing a broader perspective that includes an interest in how these inequities come about in the first place. As Rogers notes,

a feminist approach leads us to examine not only the connections between gender, disadvantage, and health, but also the distribution of power in the processes of public health, from policy making through to programme delivery. (Rogers 2006: 351; Baylis, Kenny and Sherwin 2008)

The increasing interest in public health research ethics in general has also led to some work focusing specifically on women’s interests and vulnerabilities (e.g., Macklin 2011).

3.4 Disability and embodiment

A notably vibrant and fruitful strand of feminist bioethics engagement in the early twenty-first century has been with issues of embodiment and particularly disability. As Baldwin-Ragaven and Scully (2010) note, feminist bioethics has necessarily contained a longstanding discussion about what it means bioethically to have/be a “non-standard” body, given that the female body has generally been seen as nonstandard within the biomedical and bioethical contexts. Feminist bioethical scholarship has sometimes overlapped with the growing company of feminist disability scholars, many of whom write about disability as a form of embodied social exclusion that can intersect or synergize with gender. This engagement has produced a body of work that problematizes the construal of the impaired body in bioethics as a problem to be solved by biomedical means and for which the key bioethical issues are to do with regulating the technologies that can be applied to prevent or cure disability (Silvers, Wasserman and Mahowald 1998; Fine and Asch 1988; Parens and Asch 2000; Wong 2002; Tremain 2005; Scully 2008; Ho 2011; Hall 2011). A special issue of IJFAB on disability appeared in 2010 (volume 3, number 2). There has also been rich theoretical work on the social and cultural expectations of normality, and the political choices that are made in the area of prevention of and support for disabled people, contributed through feminist discussion of the norms of dependency (Kittay 1999) and vulnerability (Scully 2014).

A different slant on embodiment is provided by the existing and growing body of feminist work on medicalization, particularly the medicalization of non-standard embodiments or embodied states and their classification as pathologies, and the questions of autonomy and choice that such medicalization raises (Purdy 2001, 2006; Garry 2001). Feminists writing in this area include Alison Reiheld (2010) and Laura Guidry-Grimes and Elizabeth Victor (2012). The pathologization of the obese body and its relationship to fat stigma and cultural beauty standards has been extensively discussed on the IJFAB blog, while other sites of attention are the medicalization of intersex (M. Holmes 2008; Feder 2014) and of altered states of consciousness (Harbin 2014). Feminist bioethics has also generated a growing body of work on transgendered embodiment (Draper and Evans 2006; J.L. Nelson 2014),

3.5 Psychiatry and mental health

Given a history in which women’s voices and experiences have frequently been discounted as “mad”, it is perhaps not surprising that feminist bioethics has also pioneered the critical ethical examination of mental health issues, in particular the role of psychiatry and its treatment of women. Revealingly, as early as 2001 the Journal of Medicine and Philosophy published a special issue devoted to feminist bioethics and containing some key papers on psychiatric issues (volume 26, number 4). In a special issue of IJFAB (volume 4, number1, 2011) several authors examined questions of mental health and illness. Again, this scrutiny is not unique to feminist bioethics; what is distinctive is the way these issues are refracted through a feminist lens that pays close attention to thorny questions of power, authority and the silencing of anomalous voices. Especially pertinent in this area is the question of epistemic power—judgments about the validity of subjective experiences, symptoms, or perceptions that may lie outside the norm—with a close eye to the power of institutions such as the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual (DSM), and what some critics see as the pharmaceutical industry’s problematic investment in the medicalization of people’s distress.

4. Perspectives on Bioethical Theory

4.1 Overview

As the preceding discussion illustrates, feminists have participated in scholarly discussion of virtually all the major topics in bioethics. Their contributions are distinctive not least because of the foundational relationship of feminist scholarship to activism, which means that the scholarly treatment of these topics is grounded in a critique of the background norms and conditions that produce observable and persistent injustices in medicine and healthcare. This is one reason why feminist bioethical theory tends to have a practical orientation. Its criticisms most characteristically address the adequacy of mainstream bioethical theory that emphasizes universal moral principles framed abstractly, individualistically and isolated from context (the most widely cited example of such a theoretical framework is Beauchamp and Childress’ Principles of Biomedical Ethics). Though some feminist criticism objects to any attempt to formulate universal principles at all, most is more circumscribed, directed principally against theoretical frameworks that presuppose a generic individual subject that is abstract, disembodied and socially disembedded, in a way that has enabled morally relevant particulars to be ignored, and that privileges the perspective of an elite, historically mostly male group (Walker 2008). Feminist critics point out that this theoretical orientation generally has the consequence of justifying the prevailing status quo, thereby inhibiting any real consideration of social change.

Feminist bioethics’ theoretical approaches also take some distinctive approaches to ontology and epistemology that challenge traditional philosophical positions on the way that knowledge, subjectivity and moral agency are mobilized within ethical discourse. The search for a more satisfactory moral grounding for bioethics has taken feminist scholars in several directions. A few favor dispensing with principles entirely and reconstituting bioethics through narrative case-specific interpretation along the lines pioneered by Nel Noddings (1984) and her followers. Others, without going this far, are nevertheless convinced that narrative approaches have useful applications in bioethics (e.g., H.L. Nelson 2001). Yet others have criticized the abstract universal approach to theory construction from the perspective of European thought (e.g., Mary Rawlinson 2001); noting the masculine markings of the allegedly generic human subject in philosophy, they decry the failure of purported universalists to recognize the particularities of women’s disparate conditions. Other groups of feminists have ventured along the different routes of post-structuralist and postmodern theory on the one hand (Shildrick 1997; Shildrick and Mykitiuk 2005) and particularism (Little 2001) on the other, to challenge other kinds of claim to universality . And yet other feminists think a framework that incorporates universal principles can and should continue to constitute one dimension of an adequate bioethical theory, provided that these principles are formulated in non-exclusionary terms that reflect the relational context and empirical realities of individual lives.

Two distinct and distinctive areas of contribution to theory by feminist bioethics are in care ethics/ethics of care, and in the conceptualization of autonomy.

4.2. Care ethics

Originating in the work of feminist psychologist Carol Gilligan (1982) and the proliferation of scholarship stimulated by her insights, care theorists have emphasized patterns of moral reasoning that are allegedly characteristic of women—reasoning that prioritizes caring, relationships, and responsibilities—and contrasted them with modes of reasoning that privilege justice and rights, and which Gilligan and her followers have taken to be more characteristic of men. (It should be noted here, however, that the specifically gendered contours of care and justice in this work have been challenged by those who see the difference as more to do with the forms of moral reasoning mobilized by socially and politically marginalized groups, women being one of these: see e.g., Cortese 1990). Care theorists distrust traditional moral principles and emphasize the necessity of values such as love, care, and responsibility to capture contextual subtleties and relational bonds that are overlooked within principle-oriented ethical frameworks.

Both feminists and others have voiced doubts about the capacity of an ethics based in care alone to address some of the concerns of feminist bioethics. The first anthology to consider this controversy, Women and Moral Theory, juxtaposed some of the leading care theorists with critics who question the significance of a gender-differentiated morality and its relevance to political and legal issues (Kittay and Meyers 1987). Critics acknowledge that gendered social structures must be taken into account, but they take exception to the distinction between masculine and feminist “voices” embedded in Gilligan’s orientation. In her 1992 work, No Longer Patient: Feminist Ethics and Health Care, Susan Sherwin extends this critique of care ethics, arguing that not only have its advocates too readily accommodated a tradition that views women’s character as always and essentially different from men’s, but that the care orientation lacks an overt political perspective that can adequately account for and unsettle patterns of domination and oppression that affect women. Numerous other feminists have expressed reservations that overlap with Sherwin’s concerns here, including Bartky (1990), H.L. Nelson (1992), Kuhse (1995), and Gould (1998).

In a 1996 article titled “Rehabilitating Care”, Alisa Carse and Hilde Lindemann Nelson attempted to respond to leading criticisms of care ethics by arguing that there are resources within the ethic of care that can address each of the major problems noted by critics and that can assist in developing the ethic more fully. Such reformulation has continued since, as feminists who support some dimensions of care theory integrate these features into a more comprehensive moral framework that gives serious attention to issues of justice (Noddings 2002; Ruddick 1989; Held 1993, 1995, 2006), moving care ethics beyond interpersonal problems to social and political issues that require more generalized treatment. For example, Kittay and others call attention to the universal dimensions of dependency. They focus on the disproportionate prestige afforded to high-tech medicine and the low status attached to more mundane work that provides necessary care to sick, elderly and disabled people (Kittay 1999; Kittay and Feder 2002; Eckenwiler 2014). Though caring values count heavily in providing high caliber healthcare, the caring tasks of medicine are often demeaned as “housekeeping issues” that attract little interest and even less remuneration, while “crisis issues” dominate theoretical attention and in practice reward their practitioners rather better. Later work has continued to bring attention to this situation, particularly as it affects those who require extended care. Both Jennifer Parks’s No Place Like Home: Feminist Ethics and Home Health Care (2003) and Rosalind Ladd et al.’s anthology Ethical Issues in Home Health Care (2002) address questions with exceptional import to the welfare of elderly and disabled people, bringing to their task much recent feminist work on justice and care. In the years since then, the care needs of an aging population in most parts of the world have only increased. In response, IJFAB devoted a special issue to aging and long-term care (volume 6, number 2, 2013), including key papers by Lanoix, Kittay, Tong, Martha Holstein and others (all 2013).

Related work on care has branched off in a number of directions. The anthology Socializing Care builds on Joan Tronto’s 1993 call for a political theory that integrates the practice of care into the qualities needed for democratic citizens to live well together in a pluralistic society (Hamington and Miller 2006). Authors in this anthology stress power imbalances embedded in recent tendencies to privatize care, and the need for a public ethics of care. Others have applied care theory to nursing ethics (e.g., Kuhse 1997). Ruth Groenhout (2004) and Susan Dodds (2007) both develop versions of feminist bioethics that combine a care perspective with virtue theory. Both Groenhout and Dodds emphasize the holistic nature of human persons, their particular social contexts, the centrality of emotional responses in ethical reasoning, and the implausibility of judging actions separated from the lived narratives that confer meaning on them. Groenhout draws examples from several fields including new reproductive technologies. She notes that adoption of care theory here would require consideration of many factors beyond the desires of particular patients, including costs and benefits to everyone affected by particular medical interventions, the impact of such services on other healthcare needs, and the risk that technology will intensify the commodification of children and the bodily functions of the women who bear them. Scully (2010a) has considered care in the context of disability, focusing on the hidden care labor that disabled people carry out for nondisabled people rather than the care that disabled people receive. In recent years several feminist bioethicists have been working to tease out the complex connections between central moral notions of care, dependence, independence, and autonomy. A particularly strong line of work here focuses on vulnerability as a concept within bioethics (Luna 2006, 2009; Rogers, Mackenzie and Dodds 2012). A special issue of IJFAB on vulnerability (volume 5, number 2, 2012) addressing a number of topics included a discussion of a global ethics approach to vulnerability, injection drug use, and the particular vulnerability of pregnant research subjects. A recent collection co-edited by Catriona Mackenzie, Rogers and Dodds (2014) has further pursued work on this theme.

4.3 Autonomy

Another major stream of feminist work addresses the construction of a theory of autonomy that is more reflective of reality than that commonly favored in the bioethics literature. Feminist critique here notes first that the traditional model of autonomy is inadequate: it directs no attention to the contextual details of personal experience or of the situations within which autonomy in real life is exercised to a greater or lesser degree. As Sherwin notes,

we need to move away from the familiar Western understanding of autonomy as self-defining, self-interested, and self-protecting, as if the self were simply some special kind of property to be preserved. (Sherwin et al. 1998: 35)

In a related form of decontextualization, some bioethicists and physicians reduce autonomy to informed consent and restrict its exercise in medical practice to a patient’s selection of choices from a limited set of clinical options (Dodds 2000). This formulation of the principle of respect for autonomy ignores background conditions that patients bring to their medical experience, the institutional power relationships and social contexts that influence their options, and the medical research priorities that shape them. Expanding on this critique Carolyn Ells adopts Foucault’s analysis of biopower to argue that informed choice must be understood in explicitly relational terms that construe power relations as diffused throughout society (2003). Ells argues here that the standard conception of choice relies on a false model of persons that situates them outside relations of power. Once this is recognized, the need for an understanding of autonomy that grapples with the complexities of power relations becomes obvious.

This perspective shares with care theory the conviction that human agents are not fundamentally single-minded, rational, self-interested choice-makers but social beings whose selfhood is constituted and maintained within overlapping relationships and communities. Recognizing the complexity of connection among individuals, their social milieu, their cultural matrix, and political position, some feminists are now calling for adoption of a relational model of autonomy that stresses the web of interconnected (and sometimes conflicting) relationships that shape individuality. The key anthology here, Mackenzie and Soljar’s Relational Autonomy (2000), contains a comprehensive introduction that characterizes feminist critiques of the standard model of autonomy, and constructive reformulations, in more detail. The more relational view of the self developed by feminist moral theory has clear implications for thinking about autonomy. While accepting that the principle of respect for autonomy has been essential to the protection of individual liberty, including of course that of women, the mainstream concepts of autonomy, based on the picture of the self described above, has little relevance to the lives of marginalized groups for whom the possibilities of self-determination are severely constrained by material, social and political structures. A relational conception of autonomy argues that

agents’ identities are formed within the context of social relationships and shaped by a complex of intersecting social determinants, such as race, class, gender, and ethnicity. (Mackenzie and Stoljar 2000: 4)

Early social relationships provide the groundwork for the later development of self-determination. In its strongest version, relational accounts argue that the activities that constitute self-determination are inherently social; relationships, far from undermining autonomy, provide the conditions of possibility for the exercise of self-determination and self-actualization (Donchin 2000: 239; Scully 2008: 161–162).

Other work in feminist bioethics attempts to reconfigure autonomy to give fuller consideration to patient agency. These approaches view autonomy not solely as a property possessed by all competent adults but also as an aspirational achievement that requires moral development, social cooperation, and supportive institutions. They emphasize the importance of encouraging the development of autonomy capacities to balance disparities in education and status that distort physician-patient, and other, communications. A more adequate conception would make visible how social norms and pressures influence the choices offered to patients, and would emphasize the obligations of healthcare providers to actively support patient autonomy and decision making.

Yet other scholars have noted features beyond power relationships that can affect autonomy. In addition to oppressive social environments, trauma (Brison 2001) and illness (Donchin 2000) can easily impair autonomy, as the body one has trusted to pursue one’s plans and projects is shown to be vulnerable, fragile, and unprotected. The relationship between trust and autonomy is further explored by McLeod (2002), who has presented a conception of self-trust within a feminist theoretical framework, thereby adding a new dimension to the reframing of personal autonomy as relational. Drawing her illustrations principally from reproductive contexts, she argues that encounters with healthcare providers can undermine a woman’s self-trust, thereby threatening her autonomy. Conversely, providers can respect patient autonomy by attending to their power to influence patients’ self-trust. Her conceptual innovations have been extended to further healthcare contexts (e.g., Goering 2009).

5. Feminist Methodologies

In addition to major substantive issues and bioethical theory, feminist bioethics has also made distinctive contributions to bioethical methodology. Feminist bioethics is characterized by shared theoretical and political orientations that favor certain methodological approaches, including a focus on empirical experience; attention to the effects of social, political or epistemic power; and a commitment to influencing social and political change.

Feminism is based on the observation that experience is gendered: that is, a person’s experience can differ in significant ways depending on whether that person is male or female, and attention needs to be paid to that experience if these differences are not to be subsumed in the discourse of the most powerful. There is therefore an associated methodological bias towards methods that ground theory in lived experience, and that retain a sensitivity to morally relevant differences in experience that can result from gender, but also from differences in class, ethnicity, sexuality and so on. Hence although feminist bioethics is not alone in doing so, it is more likely than mainstream bioethics to draw on empirical data or narrative and phenomenological accounts, in order to ensure that both description and normative claims are anchored in the realities of natural, social, political and institutional worlds. As a result feminist bioethics has often drawn on the methods of qualitative social science and health research, to capture important empirical information about the situated encounter with medicine and healthcare.

Feminist thought also takes seriously the existence and effects of power relationships of all kinds, not just those that operate most obviously in the medical context. This means that feminist methods also have the cognitive habit of attending to the disclosure and examination of social structures and practices that are oppressive and disadvantageous to women, extending the examination of such power relations beyond the clinic and even the healthcare system, to take account of social and global economic arrangements that maintain entrenched patterns of social and political domination.

Finally, it should also be remembered that feminist bioethics is an academic discipline that, like other areas of feminist scholarship, originated in and alongside a social movement which has the goal of achieving global justice and equality for women. Hence, feminist bioethics aims at going beyond the diagnosis and analysis of a problem, and pointing towards a future of social and political change.

Feminist bioethicists can never avoid asking the question, how does this work in the lives of real women and men, and in the current political frameworks in which we exist? (Scully 2010b: 136)

6. The Expanding Landscape and the Future

6.1. Thematic expansion

Feminist bioethicists continue to bring new issues to bioethics, and fresh perspectives on existing ones. As a field, bioethics necessarily must attend to the novel ethical dilemmas that are raised by advances in medicine and life science technologies, but also social and political developments that lead to transformations in healthcare practices. Feminist bioethics offers its own particular style of analysis to the debate. Thus, as the area of public health bioethics matures, so too do feminist bioethics’ contributions to identifying, examining and understanding the role of gender and other inequalities in public health (Rogers 2006). Or, to give a very different example, as mitochondrial donation has emerged as a potential means to avoid the transmission of mitochondrial disease to subsequent generations, feminist bioethicists have been able to raise the same sorts of critical questions about the sources of mitochondria, and the potential for exploitation of women in obtaining them, as they have raised about the circulation of other forms of reproductive tissue (Baylis 2013; Dickenson 2013).

6.2 Global reach

In recent years feminist activists have turned their attention to health needs in developing regions of the world and the formation of international health policies. Several feminist advocacy groups have extended their reach to encourage recognition of universal health-related human rights. A FAB committee contributed to the 2008 revision of the Helsinki Declaration that specifies international standards for the ethical conduct of medical research. Many of the amendments to the Declaration originated within that committee (Eckenwiler et al. 2008; Goodyear et al. 2008). Members of FAB also participated in formulation of the UNESCO Declaration on Universal Norms on Bioethics (Rawlinson and Donchin 2005). Their work is complemented by non-governmental organizations in numerous developing countries.

Among the foreseeable developments in years to come is a further increase in feminist bioethics’ global reach. This is distinct from its (already strong) international focus: a feminist consciousness not simply of the way that bioethical issues diversify between countries, but of the global economic and political systems that can hold locally specific regimes of oppression and discrimination in place (see, e.g., Nie 2005). Feminist bioethicists have made significant contributions to the literature on global issues. Collaboration between feminists in the more and the less industrialized regions of the world supported the publication of four anthologies based on papers from international FAB conferences (Donchin and Purdy 1999; Tong, Anderson and Santos 2001; Tong, Donchin and Dodds 2004; Scully, Baldwin-Ragaven and Fitzpatrick 2010). Each of these in different ways documents how dominant Western technological practices are crossing geographical boundaries, influencing developing economies, and often diverting scarce resources from basic healthcare services that could reduce preventable morbidity and mortality. Of particular concern are the consequences for those who lack the power to alter externally imposed conditions that control their lives. The first volume calls attention to the traditional mind/body dualism, while contributors to the second volume sought to transcend the usual dichotomies dividing the contemporary world into developed/developing economies and technological/nontechnological societies, to address a broad array of concerns at the intersection of feminism and global issues. Some chapters focused on the tendency of science to become a collective project of the international community, others on tensions between specific cultural practices and features of common humanity that override geographical and cultural differences, including childbirth, illness, disability, and death. The 2004 volume draws on and extends human rights discourse pertinent to health issues and amplifies debate about global ethics. It takes account of considerations infrequently addressed in the bioethics literature including the economic, social, and political effects of globalized capitalism, and continues the discussion of tensions between cultural imperialism and cultural relativism, thereby extending analysis to the needs of marginalized people diversely situated within the global economy.

In the 2010 volume, entitled Feminist Bioethics: At the Center, On the Margins, several authors grappled with the ethically troubling and morally unresolved divides between the global North and South (Baldwin-Ragaven and Scully 2010). Writers in this volume noted that feminist bioethics needs to respond to the voices that criticize (mainly Western) white female privilege, as well as to the North American Black and Latina scholars who charged late twentieth century feminist with ignoring their concerns. Feminist bioethics has from its beginnings made a point of advertising its own disciplinary and geographical plurality. The current website of the International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (see Other Internet Resources) contains the following (as of December 16, 2015):

FAB has worked since 1992 to create a global community of scholarship, debate, and action around problems in bioethics... [and] fosters respect within bioethics for differences among people, while critically examining the effects of oppression and disadvantage.

The willingness to face squarely the theoretical, professional as well as political tensions that may result is an example of the critical and avowedly self-critical nature of feminist bioethics.

6.3 Loss of the radical edge?

Expanding moral perception is an ongoing process. As the 2010 FAB anthology noted, feminist bioethics is in the paradoxical position that it continues to stand at the margins of bioethics, and yet many of its insights have been and continue to be taken up by the mainstream. Examples include the so-called empirical turn in bioethics, or bioethics’ recent calls for greater attention to be paid to public health issues. This is a double-edged sword. Obviously, feminists want their views to transform the bioethical work going on at the “center”, and yet in doing so there is a danger that the radical and critical edge of feminist critique will lose its force. Some scholars see feminist bioethics trying to take a bidirectional trajectory into the future, moving closer to the heart of mainstream bioethical scholarship while at the same time maintaining a home for activists and theorists working at the margins, and this is likely to remain a point of tension within the field (Nelson 2000). Nevertheless, while the incorporation of some feminist thought has blurred the lines between mainstream and marginal bioethics, and calls into question feminist bioethics’ own distinctiveness, it is also clear that mainstream bioethics’ assimilation of feminism is very partial: while it may have adopted some of feminist bioethics’ theoretical and methodological approaches, it has not taken on board its specific goals of gender and social justice. The irreducible minimum on which feminist ethics stands is what Alison Jaggar defined as commitment to the ideas that “the subordination of women is morally wrong and that the moral experience of women is worthy of respect” (Jaggar 1991: 95). This is what makes feminist contributions to bioethics immediately recognizable, and powerful.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Verkerk, M.A., H. Lindemann, J. McLaughlin, J.L. Scully, U. Kihlbom, J. Nelson, J. Chin, 2014, “Where Families and Health Care Meet,” Journal of Medical Ethics, online publication.
  • The International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (FAB), a non-profit organization which, according to the website, “is one of the largest and most vibrant bioethics networks in the world today; has worked since 1992 to create a global community of scholarship, debate, and action around problems in bioethics” and “promotes scholarship that makes gender central to inquiry in bioethics”. FAB “fosters respect within bioethics for differences among people, while critically examining the effects of oppression and disadvantage”.
  • The International Journal of Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (IJFAB). IJFAB also hosts an active blog.
  • Feminist Approaches to Bioethics in Canada (FAB Canada), is an affiliate group of the Canadian Bioethics Society (CBS). At annual CBS conferences, FAB Canada provides networking opportunities for FAB members in Canada and other conference attendees engaged in feminist bioethics.
  • Impact Ethics is a blog managed by the Novel Tech Ethics research team in the Faculty of Medicine at Dalhousie University (Halifax, Canada). Although not explicitly feminist, its approach and goals as described on its homepage resonate with those of feminist bioethics, and entries by several feminist bioethicists have appeared on it.
  • Bioethics Network on Women’s Issues in the Arab Region (BNWIAR), was initiated in 2011 by the UNESCO Cairo Office and experts in the region to open a dialogue on ethical issues surrounding women’s health and welfare in the Arab region, and to establish a network among experts and institutions working on these issues in the region and outside the region. The Network has a blog.


Jackie Leach Scully would like to thank Anne Donchin for her invitation to revise and update her original entry. Sadly, Anne died on 26 August 2014. Jackie would also like to thank various members of the International Network on Feminist Approaches to Bioethics (FAB) for their suggestions for the revision.

Copyright © 2015 by
Anne Donchin
Jackie Scully <jackie.leach.scully@unsw.edu.au>

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