Personal Identity

First published Tue Aug 20, 2002; substantive revision Fri Sep 6, 2019

Personal identity deals with philosophical questions that arise about ourselves by virtue of our being people (or, as lawyers and philosophers like to say, persons). This contrasts with questions about ourselves that arise by virtue of our being living things, conscious beings, material objects, or the like. Many of these questions occur to nearly all of us now and again: What am I? When did I begin? What will happen to me when I die? Others are more abstruse. They have been discussed since the origins of Western philosophy, and most major figures have had something to say about them. (There is also a rich literature on the topic in Eastern philosophy, which won't be discussed; see, e.g., Jinpa 2002, and the entry mind in Indian Buddhist philosophy.)

The topic is sometimes discussed under the protean term self. ‘Self’ is sometimes synonymous with ‘person’, but often means something different: a sort of unchanging, immaterial subject of consciousness, for instance (as in the phrase ‘the myth of the self’). The term is often used without any clear meaning and shall be avoided here.

After surveying the main questions of personal identity, the entry will focus on the one that has received most attention in recent decades, namely our persistence through time.

1. The Problems of Personal Identity

There is no single problem of personal identity, but rather a wide range of questions that are at best loosely connected. Discussions in this area do not always make clear which one is at stake. Here are the most familiar:

Who am I? Outside of philosophy, ‘personal identity’ usually refers to properties to which we feel a special sense of attachment or ownership. Someone’s personal identity in this sense consists of those properties she takes to “define her as a person” or “make her the person she is”, and which distinguish her from others. (The precise meaning of these phrases is hard to pin down.) To have an “identity crisis” is to become unsure of what one’s most characteristic properties are—of what sort of person, in some deep and fundamental sense, one is. This “personal identity” contrasts with ethnic or national identity, which consists roughly of the ethnic group or nation one takes oneself to belong to and the importance one attaches to this.

One’s personal identity in this sense is contingent and temporary: the way I define myself as a person might have been different, and can vary from one time to another. It could happen that being a philosopher and a parent belong to my identity, but not being a man and living in Yorkshire, while someone else has the same four properties but feels differently towards them, so that being a man and living in Yorkshire belong to his identity but not being a philosopher or a parent. And these attitudes are all subject to change.

Depending on how the term is defined, it may also be possible for a property to belong to someone’s “identity” without her actually having it: if I become convinced that I am Napoleon, being an emperor could be one of the properties central to the way I define myself, and thus an element of my identity, even though my belief is false.

The Who am I? question—sometimes called the characterization question (Schechtman 1996: 1)—is what determines someone’s personal identity in this sense (Glover 1988: part 2, Ludwig 1997).

Personhood. What is it to be a person, as opposed to a nonperson? What have we people got that nonpeople haven’t got? More specifically, we can ask at what point in our development from a fertilized egg there comes to be a person, or what it would take for a chimpanzee or a Martian or an electronic computer to be a person, if they could ever be. An ideal account of personhood would be a definition of the word person, taking the form ‘Necessarily, x is a person at time t if and only if … xt …’, with the blanks appropriately filled in. The most common answer is that to be a person at a time is to have certain special mental properties then (e.g. Baker 2000: ch. 3). Others propose a less direct connection between personhood and mental properties: for example that to be a person is be capable of acquiring those properties (Chisholm 1976: 136f.), or to belong to a kind whose members typically have them when healthy and mature (Wiggins 1980: ch. 6).

Persistence. What does it take for a person to persist from one time to another—to continue existing rather than cease to exist? What sorts of adventures is it possible, in the broadest sense of the word ‘possible’, for you to survive, and what sort of event would necessarily bring your existence to an end? What determines which past or future being is you? Suppose you point to a child in an old class photograph and say, “That’s me.” What makes you that one, rather than one of the others? What is it about the way she relates then to you as you are now that makes her you? For that matter, what makes it the case that anyone at all who existed back then is you? This is sometimes called the question of personal identity over time. That’s because it’s about whether the earlier being and the later being are one or two—that is, whether they are numerically identical. An answer to it is an account of our persistence conditions.

Historically this question often arises out of the hope (or fear) that we might continue to exist after we die (as in Plato’s Phaedo). Whether this could happen depends on whether biological death necessarily brings one’s existence to an end. Imagine that after your death there really will be someone, in this world or the next, who resembles you in certain ways. How would that being have to relate to you as you are now in order to be you, rather than someone else? What would the Higher Powers have to do to keep you in existence after your death? Or is there anything they could do? The answer to these questions depends on the answer to the persistence question.

Evidence. How do we find out who is who? What evidence bears on the question of whether the person here now is the one who was here yesterday? One source of evidence is first-person memory: if you remember doing some particular action (or seem to), and someone really did do it, this supports the claim that that person is you. Another source is physical continuity: if the person who did it looks just like you, or even better if she is in some sense physically or spatio-temporally continuous with you, that too is reason to think she is you. Which of these sources is more fundamental? Does first-person memory count as evidence all by itself, for instance, or only insofar as we can check it against publicly available physical facts? What should we do when they support opposing verdicts? Suppose Charlie’s memories are erased and replaced with accurate memories (or apparent memories) of the life of someone long dead—Guy Fawkes, say (Williams 1956–7). Ought we to conclude, on the basis of memory evidence, that the resulting person is not Charlie but Guy Fawkes brought back to life, or should we instead infer on the basis of physical continuity that he is simply Charlie with different memories? What principle would answer this question?

The evidence question dominated the anglophone literature on personal identity from the 1950s to the 1970s (good examples include Shoemaker 1963, 1970 and Penelhum 1967, 1970). It is important to distinguish it from the persistence question. What it takes for you to persist through time is one thing; how we ought to evaluate the relevant evidence is another. If the criminal had fingerprints just like yours, the courts may conclude that he is you. But even if they are right to do so, having your fingerprints is not what it is for a past or future being to be you: it is neither necessary (you could survive without any fingers at all) nor sufficient (someone else could have fingerprints just like yours).

Population. If the persistence question is about which of the characters introduced at the beginning of a story have survived to become those at the end of it, we may also ask how many are on the stage at any one time. What determines how many of us there are now? If there are some seven billion people on the earth at present, what facts—biological, psychological, or what have you—make that the right number? The question is not what causes there to be a certain number of people at a given time, but what there being that number consists in. It’s like asking what sort of configuration of pieces amounts to winning a game of chess, rather than what sorts of moves typically lead to winning.

You may think the number of people at any given time (or at least the number of human people) is simply the number of human organisms there are then (ignoring any that don’t count as people). But this is disputed. Some say that cutting the main connections between the cerebral hemispheres results in radical disunity of consciousness, and that because of this, two people share a single organism (see e.g. Nagel 1971; Puccetti 1973 argues that there are two people within each normal human being; see also van Inwagen 1990: 188–212). Others say that a human being with multiple personality could literally be the home of two or more thinking beings (Wilkes 1988: 127f., Rovane 1998: 169ff.; see also Olson 2003b, Snowdon 2014: ch. 7). Still others argue that two people can share an organism in cases of conjoined twinning (Campbell and McMahan 2010; see also Olson 2014).

This is sometimes called the problem of “synchronic identity”, as opposed to the “diachronic identity” of the persistence question. These terms need careful handling, however. They are apt to give the mistaken impression that identity comes in two kinds, synchronic and diachronic. The truth is simply that there are two kinds of situations where we can ask how many people (or other things) there are: those involving just one moment and those involving several.

What am I? What sort of things, metaphysically speaking, are you and I and other human people? What are our fundamental properties, in addition to those that make us people? What, for instance, are we made of? Are we composed entirely of matter, as stones are, or are we partly or wholly immaterial? Where do our spatial boundaries lie, if we are spatially extended at all? Do we extend all the way out to our skin and no further, for instance? If so, what fixes those boundaries? Are we substances—metaphysically independent beings—or is each of us a state or aspect or activity of something else?

Here are some of the main proposed answers (Olson 2007):

  • We are biological organisms (“animalism”: Snowdon 1990, 2014, van Inwagen 1990, Olson 1997, 2003a).
  • We are material things “constituted by” organisms: a person made of the same matter as a certain animal, but they are different things because what it takes for them to persist is different (Baker 2000, Johnston 2007, Shoemaker 2011).
  • We are temporal parts of animals: each of us stands to an organism as your childhood stands to your life as a whole (Lewis 1976).
  • We are spatial parts of animals: brains perhaps (Campbell and McMahan 2010, Parfit 2012), or temporal parts of brains (Hudson 2001, 2007).
  • We are partless immaterial substances—souls—as Plato, Descartes, and Leibniz thought (see also Unger 2006: ch. 7), or compound things made up of an immaterial soul and a material body (Swinburne 1984: 21).
  • We are collections of mental states or events: “bundles of perceptions”, as Hume said (1739 [1978: 252]; see also Quinton 1962, Campbell 2006).
  • There is nothing that we are: we don’t really exist at all (Russell 1985: 50, Wittgenstein 1922: 5.631, Unger 1979, Sider 2013).

There is no consensus or even a dominant view on this question.

What matters in identity? What is the practical importance of facts about our persistence? Why does it matter? What reason have you to care whether you yourself continue to exist, rather than someone else just like you existing in your place? Imagine that surgeons are going to put your brain into my head and that neither of us has any choice about this. Suppose the resulting person will be in terrible pain after the operation unless one of us pays a large sum in advance. If we were both entirely selfish, which of us would have a reason to pay? Will the resulting person—who will presumably think he is you—be responsible for your actions or for mine? (Or both, or neither?)

The answer may seem to turn entirely on whether the resulting person would be you or I. Only I can be responsible for my actions. The fact that some person is me, by itself, gives me a reason to care about him. Each person has a special, selfish interest in her own future and no one else’s. Identity itself matters practically. But some say that I could have an entirely selfish reason to care about someone else’s future for his own sake. Perhaps what gives me a reason to care about what happens to the man people will call by my name tomorrow is not that he is me, but that he is then psychologically continuous with me as I am now (see Section 4), or because he relates to me in some other way that does not imply that we are the same person. If someone other than me were psychologically continuous tomorrow with me as I am now, he would have what matters to me and I ought to transfer my selfish concern to him. Likewise, someone else could be responsible for my actions, and not for his own. Identity itself has no practical importance. (See Shoemaker 1970: 284; Parfit 1971, 1984: 215, 1995; Sosa 1990, Martin 1998.)

That completes our survey. Though some of these questions may bear on others, they are to a large extent independent. It’s important not to confuse them.

2. Understanding the Persistence Question

We turn now to the persistence question. Few concepts have been the source of more misunderstanding than identity over time. The Persistence Question is often confused with other questions or stated in a tendentious way.

The question is roughly what is necessary and sufficient for a past or future being to be someone existing now. Suppose we point to you now, describe someone or something existing at another time, and ask whether we are referring twice to one thing or once to each of two things. The persistence question asks what determines the answer to such queries. (There are precisely analogous questions about the persistence of other objects, such as dogs.)

Some take the persistence question to ask what it means to say that a past or future being is you. This would imply that we can answer it by working out the meaning of terms such as ‘person’, or by analysing the concepts they express. The answer would be knowable a priori if at all. It would also imply that necessarily all people have the same persistence conditions—that the answer to the question is the same no matter what sort of people we considered. Though some endorse these claims (Noonan 2003: 86–92), they are disputed. What it takes for us to persist might depend on whether we are biological organisms, which we cannot know a priori. And if there could be immaterial people, such as gods or angels, what it takes for them to persist might differ from what it takes for a human person to persist.

We sometimes ask what it takes for someone to remain the same person. The idea is that if you were to alter in certain ways—if you lost much of your memory, say, or became badly disabled, or had a dramatic change in character—you would no longer be the person you were before. This is not the persistence question. The two questions can have different answers. Suppose you change in such a way as to “become a different person”: the answer to the question of whether you are the same person is No. The persistence question asks, in this case, whether you would still exist. And the answer to that question is Yes: if you are a different person, then you still exist, just as you do if you remain the same person.

When we speak of remaining the same person or of becoming a different one, we mean remaining or ceasing to be a certain sort of person. For someone no longer to be the same person is for her still to exist, but to have changed in some important way. This has to do with her individual identity in the sense of the characterization question—with what sorts of changes would count as losing the properties that define someone as a person. It has nothing to do with persistence. Asking what it takes for someone to “retain her personal identity”, or to lose it, also appears to be about characterization rather than persistence.

The persistence question is often taken to ask what it takes for the same person to exist at two different times. The most common formulation is something like this:

  1. If a person x exists at one time and a person y exists at another time, under what possible circumstances is it the case that x is y?

This asks, in effect, what it takes for a past or future person to be you. We have a person existing at one time and a person existing at another, and the question is what is necessary and sufficient for them to be one person rather than two.

This is narrower than the persistence question. We may want to know whether each of us was ever an embryo or a foetus, or whether someone could survive in an irreversible vegetative state (where the resulting being is biologically alive but has no mental properties). These are clearly questions about what it takes for us to persist. But being a person is most often defined as having special mental properties. Locke, for instance, said that a person is “a thinking intelligent being, that has reason and reflection, and can consider itself as itself, the same thinking thing, in different times and places” (1975: 335). This implies that something is a person at a given time only if it has those mental properties then. It follows that early-term foetuses and human beings in a vegetative state, having no mental properties at all, are not people at those times. In that case we cannot infer anything about whether you were once an embryo or could come to be a vegetable from a principle about what it takes for a past or future person to be you.

We can illustrate the point by considering this answer to question 1:

Necessarily, a person x existing at one time is a person y existing at another time if and only if x can, at the first time, remember an experience y has at the second time, or vice versa.

That is, a past or future person is you just if you (who are now a person) can now remember an experience she had then, or she can then remember an experience you are having now. Call this the memory criterion. (It too is sometimes attributed to Locke, though it’s doubtful whether he actually held it: see Behan 1979.)

The memory criterion may seem to imply that if you were to lapse into an irreversible vegetative state, you would cease to exist (or perhaps pass to the next world): the resulting being could not be you because it would not remember anything. But no such conclusion follows. Assuming that a human vegetable is not a person, this is not a case involving a person existing at one time and a person existing at another time. The memory criterion purports to tell us which past or future person you are, but not which past or future being generally. It says what it takes for someone to persist as a person, but not what it takes for someone to persist without qualification. So it implies nothing about whether you could come to be a vegetable or even a corpse, or whether you were ever an embryo. As stated, the memory criterion is compatible with your surviving with no memory continuity at all, as long as this happens when you are not a person (Olson 1997: 22–26, Mackie 1999: 224–228).

No one who thinks that we persist by virtue of memory continuity would accept this. The memory criterion is intended to imply that if a person x exists now and a being y exists at another time--whether or not it is is a person then--they are one just if x can now remember an experience y has at the other time or vice versa. But this not an answer to Question 1: what it takes for a person existing at one time and a person existing at another time to be one rather than two. It is an answer to a more general question: what it takes for something that is a person at one time to exist at another time as well, whether as a person or not:

  1. If a person x exists at one time and something y exists at another time, under what possible circumstances is it the case that x is y?

Those who state the persistence question as Question 1 generally do so because they assume that every person is a person essentially: nothing that is in fact a person could possibly exist without being a person. (By contrast, no student is a student essentially: something that is in fact a student can exist without being a student.) This claim, “person essentialism”, implies that whatever is a person at one time must be a person at every time when she exists. It makes Questions 1 and 2 equivalent.

But person essentialism is controversial. Combined with a Lockean account of personhood, it implies that you could never have been an embryo: at best you may have come into being when the embryo that gave rise to you developed certain mental capacities. Nor could you come to be a human vegetable. For that matter, it rules out our being biological organisms, since no organism is a person essentially: every human organism starts out as an embryo and may end up in a vegetative state. It rules out both animalism and the brute-physical view described in the next section.

Whether we were once embryos or could become vegetables, or whether we are people essentially, are substantive questions that an account of our persistence should answer, not matters to be unwittingly settled in advance by the way we frame the debate. Question 1 is tendentious, by presupposing that we can only survive as people. Question 2 is neutral.

3. Accounts of Our Persistence

Four main sorts of answers to the persistence question have been proposed. The most popular are psychological-continuity views. They say that our persistence consists in some psychological relation. You are that future being that in some sense inherits its mental features from you—beliefs, memories, preferences, the capacity for rational thought, and so on—and you are that past being whose mental features you have inherited in this way. There is dispute over what sort of inheritance this has to be—whether it must be underpinned by some kind of physical continuity, for instance, and whether it requires a “non-branching” restriction. There is also disagreement about what mental features need to be inherited. (We will return to some of these points.) But most philosophers writing on personal identity since the early 20th century have endorsed some version of this view. The memory criterion mentioned earlier is an example. Advocates of psychological-continuity views include Garrett (1998), Hudson (2001, 2007), Johnston (1987, 2016), Lewis (1976), Nagel (1986: 40), Noonan (2003), Parfit (1971; 1984: 207; 2012), Perry (1972), Shoemaker (1970; 1984: 90; 1997; 1999, 2008, 2011), and Unger (1990: ch. 5; 2000).

A second answer is that our persistence consists in some sort of brute physical relation. You are that past or future being that has your body, or that is the same biological organism as you are, or the like. It has nothing to do with psychological facts. Call these brute-physical views. (Don’t confuse them with the view that physical evidence has some sort of priority over psychological evidence in finding out who is who. That has to do with the evidence question.) Their advocates include Ayers (1990: 278–292), Carter (1989), Mackie (1999), Olson (1997), van Inwagen (1990: 142–188), and Williams (1956–7, 1970).

Some try to combine these views, saying that we need both mental and physical continuity to survive, or that either would suffice without the other (Nozick 1981: ch. 1, Langford 2014).

A different sort of proposal, narrativism, is that what it takes for us to persist has to do with the stories we tell about ourselves. We understand our lives in terms of narratives about the momentous events in our past and their influence on our later decisions and character. These narratives can be “identity-constituting”. The thought is not just that they bear on our “personal identity” in the sense of the characterization question—what sort of people we are in some fundamental sense. They literally determine when we begin and end. Roughly speaking, a past being is you just if you now have narratives of the right sort identifying you with her as she was then. A future being is you just if the narratives she has then identify her with you as you are now. Remembering a past event may be necessary for it to figure in an identity-constituting narrative, but it’s not sufficient, distinguishing narrativist from psychological-continuity views. Narrativists about persistence include Schechtman (1996: esp. ch. 5, 2001) and Schroer and Schroer (2014); critics include Strawson (2008) and Olson and Witt (2019). DeGrazia 2005: ch. 3 is a helpful overview.

All these views agree that there is something that it takes for us to persist—that there are informative, nontrivial necessary and sufficient conditions for a person existing at one time to exist at another time. A fourth view, anticriterialism, denies this. Psychological and physical continuity are evidence for persistence, it says, but do not always guarantee it and may not be required. The clearest advocate of this view is Merricks (1998; see also Swinburne 1984, Lowe 1996: 41ff., 2012; Langford 2017; for criticism see Zimmerman 1998, Shoemaker 2012). There are anticriterialist views about things other than people as well. And there is debate about how anticriterialism should be understood (Olson 2012, Noonan 2011, 2019).

4. Psychological-Continuity Views

Most people—most Western philosophy teachers and students, anyway—feel immediately drawn to psychological-continuity views (Nichols and Bruno 2010 give experimental evidence for this). If your brain were transplanted, and that organ carried with it your memories and other mental features, the resulting person would be convinced that he or she was you. This can make it easy to suppose that the person would be you, and that this would be so because she was psychologically continuous with you. It is difficult, however, to get from this thought to an attractive answer to the persistence question.

What psychological relation might our persistence consist in? We have already mentioned memory: a past or future being might be you if and only if you can now remember an experience she had then, or vice versa. This proposal faces two objections, dating to Sergeant and Berkeley in the 18th century (see Behan 1979), but more famously discussed by Reid and Butler (see the snippets in Perry 1975).

First, suppose a young student is fined for overdue library books. Later, as a middle-aged lawyer, she remembers paying the fine. Later still, in her dotage, she remembers her law career, but has entirely forgotten not only paying the fine but all the other events of her youth. According to the memory criterion the young student is the middle-aged lawyer, the lawyer is the elderly woman, but the elderly woman is not the young student. This is an impossible result: if x and y are one and y and z are one, x and z cannot be two. Identity is transitive; memory continuity is not.

Second, it seems to belong to the very idea of remembering that you can remember only your own experiences. To remember paying a fine (or the experience of it) is to remember yourself paying. That makes it trivial and uninformative to say that you are the person whose experiences you can remember—that memory continuity is sufficient for us to persist. It’s uninformative because you cannot know whether someone genuinely remembers a past experience without already knowing whether she is the one who had it. Suppose we want to know whether Blott, who exists now, is the same as Clott, whom we know to have existed at some time in the past. The memory criterion tells us that Blott is Clott just if Blott can now remember an experience Clott had at that past time. But Blott’s seeming to remember one of Clott’s experiences counts as genuine memory only if Blott actually is Clott. So we should already have to know whether Blott is Clott before we could apply the principle that is supposed to tell us whether she is. (There is, however, nothing trivial or uninformative about the claim that memory connections are necessary for us to persist. We can know that the corpse resulting from my death cannot remember any events from my life without knowing already whether it’s me.)

One response to the first problem (about transitivity) is to modify the memory criterion by switching from direct to indirect memory connections: the old woman is the young student because she can recall experiences the lawyer had at a time when the lawyer remembered the student’s life. The second problem is commonly met by replacing memory with a new concept, “retrocognition” or “quasi-memory”, which is just like memory but without the identity requirement: even if it’s self-contradictory to say that you remember doing something you didn’t do but someone else did, you could still “quasi-remember” it (Penelhum 1970: 85ff., Shoemaker 1970; for criticism see McDowell 1997).

Neither move gets us far, however, as both the original and the modified memory criteria face a more obvious problem: there are many times in our pasts that we cannot remember or quasi-remember at all, and to which we are not linked even indirectly by an overlapping chain of memories. There is no time when you could recall anything that happened to you while you dreamlessly slept last night. The memory criterion has the absurd implication that you have never existed at any time when you were unconscious. The person sleeping in your bed last night must have been someone else.

A better solution replaces memory with the more general notion of causal dependence (Shoemaker 1984, 89ff.). We can define two notions, psychological connectedness and psychological continuity. A being is psychologically connected, at some future time, with you as you are now just if she is in the psychological states she is in then in large part because of the psychological states you are in now (and this causal link is of the right sort: see Shoemaker 1979). Having a current memory (or quasi-memory) of an earlier experience is one sort of psychological connection—the experience causes the memory of it—but there are others. The important point is that our current mental states can be caused in part by mental states we were in at times when we were unconscious. For example, most of your current beliefs are the same ones you had while you slept last night: they have caused themselves to continue existing. We can then say that you are psychologically continuous, now, with a past or future being just if some of your current mental states relate to those he or she is in then by a chain of psychological connections.

Now suppose that a person x who exists at one time is the same thing as something y existing at another time if and only if x is, at the one time, psychologically continuous with y as it is at the other time. This avoids the most obvious objections to the memory criterion.

It still leaves important questions unanswered, however. Suppose we could somehow copy all the mental contents of your brain to mine, much as we can copy the contents of one computer drive to another, and that this erased the previous contents of both brains. Whether this would be a case of psychological continuity depends on what sort of causal dependence counts. The resulting being (with my brain and your mental contents) would be mentally as you were before, and not as I was. He would have inherited your mental properties in a way—but a funny one. Is it the right way? Could you literally move from one organism to another by “brain-state transfer”? Psychological-continuity theorists disagree (Shoemaker (1984: 108–111, 1997) says yes; Unger (1990: 67–71) says no; see also van Inwagen 1997). (Schechtman 2001 gives a different sort of objection to the psychological-continuity strategy.)

5. Fission

A more serious worry for psychological-continuity views is that you could be psychologically continuous with two past or future people at once. If your cerebrum—the upper part of the brain largely responsible for mental features—were transplanted, the recipient would be psychologically continuous with you by anyone’s lights (even if there would also be important psychological differences). Any psychological-continuity view will imply that she would be you. If we destroyed one of your cerebral hemispheres, the resulting being would also be psychologically continuous with you. (Hemispherectomy—even the removal of the left hemisphere, which controls speech—is considered a drastic but acceptable treatment for otherwise-inoperable brain tumors: see Rigterink 1980.) What if we did both at once, destroying one hemisphere and transplanting the other? Then too, the one who got the transplanted hemisphere would be psychologically continuous with you, and would be you according to the psychological-continuity view.

But now suppose that both hemispheres are transplanted, each into a different empty head. (We needn’t pretend that the hemispheres are exactly alike.) The two recipients—call them Lefty and Righty—will each be psychologically continuous with you. The psychological-continuity view as we have stated it implies that any future being who is psychologically continuous with you must be you. It follows that you are Lefty and also that you are Righty. But that cannot be: if you and Lefty are one and you and Righty are one, Lefty and Righty cannot be two. And yet they are: there are indisputably two people after the operation. One thing cannot be numerically identical with two things that are distinct from each other. Suppose Lefty is hungry at a time when Righty isn’t. If you are Lefty, you are hungry at that time. If you are Righty, you aren’t. If you are Lefty and Righty, you are both hungry and not hungry at once: a straight contradiction.

Psychological-continuity theorists have proposed two different solutions to this problem. One, sometimes called the “multiple-occupancy view”, says that if there is fission in your future, then there are two of you, so to speak, even now. What we think of as you is really two people, who are now exactly similar and located in the same place, doing the same things and thinking the same thoughts. The surgeons merely separate them (Lewis 1976, Noonan 2003: 139–42; Perry 1972 offers a more complex variant).

The multiple-occupancy view is usually combined with the general metaphysical claim that people and other persisting things are composed of temporal parts (often called “four-dimensionalism”; see Heller 1990: ch. 1, Hudson 2001, Sider 2001a, Olson 2007: ch. 5). For each person, there is such a thing as her first half: an entity just like the person only briefer, like the first half of a meeting. On this account, the multiple-occupancy view is that Lefty and Righty coincide before the operation by sharing their pre-operative temporal parts or “stages”, and diverge later by having different temporal parts located afterwards. They are like two roads that coincide for a stretch and then fork, sharing some of their spatial parts but not others. At the places where the roads overlap, they are just like one road. Likewise, the idea goes, at the times before the operation when Lefty and Righty share their temporal parts, they are just like one person. Even they themselves can’t tell that they are two. Whether we really are composed of temporal parts, however, is disputed. (Its consequences are explored further in section 8.)

The other solution to the fission problem abandons the intuitive claim that psychological continuity by itself suffices for us to persist. It says, rather, that a past or future being is you only if she is then psychologically continuous with you and no other being is. (There is no circularity in this. We need not know the answer to the persistence question in order to know how many people there are at any one time; that comes under the population question.) This means that neither Lefty nor Righty is you. They both come into existence when your cerebrum is divided. If both your cerebral hemispheres are transplanted, you cease to exist—though you would survive if only one were transplanted and the other destroyed. Fission is death. (Shoemaker 1984: 85, Parfit 1984: 207; 2012: 6f., Unger 1990: 265, Garrett 1998: ch. 4).

This proposal, the “non-branching view”, has the surprising consequence that if your brain is divided, you will survive if only one half is preserved, but you will die if both halves are. That looks like the opposite of what we should expect: if your survival depends on the functioning of your brain (because that is what underlies psychological continuity), then the more of that organ we preserve, the greater ought to be your chance of surviving. In fact the non-branching view implies that you would perish if one of your hemispheres were transplanted and the other left in place: you can survive hemispherectomy only if the hemisphere to be removed is first destroyed. This seems mysterious. Why should an event that would normally preserve your existence bring it to an end if accompanied by a second such event—one having no causal effect on the first? If your brain is to be divided, why do we need to destroy half of it in order to save you? (For discussion, see Noonan 2003: 12–15 and ch. 7.)

The problem is especially acute if brain-state transfer counts as psychological continuity. In that case, even copying your total brain state to another brain without doing you any physical or psychological harm would kill you. (“Best-candidate” theories such as Nozick 1981: ch. 1 attempt to avoid this.)

The non-branching view makes the What matters? question especially acute. Faced with the prospect of having one of your hemispheres transplanted, there is no evident reason to prefer having the other destroyed. Most of us would rather have both preserved, even if they go into different heads. Yet on the non-branching view that is to prefer death over continued existence. This leads Parfit and others to say that that is precisely what we ought to prefer. We have no reason to want to continue existing, at least for its own sake. What you have reason to want is that there be someone in the future who is psychologically continuous with you, whether or not she actually is you.

The usual way to achieve this is to continue existing yourself, but the fission story shows that this is not necessary. Likewise, even the most selfish person has a reason to care about the welfare of the beings who would result from her undergoing fission, even if, as the non-branching view implies, neither would be her. In the fission case, the sorts of practical concerns you ordinarily have for yourself apply to someone other than you. This suggests more generally that facts about who is who have no practical importance. All that matters practically is who is psychologically continuous with whom. (Lewis 1976 and Parfit 1976 debate whether the multiple-occupancy view can preserve the conviction that identity is what matters practically.)

6. The Too-Many-Thinkers Problem

Another objection to psychological-continuity views is that they rule out our being biological organisms (Carter 1989, Ayers 1990: 278–292, Snowdon 1990, Olson 1997: 80f., 100–109, 2003a). This is because no sort of psychological continuity appears to be either necessary or sufficient for a human organism to persist. Human organisms have brute-physical persistence conditions. If your brain were transplanted, the one who ended up with that organ would be uniquely psychologically continuous with you (and this continuity would be continuously physically realized). On any psychological-continuity view, she would be you: the person would go with her transplanted brain. But no organism would go with its transplanted brain. The operation would simply move an organ from one organism to another. So it seems, anyway. It follows that if you were an organism, you would stay behind with an empty head. Even though this is never going to happen, it shows that according to psychological-continuity views we have a property that no organism has, namely possibly moving from one organism to another by brain transplant.

Again, a human organism could continue existing in an irreversible vegetative state with no psychological continuity. If you were an organism, you could too. But according to psychological-continuity views you could not. It follows that human animals have a property that we lack, namely possibly surviving as a vegetable.

This does not merely rule out our being essentially or “fundamentally” organisms, but our being organisms at all: nothing that is even contingently an organism would go with its transplanted brain, or would cease to exist just by lapsing into an irreversible vegetative state.

But a healthy, adult human organism seems a paradigm case of a thinking being. If human organisms can think, yet (as psychological-continuity views imply) we are not organisms, three difficulties arise. First, you are one of two intelligent beings sitting there and reading this entry. More generally, there are two thinking beings wherever we thought there was just one.

Second, the organism would not merely think in some way or other, but would presumably be psychologically indistinguishable from you. That would make it a person, if being a person amounts to having certain mental or behavioral properties (as on Locke’s definition)—a second person in addition to you. In that case it cannot be true that all people (or even all human people) persist by virtue of psychological continuity. Some—those that are organisms—would have brute-physical persistence conditions.

Third, it becomes hard to see how you could know whether you were a nonanimal person with psychological persistence conditions or an animal person with brute-physical ones. If you thought you were the nonanimal, the organism would use the same reasoning to conclude that it was too. For all you could ever know, it seems, you might be the one making this mistake.

We can make this epistemic problem more vivid by imagining a three-dimensional duplicating machine. When you step into the “in” box, it reads off your complete physical (and mental) condition and uses this information to assemble a perfect duplicate of you in the “out” box. The process causes temporary unconsciousness but is otherwise harmless. Two beings wake up, one in each box. The boxes are indistinguishable. Because each being will have the same apparent memories and perceive identical surroundings, each will think, for the same reasons, that he or she is you. But only one will be right. If this happened to you, it’s hard to see how you could know, afterwards, whether you were the original or the duplicate. (Suppose the technicians who work the machine are sworn to secrecy and immune to bribes.) You would think, “Who am I? Did I do the things I seem to remember doing? Or did I come into being only a moment ago, complete with false memories of someone else’s life?” And you would have no way of answering these questions. In the same way, psychological-continuity views raise the questions, “What am I? Am I a nonanimal that would go with its transplanted brain, or an animal that would stay behind with an empty head?” And here too there seem to be no grounds on which to answer them.

These three objections have been called the “too-many-thinkers” or “thinking-animal” problem.

The most popular defense of the psychological-continuity view against this objection is to say that, despite sharing our brains and showing all the outward signs of consciousness and intelligence, human organisms do not think and are not conscious. Thinking animals are not a problem for psychological-continuity views for the simple reason that there are none (Shoemaker 1984: 92–97, Lowe 1996: 1, Johnston 2007: 55; Baker 2000 is a subtle variant). If human organisms cannot be conscious, it would seem to follow that no biological organism of any sort could have any mental properties at all. Shoemaker argues that this follows from the functionalist theory of mind (1999, 2008, 2011). This threatens to imply that human organisms are “zombies” in the philosophical sense: beings physically identical to conscious beings, with the same behavior, but lacking consciousness (Olson 2018)

Another option is to concede that human organisms are psychologically indistinguishable from us, but try to explain how we can still know that we are not those organisms. The best-known proposal of this sort focuses on personhood and first-person reference. It says that not just any being with mental properties of the sort that you and I have—rationality and self-consciousness, for instance—counts as a person. A person must also persist by virtue of psychological continuity. It follows that human animals are not people (thus solving the second problem, about personhood).

Further, personal pronouns such as ‘I’, and the thoughts they express, refer only to people. So when your animal body says or thinks ‘I’, it refers not to itself but to you, the person. The organism’s statement ‘I am a person’ does not express the false belief that it is a person, but the true belief that you are. So the organism is not mistaken about which thing it is: it has no first-person beliefs about itself at all. And you are not mistaken either. You can infer that you are a person from the linguistic facts that you are whatever you refer to when you say ‘I’, and that ‘I’ never refers to anything but a person. You can know that you are not the animal thinking your thoughts because it is not a person and personal pronouns never refer to nonpeople (thus solving the third, epistemic problem). (See Noonan 1998, 2010, Olson 2002; for a different approach based on epistemic principles see Brueckner and Buford 2009.)

Or one could say that human organisms have psychological persistence conditions. Despite appearances, the transplant operation would not move your brain from one organism to another, but would cut an organism down to the size of a brain, move it across the room, and then give it new parts to replace the ones it lost—presumably destroying the animal into which the brain is implanted. (This may be the view of Wiggins (1980: 160, 180) and McDowell (1997: 237), and is unequivocally endorsed by Madden (2016); see also Langford 2014, Olson 2015: 102–106.)

7. Brute-Physical Views

None of these objections arise on animalism, the view that we are organisms. This does not imply that all organisms, or even all human organisms, are people: as we saw earlier, human embryos and animals in a persistent vegetative state may not count as people. Being a person may be only a temporary property of you, like being a student. Nor does animalism imply that all people are organisms. It is consistent with the existence of wholly inorganic people: gods or angels or conscious robots. It does not say that being an animal is part of what it is to be a person (a view defended in Wiggins 1980: 171 and Wollheim 1984: ch. 1 and criticized in Snowdon 1996). Animalism leaves the answer to the personhood question entirely open. (It is consistent, for instance, with Locke’s definition quoted in section 2.)

Assuming that organisms persist by virtue of some sort of brute-physical continuity, animalism implies a version of the brute-physical view. Some endorse a brute-physical view without saying that we are animals. They say that we are our bodies (Thomson 1997), or that our identity through time consists in the identity of our bodies (Ayer 1936: 194). This has been called the bodily criterion of personal identity. It is obscure, and its relation to animalism is uncertain.

Most versions of the brute-physical view imply that human people have the same persistence conditions as certain nonpeople, such as dogs. And it implies that our persistence conditions differ from those of immaterial people, if they are possible. It follows that there are no persistence conditions for people as such. (Baker (2000: 124) objects strenuously to this.)

The most common objection to brute-physical views is the repugnance of their implication that you would stay behind if your brain were transplanted (e.g. Unger 2000; for an important related objection see Johnston 2007, 2016). In other words, brute-physical views are unattractive in just the way that psychological-continuity views are attractive.

Animalists generally concede the force of this, but take it to be outweighed by other considerations. First, animalism avoids the too-many-thinkers problem. Second, it is compatible with our beliefs about who is who in real life. Every actual case in which we take someone to survive or perish is a case where a human organism does so. Psychological-continuity views, by contrast, conflict with the appearance that each of us was once a foetus. When we see an ultrasound picture of a 12-week-old foetus, we ordinarily think we are seeing something that will, if all goes well, be born, learn to speak, and eventually become an adult human person. Yet none of us is in any way psychologically continuous with a 12-week-old foetus.

And the “transplant argument” may be less compelling than it appears (Snowdon 2014: 234). Suppose you had a tumor that would kill you unless your brain were replaced with a healthy donated organ. This would have grave side-effects: it would destroy your memories, plans, preferences, and other mental properties. It may not be clear whether you could survive such a thing. But it’s not obvious that you could not survive it either. Maybe the operation could save your life, though at great cost. We cannot confidently rule this out even if the new brain gave you memories, plans, and preferences from the donor. But if it’s not obvious that the brain recipient would not be you, then it’s not obvious that it would be the donor. A brain transplant might be metaphysically analogous to a liver transplant. The claim is not that this is obviously true, but just that it’s not obviously false. And in that case it’s not obvious that a person must go with her transplanted brain.

8. Wider Themes

The debate between psychological-continuity and brute-physical views cannot be settled without considering more general matters outside of personal identity. For instance, psychological-continuity theorists need to explain why human organisms are unable to think as we do. This will require an account of the nature of mental properties. Or if human organisms can think, they must explain how we can know that we are not those organisms. This will turn on how the reference of personal pronouns and proper names works, or on the nature of knowledge.

Some general metaphysical views suggest that there is no unique right answer to the persistence question. The best-known example is the ontology of temporal parts mentioned in section 5. It says that for every period of time when you exist, short or long, there is a temporal part of you that exists only then. This gives us many likely candidates for being you—that is, many different beings now sitting there and reading this. Suppose you are a material thing, and that we know what determines your spatial boundaries. That should tell us what counts as your current temporal part or “stage”—the temporal part of you located now and at no other time. But that stage is a part of a vast number of temporally extended objects (Hudson 2001: ch. 4).

For instance, it is a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological continuity (Section 4) among its stages. That is, one of the beings thinking your current thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically continuous with each of the others and with no other stage. If this is what you are, then you persist by virtue of psychological continuity. Your current stage is also a part of a being whose temporal boundaries are determined by relations of psychological connectedness. That is, one of the beings now thinking your thoughts is an aggregate of person-stages, each of which is psychologically connected with each of the others and to no other stage. This may not be the same as the first being, as some stages may be psychologically continuous with your current stage but not psychologically connected with it. If this is what you are, then psychological connectedness is necessary and sufficient for you to persist (Lewis 1976). What’s more, your current stage is a part of a human organism, which persists by virtue of brute-physical continuity, and a part of many bizarre and gerrymandered objects, such as “contacti persons” (Hirsch 1982, ch. 10). Some even say that you are your current stage itself (Sider 2001a, 188–208). And there would be many other candidates.

The temporal-parts ontology implies that each of us shares our current thoughts with countless beings that diverge from one another in the past or future. If this were true, which of these things should we be? Of course, we are the things we refer to when we say ‘I’, or more generally the referents of our personal pronouns and proper names. But these words would be unlikely to succeed in referring to just one sort of thing—to only one of the many candidates on each occasion of utterance. There would probably be some indeterminacy of reference, so that each such utterance referred ambiguously to many different candidates. That would make it indeterminate what things, and even what sort of things, we are. And insofar as the candidates have different histories and different persistence conditions, it would be indeterminate when we came into being and what it takes for us to persist (Sider 2001b).


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Other Internet Resources


Some material in this entry appeared previously in E. Olson, ‘Personal Identity’, in The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Mind, edited by S. Stich and T. Warfield, Oxford: Blackwell, 2003.

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