Notes to Johann Friedrich Herbart

1. For biographical accounts, see: Weiss 1928: 7, ff.; Herbart 1887a; Boring 1950. Beiser (2014) is the best intellectual biography, especially in presenting the Kantian lines of Herbart’s thought, and his critique of German Idealism (esp. 123–5).

2. For example, in his “Psychological Remarks on the Doctrine of Tones” (1811) and in LPs (1850) (p. 30); cp. Weiss 1928: 8; Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 170.

3. Herbart’s chief objection was to Fichte’s view that the ego

should serve as a reference point around which to map all psychology; the Vorstellung of the self, for Herbart, had first to be developed over the course of childhood before it could serve as a reference point in most mental processing carried out by adults. (Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 167).

Cf. Flügel 1905; Weiss 1928: 8–9. On the other hand, Beiser holds that Herbart was a “Fichtean” until well into his Swiss period.

4. A good example of this is his critique of the alleged role of the Kantian “Understanding” in the constitution of objects at SW VI: 112, and esp. 114, ff.), and of the so-called “power of judgement” (SW VI: 117).

5. In addition to the Vermögenspsychologie, Herbart also criticizes the Idealist tendency to “found a doctrine of nature upon inner, intellectual intuitions”, on the one hand, and, on the other, the view that most psychological facts elude lawfulness because of the transcendental freedom of the will (PsW: 10–11; cf. SW VI: 57; 117–8). But he aims his barbs mainly at the faculty psychologists.

6. It is important to note that Herbart is not proposing a psychophysics in Fechner’s sense, which aims to measure the psychic via a physical medium. Cf. Kim 2009, and Murray and Bandomir 2001.

7. It is therefore puzzling that James seems to chastise Herbart for introspection (James 1890, Vol. I: 192); cf. Stout 1930: 2, ff.

8. At the beginning of §12, (PsW: 33), he uses as an example desire: the fact that we desire becomes a principle of psychology just insofar as we manage to advance from that fact to its (as yet unknown but necessarily existing) relatum, namely its conditions; for as a conditioned (ein Bedingtes), the fact of desiring points to a condition (Bedingung). Memory is another example, much more multifarious in its relations. Here again, he says that were one to turn one’s attention to its relations, not to other conscious facts, but to the conditions of these relations, in order fully to determine them (sc. the relations), by stating and proving them—then one would have

completed the known facts by having, as it were, accompanied the representations all the way into the background of consciousness, whither they retreat, and whence they return. (PsW: 34)

These facts would then be “forged into psychological principles”, should he have moved (by transcendental deduction, as it were) from “memory, as the sum total of known facts, to their necessary preconditions” (PsW: 34).

9. Herbart makes the intriguing, yet unelaborated comment that experimentation on human beings is not “permitted”. It is an open question whether this is a factual observation, or a prohibition on human experimentation. Boring, e.g., suggests that Herbart followed Kant simply in holding psychological experimentation to be impossible as a matter of fact. If this is right, experimentation would be impermissible not in a moral, but only in a methodological sense.

10. Herbart uses the term, Vorstellung, to name all mental content—ideas, concepts, presentations:

That a representation [is present] in consciousness means simply that it [sc. the representation] just now actually represents its object [ihr Objekt vorstellt] (SW VI: 58);

cf. Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 164. I have chosen to translate “Vorstellung” as “representation”, even though the English “presentation” (from the Latin, praesentātiō, “showing, exhibition”, related to the verb prae-esse: “to be before”) may more closely render the German, “vor-stellen” (“to set before”). However, German philosophers before Herbart used “Vorstellung” to translate the Latin repraesentātiō, Kant himself equating these terms (first Critique, A320/B376). Cf. Stout 1888b; Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 169; Diriwächter 2013: 214.

11.Wie aber das Vorstellen in ein Wollen übergehe, kann jetzt nicht mehr zweifelhaft sein, da wir gesehen haben, dass Vorstellungen, vermöge gegenseitiger Hemmung, sich in ein Streben vorzustellen verwandeln” PsW: 131.

12. Repraesentātiōnēs or repraesentāta.

13. Repraesentantēs or repraesentantia; I will continue to use the more customary term, “representation”. On “mental ‘atoms’”, see Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 164.

14. This thought apparently first appears in print in Herbart’s 1811; Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 170.

15. As, for example, at Diriwächter 2013: 214. Herbart is clear: “An sich selbst … sind Vorstellungen nicht Kräfte” (LPs: 370, emphasis Herbart’s).

16.Vorstellungen werden Kräfte, indem sie einander widerstehen. Dieses geschieht, wenn ihrer mehrere entgegengesetzte zusammentreffen”, LPs: 369.

17. Both PsW and Kehrbach in SW V (p. 279) print “… den Unterschied der Vorstellungen ihrer Stärke noch …”, but the syntax demands “nach”.

18. Herbart himself tentatively compares representations to “elastic bodies pressing against each other” (PsW: 138).

19. Herbart speaks of the “enge Pupille des geistigen Auges” (the narrow pupil of the mind’s eye) (LPs: 371).

20. Herbart cautions that a “partial inhibition” should not be thought of as a cutting-off or blocking of a piece of one representation by another. Representations always act and suffer as wholes (again showing why they should be considered “atomic”); the “magnitude” of inhibition in every case specifies “only a degree of dimming of the whole representation” (LPs: 370).

21. “Idealized”, because there are always many more than two representations in consciousness—at a minimum, five, one from each of the senses.

22. An analogy: the moon and the sun can shine in the sky at the same time, but the moon’s light in no wise diminishes the sun’s brightness, even as the moon’s light is “suppressed” by the sun’s (for it casts no shadows).

23. The term “sum” is therefore somewhat misleading, inasmuch as it suggests a prior adding of known values. One might expect that first the inhibiting force of each representation taken alone would have to be determined, so that one might then add them together to find the total, the so-called inhibition sum. But in fact the order of operations is reversed: Herbart argues that

the inhibition sum must first be determined, [so that] the inhibition [factor] of each individual representation may be found. (PsW, §42, SW V: 282)

Why? Because, as pointed out above (and at PsW §39), a representation has no inherent force, inhibitory or otherwise: it only has vivacity. It behaves like a force only when it is crowded by (and itself simultaneously crowds against) another representation. Hence, when representation a stands alone, no force may be ascribed to it; but as soon as representation b joins it in the arena of consciousness, what we see first is a mutual counter-striving, i.e., the totality of the forces arising out of their mutual crowding. Over time, as stated above, these forces come to be distributed and to rest in a state of equilibrium. It is only now that we can establish how much each representation is in fact (finally) inhibited, i.e., how much of S it has come to bear (i.e., its portion of the inhibition ratio [cf. SW V: 285, §43]). As Herbart writes:

We cannot sensibly speak of “distributing [a load]” until we know the [quantum of] the load that is to be distributed. (§42; SW V: 282)

In a word, the situation is this: we know that there are (in this idealized case) two representations, and that they are pressing against each other. We therefore know that there is some sum of the two pressings (S). But since neither representation has a pressure-value “in itself”, the pressure arises solely due to the presence of the other representation. We therefore logically must begin with S, which then is distributed as a load over the two representations in the final rest state. Cf. Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 173.

24. Hence, “the quantum of the representing that must be inhibited”. Cf. esp. SW IV: 371, §129.

25. The proposition that every representation suffers inhibition in inverse proportion to its vivacity was criticized as an arbitrary supposition by Ziehen (1900): Felsch 1902: 1. On arbitrariness, see also Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 172–3 and esp. Boudewijnse, et al. 2001: 116.

26. I follow Weiss 1928, in using lower case Greek letters to stand for the inhibited portions; Herbart does not (SW V: 288, ff.). Cf. Boring 1950: 259–60.

27. Again, following Weiss’s notation at Weiss 1928: 78; cf. SW V: 288.

28. Scholars such as Weiss (1928: 78), and Boudewijnse, et al. (1999: 175) have tried to restate Herbart’s calculations in simpler terms, but do not clearly explain how “some algebra” (Boudewijnse, et al.) makes it “not hard to see” (Weiss) that \(R_c\) can in some cases \(\le 0\).

29. SW V: 291 (§47): “[E]in negatives \(r\) [i.e., \(R_c\)] ist in unserm Falle so gut als eine unmögliche Größe”. Boudewijnse, et al. do not seem sufficiently to distinguish the mathematical possibility of calculating a negative value for \(R_c\) from the theoretical necessity of always interpreting such a value as = 0 (Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 175).

30. It is important to note that Herbart distinguishes among several limina. The two general types are the static and the mechanical limina, within which there are further species, e.g. the “Complicationsschwelle” (SW V: 317). The formula given here is but the simplest formula, determining the limen at full opposition; cf. SW V: 293; Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 183. “Limes staticus”, as Felsch calls it, is incorrect (Felsch 1904: 195).

31. Examples of the former “black and white”; of the latter, “black and sour” (Weiss 1928: 80). But cf. McGurk and MacDonald 1976.

32. As Herbart points out, all fusions are by their very nature partial (SW IV: 374).

33. Fusions are treated in Chapter Six.

34. Interesting examples are “representations of things with numerous features, and of words, as signs of thoughts” (LPs = SW IV: 374).

35. Herbart also calls complications “complexes”, e.g., SW V: 309; cf. Felsch 1902: 5. Complications are treated in Chapters Four and Five, SW V: 309, ff. Boudewijnse, et al. group complications and fusions together under the heading, “combinations”, Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 179. Cf. Boring 1950: 258.

36. Also called a “zufällige Hemmung”, LPs, §22; cf. Felsch 1902: 5. This is a very different interpretation from Boudewijnse, et al., who (over) translate “zufällige Hindernisse” as “randomly occurring events” (Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 181).

37. The same problem is treated more simply at LPs, SW IV: 374, f.

38. And vice versa, should \(\alpha\) be threatened by \(\gamma\).

39. Indeed, while inner experience clearly confirms this phenomenon, Herbart argues on an a priori basis as follows. Between the uninhibited state and a second state of a certain degree of inhibition there lies a continuum of intermediate inhibitory states. Now even an infinitely quick transition would, as it sank from consciousness, have to pass through each of these intermediate states. However, as the representation passed through each intermediate stage, it would undergo less pressure to sink further than it suffered at a previous stage. Consequently, the representations undergo an ever-diminishing pressure to slip out of consciousness. Accordingly, the inhibition sum will drop with decreasing speed. For this deceleration to take place, however, time must pass (SW V: 338, f.). It is, then, the task of the “mechanics of the spirit [Geist]” to calculate the laws of the temporal succession of representations, the laws of motion according to which representations rise and fall (SW IV: 372; cf. Boudewijnse, et al. 1999: 182; Weiss 1928: 84).

40. It was determined as \(= b\) in the case of full opposition; cf. esp. Herbart 1839b: 57.

41. Representations at full opposition are completely dissimilar (though within the same representational genus), SW V: 401.

42. The representations are “all originally completely uninhibited” (SW V: 338).

43. My interpretation is confirmed by Ward’s Encyclopedia Britannica entry on Herbart calls S the “inhibendum”, i.e., “what is to be inhibited” (Ward: 1911: 337). Huemer and Landerer identify the inhibition sum correctly, but then say that \(\sigma\) is “[the inhibition sum’s] already sunken part”, whereas as we saw above, Herbart says \(\sigma\) is the sum of the representations’ already dimmed portions (Huemer and Landerer 2010: 76). What we would therefore say is that \(\sigma\) is the portion of S that no longer remains-to-be-inhibited.

44. Hence no representation at its maximal radiance is ever encountered in experience, cf. SW V: 387.

45. PsW calls “\(\sigma\)” “das Gehemmte nach Verlauf der Zeit t”, without indicating if this is the inhibited portion of a, or of b, or of both together (SW V: 339; LPs clarifies: “\(\sigma\) [bedeutet] das in dieser Zeit von sämmtlichen Vorstellungen gehemmte” (SW IV: 372). Cf. Felsch 1904: 196.

46. This equation is derived from the basic relation, \((S - \sigma) \times dt = d\sigma\) (SW IV: 339); Boudewijnse, et al. 1999, present it as: \(d\sigma/dt = (S - \sigma)\). The interpretation of this “knotty” equation is by no means settled, due to the ambiguity of “inhibition sum” mentioned above. Thus, for example, the 1911 Encyclopedia Britannica entry on Herbart calls S the “inhibendum”, i.e., “what is to be inhibited”—which is clearly wrong: the inhibition sum is not “to be inhibited”, but the total of the actual inhibition exercised by conflicting representations against each other (Encyclopedia Britannica 1911: 337).

47. Conceived, of course, not as faculties or powers, but as mental phenomena; PsW: 132; SW IV: 378.

48. Ebbinghaus was influenced by Herbart’s theory of reproduction in his famous memory experiments. His fifth experiment “can be considered as the first attempt … to test a Herbartian prediction by experiment” (Boudewijnse, et al. 2001: 111, ff.). Cf. Stout 1888b: 474, f.

49. Herbart viewed drives, feeling, and emotions “as all by-products of interactions among Vorstellungen, which [latter] themselves did not need to be classified into particular categories” (Boudewijnse, et al. 2001: 108). Cf. SW VI: 56, f., and LPs (1850): 78, ff.

50. As he points out, the other two states in which representations might find themselves, viz., repressed and sinking, cannot serve to explain the conscious representations involved in feeling and desiring, since they are ex hypothesi either outside of or vanishing from consciousness.

51. Affects are defined as “passing deviations from the state of equanimity”, whereas passions are “ingrained desires” (LPs [1850]: 76).

52. For “rüstig” and “schmelzend”, cf. esp. Kant, Critique of Judgment, §29.

53. I omit Herbart’s theory of the passions, but the upshot is similar: the force of passion is really the massed force of the representations themselves, as they work themselves up against an inhibiting obstacle. Passions are not in themselves desires, but dispositions (Dispositionen) to desire. Cf. SW VI: 79.

54. Here Herbart anticipates Helmholtz’s empiricism (see Kim 2009: 48), and especially Herbart’s apparent critique of a physiological nativism at SW VI: 89. Cf. Beiser 2014: 92–3.

55. Herbart seems to be alluding to Kant’s Reflexion, “Wider den Idealism” (R6313). Guyer writes:

The starting point of this argument is … that the mere occurrence of a succession of representations is not sufficient for the representation or recognition of this succession. (Guyer 1987: 306)

Because the possibility of confusion is more acute in the case of the temporal, Herbart restricts himself henceforth to spatial representations.

56. Herbart treats of the topics dealt with here and in 3.7.2 in PsW, II (SW VI): Ch. 4 (§§117, ff.), “Von den ersten Spuren des sogenannten obern Erkenntnißvermögens”.

57. “Herbart’s psychology is intentionally naturalistic, attempting to explain the mind according to natural laws, so that it is part of the general fabric of nature” (Beiser 2014: 135).

58. Stout’s “crude” concepts (Stout 1888b: 477).

59. I.e., that-which-is-to-be-represented, das Vorzustellende.

60. Thus, Herbart says, “Archimedes and Newton each investigated his own [respective] concept of the circle; they were two [distinct] concepts in the psychological sense, although from a logical perspective [there is] just one for all mathematicians” (SW VI: 120).

61. I.e., that-which-is-represented (in or through the representation), das Vorgestellte.

62. This will, as we saw above, also bring the spatial character of a into awareness.

63. Herbart rejects the common assumption that there can be no individual concepts. Cf. Kim 2015, esp. p. 45.

64. As an example, Herbart points to cases in which one observes the subject as one of its features is in the process of changing (SW VI: 127; cf. Stout 1888b: 479).

65. Space constraints prevent a detailed account of how Herbart draws on the earlier use of “apperception” by Leibniz (e.g., Monadology 14; Principles 4); how it differs especially from Kant (esp. in the Transcendental Deduction); or how it would influence later psychologists like Wundt (see entry on Wilhelm Maximilian Wundt). But it is important to note that Herbart is deliberately attacking and reconceiving Kant’s concept of “transcendental apperception”. Herbart rejects Kant’s grounding of transcendental apperception in the a priori synthetic activity of the Understanding, because (a) he rejects the very idea of psychological faculties, and (b) tries to give his account entirely in a posteriori terms. Thus Herbart tries to show how something like the synthetic unity of the ego-phenomenon can be explained through nothing more than the perturbations of a simple soul. As will be explained below, “apperception” comes to mean for him nothing more than recursive attention, a phenomenon that emerges over time through the mere interaction of representations themselves: it follows, and does not precede representing (cf. Kant, first Critique, A107 and esp. B131–2; PS I: 202, n.*).

66.Bewußt” in the ambiguous (if rare) German sense, suggesting both that they are conscious (subjectively), and known, “be-knownst”, or “aware-d” (objectively).

67. Herbart notes that apperception may also occur when three or more masses encounter and interact with each other. But there will always be some last apperceiving mass that “is not itself again apperceived” (SW VI: 147).

68. This recalls Kant’s categorical imperative, especially as expressed in the formula of the end in itself and the formula of the Kingdom of Ends. Cf. Weiss 1928: 123.

69. In his pedagogical writings, Herbart seems to be concerned mainly with male pupils, even warning against their feminization (e.g., in his pedagogical aphorisms). He distinguishes sharply between the psychological development of boys and girls (e.g., LPs, SW IV: 351).

70. “Herbart … saw that interest depended upon apperception, and that, apart from efficiency in the apperceptive mechanism, interest could not be aroused” (Hayward 1907: 40; cf. 57.

71. Compare Kant on the need of rational Ideas as the a priori regulative or organizing principles of experience.

72. “‘The limits of the circle of thought’, says Herbart, ‘are the limits for the character’” (Hayward 1907: 47).

73. Cf. Weiss 1928: 196. It is interesting to observe again Herbart’s “naturalization” of a Kantian notion. What Herbart describes as a sense of demand or obligation arising through the mechanics of apperception, Kant identifies as a priori ideas that form the aims of rational “interests”, both practical and theoretical.

74. Cf. esp. Montaigne: “Our pupil should not so much say his lesson as perform it [and] should repeat it in his actions” (Montaigne, “Education”: 75). This contradicts the claim that Herbart’s “ideal of education attempts to develop … our capacity for feeling rather than for acting” (Beiser 2014: 107). Cf. esp. SW II: 85 (“Das Leben und die Schule”); SW II: 98 (“Handeln ist das Princip des Charakters”).

75. Cf. esp. SW II: 87. Note how in this way Herbart places particular normative ends of education and life squarely in the historical sphere. Cf. Beiser 2014: 91.

76. “Instruction … creates powerful and dominating interest in nature and in human nature, especially the latter; … instruction which, by the creation of an apperception organ [?!], replaces sensualism by a sensibility to higher things” (Hayward 1907: 57).

77. Compare Plato, Theaetetus 144ab, on heavy and dull as opposed to light and sharp natures, and their respective educability.

78. Cf. Montaigne, “Education”: 62; SW II: 67, f., and esp. Herbart’s warning against “Polyhistorie”, 85.

79. There is confusion about this key text, first published in two parts, in 1824 and 1825, respectively. Boudewijnse et al. 1999, identify it as the only text with this title, conflating this, the first, “analytic” part of the two-volume work, with the second, “synthetic” part, which listed as Herbart 1825. Again, Diriwächter (2013) follows the (admittedly misleading) indication on the Bonset reprint (see Herbart 1968), saying that the original work was published in 1850.

Copyright © 2015 by
Alan Kim

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