Supplement to Heinrich Rickert

Rickert’s Philosophy of Mathematics

Rickert’s philosophy of mathematics consists of a short book, Das Eine, die Einheit und die Eins (hereafter EEE), first published in Logos (2/26, 1911–1912), then substantially revised in 1924. Most of its arguments relate to Rickert’s epistemological works (see 1888, 1892, 1909, 1930) and clarify their central claims. However, none of these works addresses mathematical issues exclusively considered in EEE.

Here, Rickert elaborates his critical response to logicism, mainly Natorp’s but also Frege’s (see Dewalque 2007; Catarzi 2016), to the extent that he develops an “implicit comparison” (Heidegger 1987: 179) with Natorp’s Logische Grundlagen (1910). Roughly put, Rickert opposes the reducibility of numbers to logical constructions and defends the separation of logic and arithmetic (see EEE: 1–8, 75–93). For this purpose, he adopts a semantic strategy that reduces logic to the subject-predicate relation (see EEE: 3–27; Friedman 2000: 30) and consistently shows that logical identity and mathematical equality differ (see EEE: 27–53, 72–75). On these premises, Rickert argues for a notion of number characterized by specific alogical properties (see EEE: 58–72).

1. Beyond Logicism and Empiricism

EEE’s basic tenet is that mathematics and logic differ despite prima facie similarities. Their objects share some properties; they all have ideality, mind-independency and don’t relate causally. “Mathematics”, says Rickert, “deals with objects that are not ‘real’ in the sense that physical or psychical objects are” (EEE: 2). Similarly, logic involves irreal (i.e., insensible) or ideal objects, different from physical objects or psychical perceptions. So arose a confusion about their boundaries, which Rickert intends to disentangle by showing that, although mathematically elementary, a number isn’t something purely logical. Instead, he sees its nature including alogical properties (i.e., rational or theoretical, although not in the logical sphere), distinguished from the illogical (i.e., irrational) properties of mere sensations, such as ineffable feelings.

Consistently, Rickert argues against those views opposing these claims, starting with Mill’s (and Husserl’s) abstractionism or empirical psychologism. So, he initially sides with Natorp and Frege against Mill (see Frege 1884; Natorp 1910), who reduces numbers to “abstract concepts derived from groups of real things or events” (EEE: 6). Instead, Rickert holds that “numbers form an ideal realm per se” (EEE: 7) and obey laws, which real objects don’t share. However, Rickert eventually rejects Frege’s logicism and its most “dangerous” instance, namely Natorp’s rational psychologism. This latter looks like hidden empiricism since it mistakenly overlaps numerical objects and real acts of “positing,” which Rickert understands as “a psychical reality flowing in time.” Therefore, rational psychologists step out of the logical field because the alogical component imperceptibly employed in their foundation of mathematics is “the thought itself”, namely “the real and psychical process [taking place] in time” (EEE: 53). So, it’s an ill-conceived attempt to logically derive numbers from a real numbering. Indeed, for Rickert, learning to number is a psychological process, but numbers themselves aren’t (see EEE: 7).

On the contrary, Rickert detaches what is logical from our actual thinking and restricts it to the logical object alone. As the main principle of his epistemology states:

The logically thinking subject can only recognize what is valid independently of him/her or “objectively” (EEE: 57).

The argument recurs throughout Rickert’s epistemological writings (see Rickert 1892: 67, 1914: 209). Accordingly, knowledge starts by apprehending a logical object independent of any immanency, namely recognizing a “theoretical value” that rests in itself and transcends any subject (see Rickert 1921: 114). In this way, the cognizing subject relates to a “formal transcendent ought,” which Rickert regards as a “validity”, namely a “special kind of being but not of existing” (EEE: 83; see Rickert 1892: 63–72; 1909: 193–208). Therefore, a large part of EEE focuses on analyzing the logical object and its irreducible gap with mathematical objects (i.e., numbers). For this purpose, Rickert “looks for a point of view that lies beyond empiricism and rationalism” (EEE: 7), called “transcendental empiricism” (EEE: 8, 87) after Hessen’s suggestion (1909).

2. The Logical Object

With this notion, Rickert rethinks the Kantian a priori and its transcendental purpose of providing the conditions of (the possibility of) cognition and its objects. However, unlike Kant, he grounds these conditions in semantics, detaching any mind-dependency. Rickert started to develop this argument a few years before EEE, when he was looking for a cognitive norm of thinking that could bestow truth and objectivity to our claims (see Rickert 1892: 1; Oliva 2006: 47–86; Zijderveld 2006: 104–10). To this extent, EEE represents a development of Rickert’s epistemology, moving from that former norm, based on a broadly conceived subject-object opposition (see Rickert 1892: 7–10; 1909), to a specific semantic model. In EEE’s second edition, Rickert discusses four definitions of the logical object, improved in other writings (see Rickert 1921) after the first edition.

D1 “Something in general”

With D1, Rickert aims to justify his semantic shift of the Kantian notion of a priori. As far as I cannot think of anything without thinking of something, my act of thinking always presupposes something in general, namely an elementary semantic unit for designating anything particular. Every act of thinking (i.e., cognizing) thus contains the logical object as its transcendental condition. “At first”, says Rickert,

we only wanted to know the model of an “object in general” or the minimum of components, without which the theoretical thinking of anything is not possible. (EEE: 27)

Accordingly, in every thought, he first distinguishes the subjective act of thinking from the object of thought. This latter corresponds to “Something that is thought in general”, which Rickert also calls “the Logical”, namely a mind-independent “Logos” hidden in every thought (EEE: 9–10).

D2 “The connection of form and content”

“In every Something”, continues Rickert, “one can distinguish form and content” (EEE: 11; see Rickert 1921: 52–3). Thinking logically about Something means thinking a content that necessarily has the form of One (das Eine). However, this content per se isn’t anything particular or alogical coming from the outside of the purely logical object. On the contrary, every object, including the logical one, consists of form and content. Hence, this content per se is formal and general, lacking any specific materiality. It denotes “the logical ‘place’ for anything alogical” and so “necessarily belongs in the purely logical objectivity, namely the formality of the theoretical object in general” (EEE: 12).

D3 “The unity of the One & the Other”

D2 shows that form and content as elements of every object demand each other “because”, clarifies Rickert,

there is no object that is either only the content or only the form of One (identity), but always both together. (EEE: 18)

They depend on each other and only together constitute “the identical What or Something” (Ibid). Accordingly, the purely logical object ultimately consists of a “relation of relata, i.e., the One and the Other or form and content” (Ibid). This relationship reveals “the synthetic unity of the object”, through which “the multiplicity of its elements is interconnected” (EEE: 24). Nevertheless, this unity differs not only from the simple and undifferentiated unity of identity since it demands difference and otherness, but also from the semantic unity of the singular since it means a plurality.

D4 “The subject-predicate relation”

Here, Rickert conveys all the properties stated in the previous definitions and finally reads “form and content” as “predicate and subject,” respectively.

With predicate, we must first understand only the form that the act of judgment ascribes to a content. Accordingly, the subject is only the formed content. In this original connection or “syntheses” of subject and predicate, i.e., the connection of content and form, we then actually have the simplest judgment. (EEE: 44)

For Rickert, the semantic relation of subject and predicate matches the metaphysical connection of content and form. Although the former represents a development of the latter, it retains some aspects that we don’t recognize in modern logic. Here, standard-form categorical claims correlate two classes denoted by the subject and predicate terms. They assert that either all or part of the S-term is “included in” or “excluded from” the P-term. However, this membership doesn’t affect the terms. Quite the contrary, Rickert maintains that the semantic relation brings forth a new object since the predicate modifies the subject by newly forming its content. In this sense, “Every ‘subject’ denoted by a word already has a ‘predicate.’” (EEE: 45)

Rickert derives D4, central to his philosophy (including the late works, see Rickert 1930), from multiple sources, starting from Brentano (1874). In 1888, he refers to Sigwart (1873/1878), Lotze (1874), Lange (1877), Schuppe (1878), and Windelband (1882). In 1892, he also considered Bergmann (1879). Finally, advancing Rickert’s view, his student Lask (1912) entirely relies on D4.

Following Windelband (1910, 1913), Rickert distinguishes logical identity from mathematical equality. His philosophy of mathematics stands or falls on it. If the logical object already represented natural numbers, it should also share their properties. In \(\mathbf{N}\), the equation \(1=1\) is always true. Yet, this isn’t the case if \(1=1\) stands for form and content or the One & the Other. They find their identity by mutual exclusion: e.g., let \(F\) and \(C\) stand for form and content, respectively, then, we obtain “\(\forall x(Fx \leftrightarrow \neg Cx)\)”. The form (i.e., the One) is identical to whatever the content (i.e., the Other) is not, and vice versa. Further, form and content cannot switch places as though they were elements of an equation. Hence, they cannot be numbers since the commutative law fails: \(FC\ne CF\) since the form can never become its own content, nor the content its own form.

Finally, the expressions “\(a\) is \(a\)” (i.e., \(a=a)\) and “\(a\) is equal to 2” (i.e., \(a=2)\) differ, although both employ the same “=” sign due to the lack of better options. Anything is identical to itself and to itself alone, but under certain circumstances, everything can be equal to everything else, namely partially identical (see Husserl 1891: 103). However, each logical moment (i.e., form or content) has no other parts. Therefore, under no circumstance can they be equaled. So, concludes Rickert, identity excludes alterity, while equality requires it. As Aquinas argues, “aequalitas diversorum est”, i.e., “equality requires distinct things” (De Veritate, I-3), or Meister Eckhart claims, “Gleichheit besteht im Unterschied”, i.e., “equality consists of difference” (Predigt 19). On the contrary, identity turns into tautology. The mathematical equality “\(a=2\)” entails “\(a - 2=0\)”, but the logical identity \(a=a\) becomes \(0=0\) (whatever value we attribute to \(a)\), namely a tautology. Here Rickert detects the presence of logical properties in mathematics. Any natural number equal to itself ends in the recurring tautology \(0=0\), which he ultimately derives from logical identity.

3. The Numerical Object

For Rickert, we obtain positive integers only when the logical object acquires alogical components (i.e., properties; hereafter P), thus determining its general and empty content. He identifies four of them.

P1 “Homogeneous medium”

Numbers require a spacetime-like field where the same object can recur multiple times in different places. This field must guarantee the coexistence of identity and diversity, which Frege calls “identity combined with distinguishability” (1884 §40). E.g., in the equation \(1+1=2\), the same 1 recurs twice; the only difference between its first and second recurrence is the position in the field. So, we can even switch the first 1 and the second 1 without altering the identity of the object “1.” This replaceability, remarks Rickert, is “inadmissible in the purely logical dimension” and “means complete equality” (EEE: 58–9). Through it,

the numerical one is the object in general [i.e., the logical object] that lies in various places of time remaining, nevertheless, always identical. (EEE: 59–60)

P2 “Order”

Numbers need order since the medium per se lacks progression, i.e., an arrow pointing to a direction. Without an arrangement, numbers would merely display a cluster of similar objects. Unlike the other real numbers, positive integers must obey a well-ordering principle stating that every nonempty set of \(\mathbf{N}^+\) has a least element (i.e., a minimum). So, if \(A\) is a set such that \(A\subseteq \mathbf{N}^+\) and \(A\ne\varnothing\), then there is a natural number \(m\) such that \(m\in A\) and \(m \le a\), for all \(a \in A\). Rickert believes that the \(m \le a\) relies on quantity.

P3 “Quantity”

Accordingly, the logical object must be quantified, starting with an arbitrary minimum amount that could set the standard unit for plurality. Hence, its content must receive a particular quantum. Then, the claim \(1+1=2\) could mean that the same object or quantum (i.e., 1) seating in two different places (i.e., \(1+1)\) equals another object or quantum (i.e., 2). Although 1 and 2 are different objects, the quantity of \(1+1\) must be tantamount to 2 for the equation to be true. How is this possible, however? In \(1+1=2\), the logical object recurs three times in three places. The first two times, it changes the place alone. The third time, it changes the quantified content. The objects \(1+1\) equal object 2 because they share the same quantity.

Therefore, the number is an object or something whose quality must assume a quantitative connotation, namely a quantitative content in the form of identity. So, the singular [number, i.e., 1] differs from the identical and general something [i.e., the logical object] not only through its place in the homogeneous medium but also through its qualitative content—something general has indeed only a “general content” and not yet a “content of this content”; similarly, the plural [number, i.e., \(x\ge 2\)] now stands for a quantitative unity, namely a merging of more singulars equal to it. (EEE: 64)

P4 “Series”

Numbers display a series of quantitative inequalities, not merely logical sequences. “If 2 and 3”, clarifies Rickert,

would solely differ from each other, without any further characterization of their diversity, we could never compare them as numbers,


know that each quantum constituting the object \(1+1+1\) (equal to the number 3) is also equal to each quantum constituting the object \(1+1\) (equal to the number 2). (EEE: 66)

E.g., we will never know “whether 3 is larger than 2 or the other way around” (Ibid). Accordingly, Rickert defines the series as collecting quantities, added in succession from the smaller to the larger. Each number differs because its unique quantity corresponds to a unique place within the series.

4. The Historical Relevance

In conclusion, in the neo-Kantian School of Baden (see Heis 2018), EEE represents the only contribution to the foundation of mathematics, although outshined by the much more discussed writings of the neo-Kantian School of Marburg such as Cohen’s (1878, 1883), Natorp’s (1903, 1910), and Cassirer’s (1907, 1910). Indeed, Rickert’s popularity mainly derives from his axiological writings (see Rickert 1899, 1914; Krijnen 2001: 336–439, 2014; Zijderveld 2006: 139–217). Nevertheless, EEE’s first edition had a favorable reception, especially among critics of the Marburg School, such as Frischeisen-Köhler (1912), Marck (1917), Herrigel (1913/1921), Stenzel (1924), and, more importantly, Müller (1922, 1923), who develops a Rickert-like logical foundation of mathematics, later discussed by Reichenbach (1923) and Bernays (1924).


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The supplement above is by Luca Oliva. The main entry is by Andrea Staiti.

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