Notes to Harriet Taylor Mill

1. Friedrich Hayek gives the date as 10 October (2015, 19); Jacobs, in the introductory material to The Complete Works of Harriet Taylor Mill, gives it as 8 October ([CW] 1998, xli).

2. Jacobs also collects a biographical essay on the printer William Caxton, which appears in a book published by the Society for the Diffusion of Useful Knowledge in 1833, in the Complete Works ([CW] 1998, 238–91). In her prefactory remarks on this essay, she comments that the fragmentary drafts in Taylor Mill’s and John Taylor’s hand, which were apparently written several years earlier, bear little resemblance to the published version (1998, 237). This may indicate that Taylor Mill continued to edit and polish the essay over a considerable period, as Jacob supposes. Another explanation, however, is suggested by the fact that other sources attribute the published essay to a different author, a William Stevenson. These fragments may instead have been intended to serve as part of a review of Caxton’s work, a hypothesis endorsed by both Hayek (2015, 22) and McCabe (2022). McCabe further notes that most of the fragmentary drafts are in John Taylor’s handwriting, not Taylor Mill’s.

3. Earlier versions of this entry described the works discussed in this subsection as being of “ limited philosophical import” and the occasional works in particular as being “rhetorically powerful” but bereft of “philosophical discussions of any great depth or rigor.” Note that these descriptions applied only to these specific texts, not to Taylor Mill herself or the totality of her contributions. This calls for emphasis because a recent paper that quotes these phrases may have inadvertently given a different impression (Philips 2018, 630). This language has been revised partly to forestall further confusion on this point.

4. Clearly this entry could not have been made until the Mills married, several years after the Principles was published. In fact, the bibliography’s editors relate that after the first page the entries were made in a hand that is not Mill’s and that probably belongs either to Helen Taylor or an amanuensis she employed. This might indicate that it was not compiled until Mill was working on his Autobiography with Helen’s assistance (MacMinn et al. 1945, viii).

5. Taylor Mill was also of considerable help to Mill in negotiating with the Principles’ publisher, choosing fonts, etc. (J. S. Mill, [TLL], 17).

6. In The Subjection of Women, Mill writes more generally:

Hardly anything can be of greater value to a man of theory and speculation who employs himself not in collecting materials of knowledge by observation, but in working them up by processes of thought into comprehensive truths of science and laws of conduct, than to carry on his speculations in the companionship, and under the criticism, of a really superior woman. There is nothing comparable to it for keeping his thoughts within the limits of real things, and the actual facts of nature. A woman seldom runs wild after an abstraction. ([TSW], 306)

7. Mill describes morality as an art as contradistinguished from a science in his essay “On the Definition of Political Economy; and on the Method of Investigation Proper to It.” This essay was first published in 1836, but was apparently originally drafted in 1831 (J. S. Mill, [EES], 309, 319–20). The essay of Taylor Mill’s in question was written on paper watermarked in 1832. Admittedly, the possibility exists that the art/science distinction was added to Mill’s essay in the revision process prior to publication.

8. Worth noting in this regard is Mill’s criticism of Taylor Mill’s assertion that, if given the opportunity, the cleverer members of a community would find it “easy” to raise the children of the next generation to be “perfect,” and could do so within ten years. Mill responds that “I cannot persuade myself that you do not greatly overrate the ease of making people unselfish. Granting that in ‘ten years’ the children of a community might by teaching be made ‘perfect’ it seems to me that to do so there must be perfect people to teach them” (J. S. Mill, [TLL], 19).

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Dale E. Miller <>

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