#### Supplement to Infinite Regress Arguments

## Metaphysical Foundationalism and the Well-Foundedness of Grounding

Metaphysical Foundationalism is the view that there exist some absolutely fundamental entities upon which all non-fundamental entities ultimately ontologically depend. If we have a non-fundamental entity \(E_{A1}\) that ontologically depends on \(E_{B1}\) and \(E_{B2}\), and \(E_{B1}\) depends on \(E_{C1}\) and \(E_{C2}\), and \(E_{B2}\) depends on \(E_{C3}\) and \(E_{C4}\), and so on, Metaphysical Foundationalism says that we must be able to trace the various branching strands of ontological dependence ultimately down to some fundamental entities: a collection of things that do not depend on anything, and upon which all the non-fundamental entities above them on the branch ultimately depend.

Sometimes philosophers, in describing Metaphysical Foundationalism,
describe it as the view that ontological dependence (or cognate
notions) must be *well-founded*. For example, Karen Bennett
(2017, 116), talking about building relations, says
“Well-foundedness says that *every* building chain
terminates in something unbuilt”. Ricki Bliss (2013, 416) says
“A well-founded grounding chain is one that is grounded in
something fundamental.” Jonathan Schaffer (2010, 37) says
“Well-foundedness is imposed by requiring that all priority
chains terminate.” And Theodore Sider (2011, 115), talking
about *in virtue of*, says that it is natural to assume that
this is well-founded “in the sense that if a truth holds in
virtue of any truth at all, then it is connected by an in-virtue-of
chain to some truth that does not hold in virtue of any truth
(‘no unbounded descending chains of
in-virtue-of’)”. There are many other such quotes.

However, ‘well-founded’ has a strict meaning in the branch of mathematics from which it comes, order theory, and if used in its strict technical sense, the claim that ontological dependence is well-founded is a stronger view than Metaphysical Foundationalism.

For a relation to be well-founded with respect to some domain is for every non-empty subset of that domain to contain a minimal element—that is, some element that is not greater than (with respect to the order imposed by that relation) any other thing in that domain. So for example, ‘is taller than’ is a well-founded relation on the domain of human beings, because for any non-empty set of human beings, there will be a minimal element: a human being who is not taller than any other human being in that set—that is, a person who is the least tall, or who is tied for being least tall.

When considering ontological dependence, element \(x\) is greater than element \(y\) just in case \(x\) depends on \(y\): the more minimal element is the more fundamental one. This is somewhat stipulative: it is simply to capture the thought that the ‘first’ layer of the sequence is made up of the absolutely fundamental things, if such there be. So the minimal elements in any set of things will be those things (if there are any) that do not depend on any thing(s) in that set. So for ontological dependence to be well-founded simpliciter (i.e., over the domain of everything), it must be the case that for any non-empty set of things, there will be something in that set that does not depend on any thing in that set. If the relation of ontological dependence is well-founded with respect to the domain of everything that there is then Metaphysical Foundationalism must be true. For if Metaphysical Foundationalism is false then (at least assuming, as is orthodoxy, that ontological dependence cannot go in a circle) there is at least one chain of ontological dependence that has infinitely many elements, each more fundamental than the previous one, and that has no last element. In which case there is a non-empty subset of this domain—namely, the set containing the infinitely many elements of this infinite chain—that has no minimal element.

But Metaphysical Foundationalism can be true even if ontological
dependence is not well-founded. Suppose there is a collection of
things that are fundamental, but that for any non-fundamental thing,
\(x\), there is a further non-fundamental thing, \(y\), that is more
fundamental than \(x\). (See Cameron 2008, 4–5.) Imagine for
example that there is exactly one fundamental entity, \(F\). There is
also the non-fundamental entity \(E_1\), which is dependent on the
non-fundamental entity \(E_{0.5}\), which is dependent on the
non-fundamental entity \(E_{0.25}\), which is dependent on the
non-fundamental entity \(E_{0.125}\), which is dependent on …
and so on *ad infinitum*, but where everything on this infinite
list is ultimately dependent on \(F\). Suppose this is all that
exists. If this is how the world is, Metaphysical Foundationalism is
true: every one of the infinitely many non-fundamental entities is
ultimately dependent on the fundamental entity \(F\). However, we only
ever get from a non-fundamental entity to a fundamental one via
infinitely many intermediate non-fundamental entities, and because of
this ontological dependence is not well-founded. If we take the set of
all things, there are of course minimal elements: things that are not
dependent on anything else in that set (in this example, \(F\) is the
minimal element). But if we take the proper subset of this set that
has as its members every non-fundamental thing (i.e. the infinite set
{\(E_1\), \(E_{0.5}\), \(E_{0.25}\), …}), there are no minimal
elements in this set, for everything in this set is dependent on some
other thing in the set, since every non-fundamental thing
ontologically depends on some other non-fundamental thing. And so
while the well-foundedness of ontological dependence entails
Metaphysical Foundationalism, Metaphysical Foundationalism does not
entail the well-foundedness of ontological dependence. Usually when
metaphysicians talk about well-foundedness, what they actually mean is
the weaker claim of Foundationalism.

See Dixon 2016 and Rabin and Rabern 2016 for discussion of different theses in the neighborhood of Metaphysical Foundationalism, well-foundedness, etc.