Notes to Intergenerational Justice

1. See Section 4 for a sufficientarian interpretation of future people’s welfare rights vis-à-vis currently living people.

2. See Heyd 1992: chs. 1 and 4. Whether future people can be said to and have a right to non-existence under certain circumstances is the central issue of “wrongful life” cases, which are to be distinguished from both “wrongful birth” and “wrongful pregnancy” cases. The latter two concern interests of parents in not giving birth to a defective child and in not having an unwanted pregnancy, respectively. “Wrongful life” cases concern the interests of children in not being brought into existence under certain circumstances.

3. Parfit 1984: part iv, and especially ch. 17; see the contributions in Ryberg and Tännsjö 2004; see entry on the repugnant conclusion.

4. It is worth pointing out that there are, plausibly, at least some future persons whose existence and identity is altogether independent of our actions (although this claim may be implausible in the case of public policy choices). For example, somebody now set a booby-trap that would cause harm to some future persons. Performing the action may harm the bodily integrity of future people who will live quite independently of his having performed the action and thus the contingency of future persons’ existence on present actions can in no way exempt this particular action from moral condemnation. Many contributions on what we owe to future people concentrate on what Parfit calls “same people choices” (1984: 355–356), i.e., such decision-situations in which we assume that future people’s existence, identity and number are not contingent upon our decisions.

5. For the distinctions see Parfit 1984: 487–490; Woodward 1986: 818; Morreim 1988: 23; Fishkin 1991; Fishkin 1992: 63–64; Shiffrin 1999. For the wording of these notions of harm see Pogge 2003.

6. For a defense of the view that certain types of inactions, namely omissions, can be harmful see, e.g., Feinberg 1984: ch. 4 and Birnbacher 2014: chs. 3–5.

7. The formulation may be misleading in suggesting that by t2 we refer to a moment of a person’s life. Rather, the notions of harm as distinguished in this entry should be understood to allow for differing interpretations of the relevant unit of well-being (e.g., the life of the affected person as a whole or future periods of her life). For discussions of how to interpret and measure the well-being of people see Griffin 1986: part i; Hurka 1993: ch. 6; Scanlon 1998: ch. 3.

8. “Acted with respect to this person” is meant to include the act that causes this person’s existence. It is difficult to interpret such acts as interactions. We prefer “had we not interacted with (or acted with respect to) this person at all” to David Gauthier’s “in our absence” (1986: 203–205). Both formulations are problematic and it is beyond the scope of this entry to discuss their respective problems at length. Gauthier himself points out that his formulation runs into difficulty in dealing with situations in which a person has assumed a certain social role, e.g., the role of a life-guard that is, in part, defined by positive duties vis-à-vis others. If a person assumes such a role her “absence” in a situation where she is duty-bound to intervene can render the situation of others worse (1986: 205). For the formulation we prefer it seems plausible to suggest that assuming such a role does constitute an “interaction” of the then duty-bound person with those to whom she is bound where fulfilling the duties of her role is concerned.

9. See Roberts 1998—A probabilistic and a necessarian reading of future people’s contingency upon our actions can be distinguished (see Parfit’s “Time-Dependence Claim”, 1984: 351–352) and, thus, of the scope of the non-identity problem. According to the necessarian reading it matters that the same person or people could have existed had we not carried out the act or policy. Whether it is in fact likely or unlikely to have happened does not matter. According to the probabilistic reading, if it was extremely unlikely and the probability was close to zero, it is reasonable to hold that the same person would not have existed. The latter view can be attributed to Parfit (1984: 352). For discussion whether it normatively matters that genetically identical people can be brought about by different acts and under different circumstances, see Simmons 1995: 178–179; Roberts 1998: sects. 3.4 and 3.5; Gosseries 2004: ch. ii.

10. This is why this type of notion of harm is also called identity-independent. See Fishkin 1991; Fishkin 1992: 63–64.

11. Please note three points: First, in describing the disjunctive notion it is superfluous to consider the diachronic notion (I). When the subjunctive-historical notion (II) is applicable, notion (I) is applicable as well; the diachronic notion (I) is applicable when counterfactual considerations play no role in the application of notion (II).

Second, not only our (IV) as stated above fulfills this requirement. Any disjunctive notion that entails notion of harm at (III) as a necessary condition for causing harm will fulfill this requirement. Thus, a good number of versions of the disjunctive view might be considered plausible and worth investigating.

Third, it is worth pointing out that there are other reasons for preferring the disjunctive over the single notion. The disjunctive notion is compatible with the central understanding of harm and compensation as these notions are normally understood in tort law. In cases which do not involve the non-identity problem and in which the harmful act reduces the well-being of the victim to a level that is still above the threshold, the comparative notion of harm provides the relevant standard for restitution and compensation.

12. It is assumed here that in the context of taking a decision on whether or not to treat the fetuses, the fetuses are actual future people (see §2). In other words, the treatment of the fetuses will not have compositional effects as might be induced by post-conception genetic interventions. For the feasibility of such post-conception genetic therapy and surgery and their implications for interpreting wrongful life claims, see Buchanan et al. 2000: 6 and ch. 6. If pregnancy testing leads to post-conception intervention that has compositional effects, Parfit’s two medical programs become indistinguishable with respect to the applicability of the comparative notion of harm.

13. Rawls 1971: 291. For a critique of this claim see Gosseries 2001: 318–319. For a critique of Rawls’s related claim, namely, that the difference principle is inapplicable in the transnational context (Rawls 1999: 113–120), see Pogge 1994, especially 211–214.

14. However, the “Shift Thesis” is compatible with justice-based reasons being relevant above the threshold according to the second and third understanding of the shift thesis.

15. Currently living people may stand under some obligation to procreate out of regard for the interests of actual (presently living or future) people. Also, admittedly, it is hard to imagine that we could ever be in a position in which we relate to future life on earth simply as a matter of our procreational choice or population policy without there being interests of actual future people to be taken into account. One reason is that to date in many, if not most cases, procreation is not the consequence of choice.

16. For an analysis of the relevance of historical injustice for claims of groups to political self-determination or autonomy see, for example, Buchanan 1991; Brilmayer 1991; Thompson 1990; Kymlicka 1999; Gans 2001; Miller and Kumar (eds) 2007.

17. We cannot rely on the diachronic notion of harm (see §3.1) either. It presupposes that we can attribute a state of well-being to the descendant at the time his or her ancestors are being wronged. However, currently living African Americans might well have just claims to compensation based on the subjunctive-historical notion of harm because harm done to them or to their more recent ancestors. See Lyons’ analysis of continuing discrimination against African Americans in Lyons 2004a and see §5.2.

18. The relevance and importance of the forward-looking assessment of the normative significance of past wrongs has been stressed by, for example, Lyons 1977; Waldron 1992b; Ackerman 1992: 72–73; Elster 1993; Ackerman 1997; Tan 2007; Meyer & Waligore 2018. For a theory of justice that grounds our obligations in backward-looking reasoning see Nozick 1974: 152–153. The theory relies upon counterfactual reasoning. For critique see Lyons 1977; Sher 1981; Waldron 1992b. For epistemic reasons only, Nozick proposes Rawls’s difference principle—a forward-looking principle, specifying what the future should be like—as a “rough rule of thumb for rectifying” historical injustice (1974: 231). This idea does not address the problem of the inapplicability of a non-comparative notion of harm as discussed in the text. For alternative impersonal interpretations of how the past matters normatively, see Vallentyne 1988; Hill 1991; Feldman 1997: chs. 1, 4.

19. In any case, the supersession thesis concerns the ongoing effect of past injustices only. Claiming that injustices are superseded implies neither that the past unjust violations of rights were not unjust nor that they should no longer be considered unjust. Even if certain injustices are superseded, we may well stand under obligations to publicly acknowledge the wrongs committed and to provide, say, symbolic compensation toward the victims. See §5.4 and §5.5.

20. For a comparison of the memorials for the victims of the Shoa in Poland, Germany and Israel, see Young 1989: 1799–1811. See Winter 1995 for an interpretation of the memorials of the First World War. Of course, public commemorations may be put to the use of (re-)affirming values that differ from the values that many people participating in the acts of symbolic compensation may wish to express. See, e.g., Scarre 2014.

21. “Never again!”—which is also the title of the reports of the Argentine (1984) truth commission, of the report that was secretly prepared in Brazil (1985) as well as of the Uruguayan report of non-governmental organizations (1989). See Nino 1996: 78–82; Weschler 1990: part i, and 235.

22. For example, the Roma (Gypsies) were victims of a racially motivated genocide committed by the Nazis—a truth that has been long denied with the result that most surviving victims as well as the descendants of those murdered were excluded from compensation and restitution. See Meyer 2005: ch. 5.

23. See, e.g., Thompson 2002 who discusses the reasons for attributing such an obligation to current members of ongoing political societies (e.g., states) whose previous members committed egregious wrongs in the name of the society and with harmful consequences for currently living people.

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Lukas Meyer <>

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