Notes to God and Other Ultimates

1. These names are found in Hinduism, Daoism, Buddhism, monotheisms such as Judaism, Christianity, Islam and Sikhism, and Plotinus’ and Charles Peirce’s thought, respectively. For Peirce, see Kasser 2013.

2. See, e.g., Huxley 1945, Hartshorne and Reese (eds) 1953, Holm and Bowker (eds) 1994, Ward 1998, Neville and Wildman 2001, Diller and Kasher (eds) 2013, and Wildman 2017.

3. According to Hedges, particularists take each tradition to be a “network of terms and practices that make sense only in relation to itself” (2014: 205–206). If so, no concepts can be shared between them; a fortiori, no concept(s) of ultimacy either.

4. Sister Gayatriprana (2020) in particular identifies multiple chains of influence between models of God and Brahman running from East to West and West to East. One interesting case in point is the rise of more personalist views of Brahman in the Bhakti schools of Hinduism involving “a degree of deep interconnection between the human and the divine” occurring during the period of Muslim rule in India from the twelfth to the sixteenth centuries (2020: xxii; more coming on the Bhakti schools in Section 2 of this entry).

5. Wildman 2001: 269; 2020: 119, 127. Berthrong backs Neville’s and Wildman’s idea, saying that

anything less [than vague categories and metaphors]…would be trivial in light of the mass of data demanding to be addressed. There is an old and ironic Chinese curse that states, may you live in interesting times. For the comparative philosopher or theologian this can be transposed into: may you live in cultural and conceptually rich times. (2001: 255–256)

6. To demonstrate how Schellenberg’s account surfaces on the face of the vague categorial terms from the paragraph above: Tillich’s “object of ultimate concern” is soteriologically ultimate; John Hick’s “the Real” is metaphysically ultimate; and Neville and Wildman’s “that which is most important to religious life because of the nature of reality” implies both soteriological and metaphysical ultimacy.

7. Clooney 2001 follows Schellenberg’s conjuncts in his discussion of Indian religious ultimates:

Ultimate reality might be described as follows: that which cannot be surpassed [axiological ultimacy]; that from which all realities, persons, and things come, that on which they depend, and that into which they return upon dissolution [metaphysical ultimacy]; that by knowledge of which one knows everything else and reaches liberation [soteriological ultimacy]. (2001: 95, bracketed additions mine)

Similarly, Mary-Jane Rubenstein says God is “the source of all things, the life of all things, the end of all things”, a statement that agrees with Schellenberg if the “life” of a thing is its value (2019: 16:29).

8. E.g., one route is to take metaphysical ultimacy to entail axiological ultimacy which, with the existence of the cosmos, entails soteriological ultimacy for its creatures. For a creative reconstruction of, e.g., Aquinas’ argument along these lines, see Zagzebski 2007: 81–84.

9. See Section 2.2 for an explanation. The inheritance is visible in the fact that each of the three categories of being is maximized and in their conjunction. (In fact, axiological ultimacy by itself may capture Anselm’s formula). Elliott also reads Schellenberg as “taking a cue from Anselm (and frankly, the entire history of Perfect Being Theology)” (2017: 104).

10. “Chroniclers assumed that the ‘Great Spirit’, ‘Master of Life’, or ‘Grandfather God’ were somehow real Native American terms, instead of Euro-Christian interpolations. In fact, Natives have no high-God concept, let alone God concepts that mimic male-dominated hierarchies. Instead, we have Councils of Elder Spirits operating in replication of our participatory democracies….each [of whom] simply knows more about itself and its immediate purview than does anyone else….[and who] act in concert” and by accident and consensus to create, e.g., life on earth (Mann 2010: 33–34).

11. Schellenberg draws this distinction:

we have something distinctively religious here [in the triple formula], something that can clearly be distinguished from what a materialist might say, who nevertheless thinks there exists something metaphysically ultimate. (2009: 31)

Richard Dawkins says something similar when he calls the view that “God is nature….sexed-up atheism” and concludes that “Deliberately to confuse [it with theism and deism] is…an act of intellectual high treason” (2006: 18–19).

12. Specifically, using “M”, “A” and “S” for metaphysical, axiological and soteriological ultimacy respectively, the disjunction entails these disjuncts: M, A, S, \((\textrm{M} \lor \textrm{A}),\) \((\textrm{M} \lor \textrm{S}),\) \((\textrm{A} \lor \textrm{S}),\) or \((\textrm{M} \lor \textrm{A} \lor \textrm{S}).\) So this entry uses “metaphysically ultimate” for the disjunct M and “ultimate” and variants for two or more of these disjuncts. Thanks go to John Bishop for what is right in this paragraph.

13. In addition, to neologize another adjective: on a prototype theory of concepts and taking the full conjunction \((M \lor A \lor S)\) as the prototype of ultimacy, perhaps there are degrees of ultimacy, ranging from triple ultimacy as paradigmatically ultimate to single ultimacy as “ultimate-ish”.

14. The model’s finding: in aggregate, it was in fact better overall for agents to cooperate instead of defect. The example is cited in Emily C. Parke and Anya Plutynski 2020: 65. Regarding definitions of “model”: Parke and Plutynski define “models” in a scientific context as “idealized interpreted structures representing target systems” and takes their structure to be “relevant to a scientist’s research agenda and aims” (2020: 61, 63). Ian Barbour similarly defines “model” “broadly speaking” as “a symbolic representation of selected aspects of…a complex system for particular purposes” (1974: 6).

15. On different aims: Barbour suggests that both scientific and religious models have cognitive functions of explaining and interpreting observations of the natural world or human experiences, respectively, but that religious models also have non-cognitive functions that “have no parallel in science”, such as the expression of attitudes and commitment to a form of morality and life (1974: 7, 27–8, 68–9). On similarities (1) and (2): Barbour suggests that models represent “aspects of the world which are not directly accessible to us” and “that only certain aspects of the world are brought into prominence by a model, while other aspects are neglected”, respectively (1974: 7, 47); Parke and Plutynski echo both points (2020: 55, 60).

16. Descartes’ Reply to the Third Set of Objections to the Meditations (by Hobbes), Fifth Objection, at AT VII 181 in Cottingham, Stoothoff and Murdoch 1988, vol. II, p. 127.

17. Swinburne 1993, which attempts to show that it that it is logically possible for God to be omnipresent, incorporeal, personal, free, creator of the universe, omnipotent, omniscient, perfectly good (impeccable), a source of moral obligation, eternal, immutable, and necessary, by a careful analysis of each. Regarding “concepts” vs. “conceptions”, see Bishop 2009: 422. Though his account there discusses “conceptions” as metaphysical fillers of role concepts, there are metaphysical fillers for higher-level concepts more broadly. For example, the concept of God as “that which is perfect” is not a role concept since its attributes are intrinsic instead of extrinsic, but it still has fillers in the different conceptions of what it takes to be perfect.

18. About the hesitancy: Neville’s indexical signs and other mere reference-fixers for ultimacy may be limiting cases of models since the representation is instrumental or perhaps “alienans”, as Vallicella explains it: the representation “shifts, alters, alienates, the sense of the noun that it modifies”, as “decoy” does in “decoy duck” since it implies the referent of “duck” is not a duck (Vallicella 2006 [2019: sec. 4.2]). See the ineffability objection in the next section for more forms of speech about ultimacy which also may be alienans. Regarding purposes modelers of ultimacy may have, see footnote 15.

19. Perry Schmidt-Leukel makes two interesting claims about Nagarjuna’s related distinction between conventional reality and ultimate reality:

  1. (1) that this distinction is made only “from the perspective of conventional reality…where conceptual distinctions apply – in order to point towards ultimate reality where no conceptual distinctions whatsoever apply;” and
  2. (2) “that ultimate truth/reality cannot be taught without recourse to the conventional” (2019: 477).

In other words, one has to slog through the kind of conceptual distinctions at play in this entry to understand what is ultimate in a way that will allow one to drop these distinctions.

20. Nota bene, Schmidt-Leukel writes:

At times proponents of this model oscillate between a conception that understands all three factors as distinct ultimates in their own right, and a conception that sees them as three dimensions of a single complex ultimate reality. (2019: 482)

21. They are also framed mereologically, notwithstanding Mullins 2016: 139ff.

22. The pantheistic-sounding passages include:

God is the only substance that exists or can be conceived…. [and]….Whatever exists is in God, and nothing can exist or be conceived without God. (1677, Ethics Part I.14, 15)

See Rubenstein 2018 for a variety of pantheisms from Bruno to animisms.

23. One might read these distinctions existentially by replacing the world with oneself, to understand at a fundamental level who one is and how one fits into the wider reality. So, e.g., monism becomes “what is ultimate and I are the same stuff;” dualism that “what is ultimate is different from me;” panentheism that “I am in (or part of) what is ultimate;” merotheism that “what is ultimate is in (or part of) me”. Thanks to David Perry for this thought.

24. Many Hindus refer to the tradition as “Sanātana Dharma” (the eternal dharma, or order, or way of life). This is an older, and an indigenous, term, but it, too, did not become widespread as a designator for the whole collection of these traditions until relatively recently.

25. The Vedanta school takes the Upanishads to be the end of the Vedas both literally as an appendix to the Vedas and figuratively as their whole point. The chronological order of the Vedas is the original hymns (e.g., the Rig Veda), the Brahmanas, the Aranyakas (a.k.a the forest treatises), and then the Upanishads, though the oldest Upanishad is an Aranyaka.

26. Nicholson 2010. From Jeffery Long:

The six schools are “Sāṃkhya and Yoga [the relationship of these two could be seen as one of theory (Sāṃkhya) to practice (Yoga)]; Nyāya and Vaiśeṣika [the traditional Hindu systems of logic and cosmology, respectively, which eventually merged]; and Mīmāṃsā and Vedānta [systems of Vedic exegesis, with Mīmāṃsā being focused on the ritualistic, early Vedic texts and Vedānta being focused on ‘the end of the Veda’—the Upaniṣads and the philosophy taught therein]”. (Correspondence, 12 March 2020)

Interestingly, the Samkhya school has a view of God reminiscent of Aristotle’s Unmoved Mover or deism: God is a purusha (a soul) that unlike most souls never got bound to the cycle of rebirth and thus is ever-free and not engaged with the world.

27. The one but important exception is the Dvaita schools which identify Brahman with God, i.e., Ishvara. For “theocosm”, see Long 2007: 81. Long was unaware of this at the time, but “theocosm” was used previously, e.g., in Reconciliation by Incarnation by David Worthington Simon (1898: 201) and in The God of Science (1928) by Arvid Reuterdahl where he developed a “Theocosmic Diagram.”

28. In process thought, there is no name for the theocosm but, e.g., in his gloss on process thought Wesley Wildman calls the theocosm “ultimate reality” and the parts “God” and “the world”:

Ultimate reality is the eternal symbiotic relationship between this natural God and the rest of natural reality, in which the two mutually influence and constitute each other. (2017: 22)

29. These associations make Vedantic philosophies like what Pierre Hadot takes Western ancient philosophies to be: they are a bios or way of life (1981 [1995]). For more on the relationship between text and experience in Vedanta, see Long 2020, section 5.4.

30. Interestingly, pace those who read him as a pantheist, Shankara supports the asymmetric claim of panentheism counterfactually: if the unique qualities of a material effect were destroyed, the essential qualities of its/the material cause would still remain, e.g., if I shatter the pot I made from the clay, I still have clay; if I smelt down a gold necklace, I still have gold. See Shankara’s commentary on the Brahmasutra 2.1.9, Swami Vireswarananda 1936: 166-167, and Rambachan 2006: 75.

31. Ramanuja’s synthesis grew out of his spiritual path, first as a serious student of Advaita, then as a convert to Vaishnavism. It is testimony to Shankara’s importance that it took 300 years for someone to dissent, and that Ramanuja had to survive a murder plot to make his conversion and critique (Tapasyananda 1990: 1–14, 32–33).

32. It is said that during these six months of direct perception of nirguna Brahman, Ramakrishna’s “perception of the world vanished entirely” (Long 2020: 172, quoting Swami Saradananda).

33. Jeffery D. Long conveys Ramakrishna’s idea of the deep complexity of Brahman by dubbing his system “Anekanta Vedanta”, where “anekanta” is the Jain concept “non-one-sided” (2020: 158).

34. It is clearer to say “reality-providing” cause vs. material cause to clarify that Brahman is not material (Rambachan 2006: 126, footnote 10). He offers a helpful analogy:

Like a spider projecting a web from itself, but unlike a bird building its nest, Brahman brings forth the world without the aid of anything extraneous. (2006: 70)

35. In support, he quotes: “Let me be many, let me be born”, Taittiriya Upanisad 2.6.1.

36. Davies’ framing implies that one thing produces another thing, but other perfect being theologians deny that God is a thing at all. The objectors are still generally dualists, though, taking God’s nature to be absolutely distinct from the cosmos’ because, e.g., God transcends the world.

37. The Greek philosophers each had different names and ideas of the ultimate, but most used nascent perfections. To offer just two examples from the pre-Socratics: Parmenides’ described his “One Being” as “unborn, imperishable, whole, unique, immovable and without end” (in Guthrie 1965, see especially pp. 26 and 31, verses 3–5 and 22–25 of fr. 8, see early mention of simplicity, immutability, and eternality), and Anaxagoras’ said “Mind”

is something infinite and independent, and is mixed with no thing….the finest and purest of all things, and has all judgment of everything and greatest power, and everything that has life, both greater and smaller, all these Mind controls. (in Guthrie 1965: 272–273, with proto-concepts of aseity, axiological perfection, impeccability, omniscience and omnipotence)

38. On dropping immutability and impassibility:

We clearly find in Scripture, it is argued, that God does experience emotional change—for example, really does rejoice and/or become sorrowful in response to our actions. This however, is not an essential change in God’s nature. God is essentially perfect in every way. And for God to be affected by (appropriately emotively dependent on) what happens to those with whom God is in relationship makes God a more complete and admirable being than one who is incapable of experiencing such change. (Basinger 2013: 266)

39. Both are directed to x, and thus can be unfulfilled when not x and fulfilled when x, etc. See Pfeifer 2016: 44–46.

40. In her treatment of Alexander’s model, Emily Thomas noted its merotheistic God-world relation, without giving it a name:

Alexander is sometimes taken to be a “panentheist”. If panentheism is taken to mean that the universe is “in” God, then this characterization is straightforwardly incorrect: in fact, Alexander holds that deity is strictly contained “in” the universe. (2016: 255)

41. For the contemporary revival of axiarchism, see Derek Parfit 1998, Nicholas Rescher 2010, John Leslie 1979, 1989, 2001 and 2016. Though Leslie in particular argues for an “extreme” form of axiarchism on which the purely ideal “goodness of [a] possible world is what makes it actual” (Tim Mulgan 2017: sec. 1.1), Bishop and Perszyk ratchet back to a milder axiarchism, on which something concretely real makes the universe actual, namely actual, concrete “full realizations of the supreme good” (2017: 613). Mulgan argues that axiarchism is not as implausible as it might sound: it is already at work in the ontological argument and the fine-tuning argument; it has a fit with the growing “non-naturalism among moral philosophers”, and more (2017: sec. 1.1 and 1.2). He also offers his own axiarchic view there in which reality comes to be because it has a purpose, but because the purpose is not about us, he calls this an “ananthropocentric purposivism”. Mulgan’s view will be referenced in Section 2.3 where its ananthropocentrism surfaces in a standard model of the Dao.

42. One still might ask though with Marilyn McCord Adams how “we eliminate the parallel hypothesis” that things seem as directed to evil as they do to Love (2016: 137)? Bishop and Perszyk respond that euteleological Christians anyway can answer a posteriori: Jesus’ death and resurrection show that the power of love is stronger than the power of evil, so Love will win in the end (2016: 124).

43. Even if deity is formally the next level the universe will realize, this does not entail that it is the universe’s telos. It is possible that a next stage of development can, far from drawing purpose out of what came before, actually obscure it, as a prolonged death without dignity can make “a life that has been well lived…ever after [be] seen through the smudged glass of its last few years” (Nuland 1995: 105).

44. There is a debate among scholars about whether to define the start of Daoism with the Daodejing or with the first definable Daoist community, generally taken to be when in 142 CE Zhang Ling became the first Celestial Master of what became Celestial Master Daoism, a movement which spread to all parts of China by the fourth century. For more see Kleeman 2016.

45. Yinyang is a binary “pattern embedded in the nature of all beings”, from being receptive/still/empty, waxing to being creative/energetic/full, then waning back again. See Wang 2012: 41ff.

46. One important competing interpretation of 0 and 1 is visible in both Schipper and Robson who separately suggest that 0 is primordial chaos which “holds within itself the whole universe but in a diffuse, undifferentiated and potential state” [not identified as the Dao] and 1 is Qi, pure energy-matter that emerges from the chaos, followed by yinyang, etc. (Schipper 1982 [1993: 35]; Robson 2015: 1483).

47. Moreover, even if we were to read the standard model as a monism as in, e.g., traditional Advaita Vedanta, it would still offer a fresh insight because being and non-being are reversed: in Advaita, Brahman is being and the cosmos is nonbeing, a mere appearance; in the common view of Daoism traced here, Dao is nonbeing and makes possible the world of beings.

48. “Dao is not really ‘infinite’ nor ‘transcendent’ but infinitesimal, the faintest, most imperceptible of breaths, the darkest shade of light, the smallest possible contrast that, in its infinite fractal-like recursions, multiplies to constitute the shocking wealth of cosmic power. This is the ultimate mystery of Dao: that subtle void and intangible formlessness should be the root of all becoming” (Kohn 2001: 18). In other words, as Stephen Yablo once said in an entirely different context: this is apparently meager input with torrential output.

49. The full quote from Kierkegaard is:

If one who lives in the midst of Christendom goes up to the house of God, the house of the true God, with the true conception of God in his knowledge, and prays, but prays in a false spirit; and one who lives in an idolatrous community prays with the entire passion of the infinite, although his eyes rest upon an idol: where is there [the] most truth? The one prays in truth to God though he worships an idol; the other prays falsely to the true God, and hence worships in fact an idol. (1846/1974, pp. 179–180)

50. As Elliott put it, the more general the model of the ultimate, the greater its “epistemic comfort”, its “honest chance of being true” (2017: 105 and footnote 28).

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