Notes to Solomon Ibn Gabirol [Avicebron]

1. It is important to note that while we might transliterate his name into Hebrew as “Ibn Gevirol” or “Ibn Gavirol,” the family name is most likely a combination of the Arabic “Ibn Jubayr” (“b” sound, no “v” sound in Arabic) with the Spanish suffix “ol.” See Schirmann-Fleischer 1995, p. 262, n. 30. Also, as the “Ibn” of “Ibn Jubaryol” is here part of the family name, the Hebrew would not be “Shelomoh ben Yehuda ben Gabirol” but “Shelomoh ben Yehuda Ibn Gabirol”. I am thankful to Profs. Joel Kraemer and Peter Cole for helping me with the origins of this name.

2. Ibn Daud includes Ibn Zaddiq's dating in his own work; see Loewe 1989, p. 23, and fn. 12, p. 170. Abraham Zacuto also cites 1070 (see Loewe 1989, p. 23 and fn. 13, p. 170). We do not have too many biographical details on Ibn Gabirol's life; for overviews, see: Loewe 1989, pp. 3–26; on the 1021/2 dating of his birth, see Bargebuhr 1976, p. 54; for defense of the later death date of 1070, see Loewe 1989, p. 23; see too: Sirat 1985, p. 68; Guttmann 1973, p. 101. For an informative journey through Ibn Gabirol's life as a poet and philosopher, read Peter Cole's “Andalusian Alphabet,” an abecedarium of the facts, figures and poetic flourishes of the great thinker; cf. “Solomon Ibn Gabirol: An Andalusian Alphabet,” Cole 2001, pp. 3–37. See too Schlanger 1968; Brunner 1965.

3. Loewe suggests tuberculosis of the skin or furunculosis (boils), and refers us to poetic source texts in which Ibn Gabirol lists symptoms; see Loewe 1989, p. 18, and fn. 3 on page 169.

4. Moses Ibn Ezra writes of Ibn Gabirol: “…Despite his vocation for philosophy and learning that he had acquired, his irascible temperament dominated his intellect, nor could he rein the demon that was within himself. It came easily to him to lampoon the great with salvo upon salvo of mockery and sarcasm…”; from his Kitab al-muhadarah w'al-mudhakharah, translated from the Arabic in Loewe 1989, pp. 17–18. In like spirit, Cole's abecedarium on Ibn Gabirol has an entry under “jerk”: “…The stench of his boasting and sense of self-worth, his truculence and misanthropy, his inability to sustain friendships or stay in one place for any length of time, even his essential sense of the world and time and fame as hostile—all the evidence points to his having been, as Berryman said of Rilke, a jerk”; see Cole 2001, p. 20.

5. An extant Arabic fragment for the Latin text at 5.43, p. 338, lines 21–25 reveals this Arabic phrase (translated in the Latin, though, not as “fons vitae” but as “origo vitae” [in the context, in the accusative form following an “ad” preposition: “originem vitae”]). For Arabic, see Pines 1958/77, p. 59. See note 9 for clarification on Latin citations.

6. For editions in Latin and Hebrew, as well as Arabic fragments and translations, see first section of bibliography (“Work by Ibn Gabirol, Fons Vitae”). Unless otherwise noted, all English quotes from the Fons Vitae are my own translations (from the Latin, and from the Arabic and Hebrew as specified). References in this essay are as follows: References to the Fons Vitae are to 1892 Latin edition by Baeumker of the 12th century translation from Arabic into Latin which is the most complete edition (see bibliography: Ibn Gabirol 1892); citation format lists the book number (1–5) of the Fons Vitae, the section number, the page number in the Baeumker, and the line number/s). Hebrew references are to Falaquera's 13th century translation summary from Arabic to Hebrew (for Munk edition, see bibliography “Works by Ibn Gabirol, Fons Vitae”, 1853/1955; for Gatti version, see bibliography “Works by Ibn Gabirol, Fons Vitae”, 2001). Arabic references are to the text excerpts listed in Pines 1958/77 and Fenton 1976.

7. Some suggest that this individual is Abraham Ibn Daud (see discussion in Sirat 1985, pp. 141–2; Sirat thinks this identification is doubtful). Some suggest that this individual is a Jewish convert (see for example Samuelson 1987, p. 563).

8. For the Arabic fragments of Ibn Gabirol's Fons Vitae in Moses Ibn Ezra's Maqâlat al-Hadîqa fî Ma‘nâ al-Majâz wa-l-aqîqa (Ar.)/ ‘Arûgat ha-Bôsem (Heb.), see Pines 1958/77 and Fenton 1976.

9. We have only Hebrew manuscripts of what was presumably originally an Arabic text. For Hebrew edition, see Ibn Gabirol / Mibhar ha-Peninim, 1484. For English translation with introduction (and discussion of the debate about whether Ibn Gabirol is the author) see Ibn Gabirol / Cohen 1925.

10. For Throne imagery in Jewish theology (including its relation to the Divine Glory (Kavôd)), see Encyclopaedia Judaica, s.v. “Throne of God,” “Shekhina,” and “Merkabah Mysticism” (though see section 2 of this essay for a warning about reading Ibn Gabirol too quickly through too Kabbalistic a lens); see too H. A. Wolfson 1979, pp. 113–20 and Schechter 1909/1961, pp. 28, 32. In a Muslim context, the Throne of God (al-kursî) is featured in the “Throne Verse” (Quran 2:256) that opens many elaborations on this image (in other contexts, al-‘arsh refers to the Divine Throne with al-kûrsi referring to the accompanying footstool). Examples of Muslim “Throne analyses” include the Sufi identification of the Throne with the Divine Will in Abu Talib al-Makki, al-Ghazali's likening the human heart to the Throne, Ibn Masarra's link (as in Ibn Gabirol) between first matter and the Throne, the philosophers' identification of the Throne as the outermost sphere (falak al-aflâk) [in the Ikhwân as-safâ’, the outermost sphere is Throne (al-‘arsh) and the next sphere down is al-kursî (here as footstool); see Ikhwân as-safâ’ 1928, 2:22], and the later idea in Ibn Arabi of the Quranic Throne of God as “universal body” and as the heavenly sphere which encompasses all the other spheres (for discussion, see Asín-Palacios 1978, pp. 76-82, 94, et al.; see too Wensinck 1932; Nasr 1993, pp. 39, 76; Encyclopedia of Islam, s.v. “kursî”).

11. The Liber de Causis (The Book of Causes), as it became known in Latin, is a compilation of parts of Proclus' Elements of Theology which circulated in the form of an Arabic treatise, kalâm fî mahd al-khayr (Discourse on Pure Goodness); it is frequently cited in secondary literature as a key source for Ibn Gabirol, but the accuracy of this claim requires further investigation.

12. See Kaufmann 1899 on two Hebrew Kabbalistic works (ca. 14th century and later) displaying traces of this tradition: one is “Yesôd ‘Olam” by Elhonan ben Avrohom (Manuscript Ginsberg 607); the other is anonymous with no date (Cod. Paris 301). Kaufmann also notes the influence of this tradition in the 15th century, as for example in the work of Yochanan Alemanno.

13. For further discussion of the Empedoclean angle including a link between an Empedoclean notion of matter in Ibn Gabirol and the concept of love, as well as feminist implications, see Pessin 2004.

14. There are many translations of this poem; cf. Cole 2001 (pp. 137–195 and notes) [see Cole 2007 for selections of the poem in translation with notes]; Gluck 2003 (translation by Bernard Lewis, facing Hebrew pages, and notes by Gluck); Loewe 1989 (pp. 105–62, includes Hebrew text and notes).

15. See above, note 8.

16. This claim abounds in the scholarship. See, for example, Husik 1916/1958 (see p. 70), and Frank 1998 for the claim that Ibn Gabirol's notion of Will “contrasts dramatically” with Greek emanation; see too Weisheipl for this assumption, viz. that with his doctrine of Will “Avicebron clearly wishes to eliminate philosophical emanationism” (Weisheipl 1979, p. 249). But it must be noted that the mere notion of Will does not rule out emanationism; see Pessin 2003 for reconciling ‘Will’ with emanationism in the context of Plotinus, et al; see too Ivry in Altmann and Stern 2009 (reprint of 1958 edition, with foreword by Alfred Ivry), p. x (with note 6)).

17. For the passage in Plotinus, see: Plotinus, Enneads 4.8.1, as translated by Armstrong; cf. Plotinus 1966, volume IV, p. 397. For the corresponding passage in Theology of Aristotle, see Theology of Aristotle Dieterici 1882/1965, p. 8, and translation in Altmann and Stern 1958/2009, p. 191.

18. See too canto 9 of Ibn Gabirol's Keter Malkhût (Kingdom's Crown) where he equates the Fountain of Life which God's Wisdom: “You are wise, and wisdom, the source of life (meqôr hayyîm) flows from you…”

19. Though it should be noted that the Psalms verse needn't strictly be taken as describing God as a fountain of life (rather, a fountain of life is said to be “with” Him); as it applies to Ibn Gabirol's own thought, we might suggest that within the context of Neoplatonic cosmology, “fountain of life” might refer not to God but to the universal intellect, God's “first creation.” That said, he does describe the Divine Will (itself identical to the Divine Wisdom) as the “first source” [origo prima] (see Fons Vitae 5.41, p.330, line 18), which suggests that the fountain of life is God (as seen in and through his Will).

20. Though in other accounts, creation ex aliquo often refers to God's creating the universe out of an eternally co-existing material principle which is not itself said to be created ex nihilo (see the most famous example of this view in the Timaeus; for a Jewish philosophical version of this idea, see Gersonides and Abraham Ibn Ezra—for summary discussion see Pessin 2009, p. 281). If we want to describe Ibn Gabirol's cosmogony in terms of creation ex aliquo, it is important to note that it is a formation of the universe by God via matter, but via a matter itself described as created ex nihilo (though again, that might mean various things).

21. For poem in Hebrew, see Yarden 1975, 74; for English rendition, see, e.g., Cole 2001, p. 108 (with notes, pp. 261–4). The line in question in the Hebrew is: “ve-hû nikhsaf le-sûmô yêsh kemô-yêsh, kemô hôshêq ’asher nikhsaf le-dôdô.” This line has been subject to many interpretations; see Liebes 1987; Tzemah 1985; Tzur 1985; Kaufmann 1899 (pp. 116–123); Schlanger 1965; Cole 2001 (p. 108 and notes); Cole 2007 (p. 89 and notes).

22. We learn that God creates matter and form (see Fons Vitae 2.13, p. 47, line 8), and we learn in particular that Will is the creator of matter and form and moves them (Fons Vitae 2.13, p. 47, line 8). See too the claim that God the Creator creates existence [esse] composed of matter and form (5.40, p. 329, lines 3–5); in this context, it is Divine Will on which Ibn Gabirol is focusing, and so we might conclude that (as at 2.13), Ibn Gabirol is here linking the creative act to Will per se. At 5.36, p. 323, lines 17–20, we learn that Word (there identified as Will) creates and binds together matter and form and in this way permeates throughout all existence.

23. At 5.41, we learn that “Creation is the procession [exitus] of form from Will, and the influx of said form into matter, just like the procession which emanates from its source and the flowing forth of what follows from it, one after another…” (for slightly different Hebrew translation, see Blovstein in Ibn Gabirol 196[-], p. 421) [the bulk of this sentence is corrupt in the Latin] (5.41, 330, lines 17–21). In this context, Will is identified as “origo prima” (the first source), though it is only directly described as the “source” of form.

24. On Sêfer Yezîrah and Ibn Gabirol, see Liebes 1987. On possible links between Word in Ibn Gabirol and Longer Theology of Aristotle, see Schlanger 1968, p. 65. It might also be noted that Proclus equates his henads with “the word”; Proclus, De Philosophia Chaldaica 210, 27; this is pointed out by Gersh 1978, p. 25.

25. For relation between Kavôd (Glory) and intellect, see E. R. Wolfson 1990 (and see note 10 on link between Kavôd and Throne in some Jewish sources). In the Fons Vitae, Ibn Gabirol identifies first matter with the Divine Throne, and sees first matter as the essence of Intellect. In his poetry, he references God's “Kavôd” in related contexts.

26. For a related link between the notion of matter in Ibn Gabirol and a Ps. Empedoclean notion of love, see Pessin 2004 and 2005a.

27. The relationship between the Universal Hylomorphism of various Franciscans (which they understood to be the teaching of the Fons Vitae) and Ibn Gabirol's version of that teaching (viz. the actual ideas laid out in the Fons Vitae) requires further study—it is problematic in general to simply assume that the Franciscan reading of Ibn Gabirol's view is actually Ibn Gabirol's view. For an overview of some of the Christian proponents of and reactions to Universal Hylomorphism, see: Sharp 1930, Gilson 1955, Crowley 1950, Weisheipl 1979.

28. Other terms include “al-hayûlâ” (a transliteration of the Greek hûlê), and “al-mâdda.” See Encyclopedia of Islam entry on “hayûlâ.” It might be noted that a comparison of the Arabic fragments (see Pines 1958/77 and Fenton 1976) with Falaquera's Hebrew version of the Fons Vitae (see Sifroni in “Works by Ibn Gabirol, Fons Vitae”, 1962) indicates Falaquera's use of “hômer” (a standard Hebrew philosophical term for “matter”) to translate al-hayûlâ and al-mâdda, and his use of “yesôd” (lit. foundation) to translate “al-‘unsur.” [For warning on “kabbalizing” the term “yesôd” in a study of Ibn Gabirol, see section 2 of this essay].

29. While this tripart categorization helps us conceptually get at Ibn Gabirol's point, Ibn Gabirol himself in the Fons Vitae enumerates not three but five categories of matter: artefactual particular, natural particular, natural universal, celestial, and the first universal matter underlying them all (see Fons Vitae 1.17, p. 21, lines 20–3).

30. See Rudavsky 1978 for an account of the competing motifs of “form over matter” and “matter over form” in Ibn Gabirol. See Schlanger 1968, p. 292 for the argument that matter is not superior to form in Ibn Gabirol. For broad overview of negative, neutral, and positive associations with matter in the history of Jewish philosophy (including Ibn Gabirol), see Pessin 2009.

31. For the start of this kind of interpretation of Aristotle in the Greek tradition, see Simplicius' analysis of two matters in Aristotle, the prime matter and the extended corporeal matter; see Simplicius on Aristotle's Physics (Simplicius 1882), p. 229.

32. For a thorough analysis of Active Intellect, see Davidson 1972 and 1992; for an overview of Active Intellect in al-Farabi and Maimonides, see too Pessin 2005b.

33. Readers are referred to the bibliography for some of the many editions of Ibn Gabirol's Hebrew poetry (see “Hebrew Poetry Editions” in the bibliography). For English translations of some of Ibn Gabirol's poetry (and useful commentary, notes, and bibliographies for further study) see Cole 2001 and 2007 (pp. 74–110), Gluck 2003, and Scheindlin 1986 and 1991.

Copyright © 2010 by
Sarah Pessin <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free