Kumārila Bhaṭṭa, who likely flourished around 660 ce, was a proponent of the orthodox Brahmanical school of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā. Among the most influential thinkers in the history of Indian philosophy, he made significant contributions regarding the full range of issues that follow from that school’s constitutive concern with Vedic authority and exegesis; virtually all Indian philosophers writing subsequent to him—and particularly Buddhist philosophers, whose positions were most completely antithetical to his—found it necessary to reckon especially with his work in epistemology and philosophy of language. Among the areas in which he exercised lasting influence are hermeneutics, poetics, jurisprudence, and (arguably) historiography. Chief among the doctrines that have occasioned philosophical interest in him is that of svataḥ prāmāṇya—“intrinsic reliability,” which might be understood as immediate justification—which surely represents Kumārilas most significant epistemological contribution; occasionally dismissed as fundamentalist in spirit, this has come to be appreciated (sometimes in light of the “reformed epistemology” advanced by contemporary thinkers such as William Alston and Nicholas Wolterstorff) as a cogent working-out of the kinds of commonsensical epistemic intuitions characteristic of Thomas Reid. Together with a robust realism about linguistic universals and the peculiarly Mīmāṃsaka conviction that the Vedic texts are eternal, this epistemology was effectively deployed by Kumārila to show that a commitment to the uniquely authoritative status of the Vedas (and to the ritual practices enjoined thereby) was rationally held.
- 1. Life, works, and influence
- 2. Epistemology: Direct realism and the doctrine of immediate justification
- 3. Metaphysics and philosophy of language
- 4. Ideology and ethics
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1. Life, works, and influence
1.1 Indian philosophical debate in the middle of the first millennium
Having flourished in the latter part of the seventh century ce, Kumārila Bhaṭṭa was roughly contemporaneous with the Buddhist philosopher Dharmakīrti, whose own predecessor Dignāga was among the philosophical rivals whom Kumārila critically engaged; Kumārila has long been recognized as a significant influence on his younger contemporary Śaṅkara (fl. c. 710). Kumārila thus wrote at a time of profoundly significant philosophical activity in India, contributing much to a pan-Sanskritic discourse—sometimes referred to as pramāṇa-śāstra, or the “discipline of epistemic warrants”—that was characterized by shared standards of rationality and inter-traditional debate. Pressed from all sides by opponents from rival schools of thought, Indian philosophers at this time were keen to maintain the consistency of their various commitments in the face of critique; with all these disputants sharing a Sanskritic philosophical vocabulary that had been refined particularly by Buddhists, India’s philosophical traditions quickly developed in subtlety and sophistication from this point on.
Characteristic of this period of inter-traditional debate is the legendary account of Kumārila as having studied for a time at the famous Buddhist monastic university at Nālandā, then in its prime. Based on the mastery of Buddhist doctrine he thus gained, Kumārila went on to decisively counter Buddhist philosophical positions. According to a Buddhist variation on such legendary reflections of the state of philosophical contestation (one recorded by the 17th-century Tibetan historian Tāranātha), Kumārila is indeed represented as having defeated various lesser Buddhist thinkers in debate. However, his renown prompted the Buddhist Dharmakīrti, in turn, to go in disguise to study with Kumārila, from whom Dharmakīrti learns the key to Kumārila’s thought and then bests him in debate, converting Kumārila and his followers to Buddhism. As history, such accounts are surely as suspect as the view (still attested in some Indian scholarship) that Kumārila’s dialectical successes are chiefly to be credited for the decline of Indian Buddhism. Nevertheless, these traditions confirm at least that Kumārila was a formidable philosophical opponent of his Buddhist counterparts. It is fitting, then, that among the sources for studying Kumārila’s thought should be not only the texts of Mīmāṃsaka commentators on his work—particularly Uṃveka Bhaṭṭa (fl. c. 710), Pārthasārathimiśra (fl. c. 1075), and Sucaritamiśra (c.1120)—but also the work of the scholar Buddhist Śāntarakṣita (c.725–788), whose massive Tattvasaṃgraha extensively engages (and quotes from the works of) Kumārila.
1.2 The Brahmanical tradition of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā
It is sometimes surmised from his evident knowledge of Dravidian languages (his Tantravārttika includes some discussion of Tamil word forms) that Kumārila may have been south Indian; as is typically the case for the figures of classical Indian philosophy, though, he is really known to us only in the stylized terms of traditional hagiographies. What is certain is that Kumārila was one of the two most significant commentators on the foundational texts of the tradition of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā; indeed, this orthodox Brahmanical tradition of thought divides chiefly along two lines of seventh- and eighth-century commentary, with those Mīmāṃsakas who take their bearings from Kumārila having been styled Bhāṭṭas (“followers of Bhaṭṭa”), while those who defer instead to Prabhākara—who flourished around 700, and who is sometimes said to have been Kumārila’s student—are comparably called “Prābhākaras.”
Insofar as this central divergence between Kumārila and Prabhākara involves reference to a shared foundation of texts, it is important to appreciate the traditional Brahmanical context for Kumārila’s thought. “Mīmāṃsā” literally means something like “investigation” or “inquiry,” but here refers particularly to hermeneutical inquiry. Kumārila’s tradition of Pūrva (“prior”) Mīmāṃsā, then, is typically so denominated in contrast to “Uttara,” or “subsequent,” Mīmāṃsā. Both strands of Mīmāṃsā have as their guiding concern the interpretation and right application of Vedic texts, which these two schools agree in thinking to be uniquely authoritative for matters of ultimate concern. These schools differ chiefly over which portion of this vast corpus of texts should be thought definitive; for “Veda”—a scriptural category that is arguably definitive of “Hinduism”—represents a status traditionally claimed for a huge range of texts, composed over a large period of time (from c. 1200 bce to early in the first millennium and even later), and comprising a wide spectrum of literary genres and characteristic doctrines. Advocacy of the “Pūrva” Mīmāṃsā position is defined by commitment to the authority particularly of the earlier portion of the Vedic corpus (culminating with texts called Brāhmaṇas), which chiefly concerns the performance of ritual sacrifice; hence, the school of thought advanced by Kumārila was also well known as Karma Mīmāṃsā (“hermeneutics of ritual action”) or Adhvara Mīmāṃsā (“hermeneutics of sacrifice”). In contrast, Uttara Mīmāṃsā takes its bearings from that portion of the Vedic corpus that comprises the Upaniṣads, which were traditionally styled “Vedānta” (“culmination of the Veda”); indeed, the same word is more familiar to many modern readers as denoting Uttara Mīmāṃsā itself. (On relations between these two traditions of Mīmāṃsā, see the essays in Bronkhorst 2007.)
Just as texts in the many strata of the Vedic corpus mostly represent themselves as in some sense interpreting the texts that precede them, so, too, the philosophical tradition of Pūrva Mīmāṃsā (henceforth, simply “Mīmāṃsā”), in this regard typifying the generally scholastic character of first-millennium Indian philosophy, developed in the form of commentaries on the foundational texts of the tradition (and commentaries on the commentaries, etc.). Mīmāṃsakas, as adherents of this school are called, thus take their bearings from the Mīmāṃsā Sūtras attributed to a certain Jaimini, who is thought to have flourished near the beginning of the first millennium ce. The first of Jaimini’s sūtras (“aphorisms”) names “the desire to know dharma” (dharmajijñāsā) as the constitutive concern of Mīmāṃsā, where dharma is represented in early commentary simply as what “connects a person with the highest good.” Among the salient points about the goal thus commended by Mīmāṃsā’s foundational text is that dharma, as here imagined, denotes a constitutively future state of affairs; dharma, Mīmāṃsakas typically say, is always “yet to be” (bhaviṣyat).
This characterization of dharma can be taken to suggest that it has something to do with post-mortem existence states of affairs, which were indeed among the expected results of certain Vedic rites. (Early proponents of Mīmāṃsā differed from most other Indian philosophical schools in not taking liberation from saṃsāra to be the ultimate desideratum.) The perennially subjunctive character of talk of dharma perhaps more significantly reflects, however, the view that Vedic injunctions essentially enjoin the ongoing bringing into being (bhāvanā) of a ritual world that must continually be renewed; it is insofar as no one ever finishes bringing this world into being that its realization is always still to come. (See, on this idea, Clooney 1990, 129–161.) Philosophically, the significant point is that, as always yet to be realized, the summum bonum for Mīmāṃsakas is essentially inaccessible to perception, and only language can be thought to represent a way of knowing it. This is surely the paramount intuition informing the entire Mīmāṃsaka project, which centers on confidence in the epistemic status of Vedic injunctions and the mind-independent reality of language.
1.3 The works of Kumārila as commentaries on foundational texts
Typifying the “sūtra” genre of mnemonic concision, Jaimini’s aphorisms are often intelligible only with reference to commentaries; the earliest of the completely extant commentaries on Jaimini’s sūtras is that of Śabara (fl. c. 400 c.e.), whose commentary (which itself quotes from at least one no-longer-extant earlier commentary) defines the basic parameters of the tradition’s unfolding. The divergent elaborations of the Mīmāṃsaka project represented by Kumārila and Prabhākara are therefore framed, in turn, as commenting on Śabara’s interpretation of the Mīmāṃsā Sūtras. It is typical, then, for passages from Kumārila’s corpus to be cited with reference to the section of Śabara’s commentary from which they depart—which effectively means that Kumārila’s topics can usually be referred to by the particular sūtras of Jaimini upon which Śabara was himself commenting. So, for example, Kumārila’s elaboration of the svataḥ prāmāṇya (“immediate justification”) doctrine in epistemology is framed in terms of Śabara’s commentary on Jaimini’s “codanā sūtra”—the sūtra, that is, that specifies that Vedic “injunction” (codanā) is the only valid way of knowing dharma. References, then, to the passages in which Kumārila develops his signal epistemological contribution are typically to the numbered verses of the “codanā sūtra” chapter of his Ślokavārttika.
The latter title names one of four works attributed to Kumārila, and one of the two most important; it is the Ślokavārttika that is typically taken to be of greatest philosophical significance, and it was surely this work that was most recurrently engaged by other Indian philosophers. The Ślokavārttika is framed by Śabara’s commentary on the beginning of the first chapter of Jaimini’s work—the part of Śabara’s commentary traditionally styled “Tarkapāda,” or the “part concerning reasoning,” wherein Śabara considers as a preliminary matter questions pertaining to whether Vedic texts ought in the first place to be thought an epistemically reliable basis for action. It is thus in the Ślokavārttika that Kumārila argues for the epistemological and metaphysical commitments relevant to the governing claim that the Vedas are uniquely authoritative for matters of ultimate concern. Typically of the “vārttika” genre of commentary, Kumārila’s “commentary” often significantly revises or elaborates on the thoughts advanced in Śabara’s text, and the novelty of some of Kumārila’s arguments is therefore often clear. Typically, as well, of the inter-traditionally contested period in which he wrote, the epistemological and other arguments of the Ślokavārttika generally involve Kumārila’s heavily engaging rival Indian schools of thought and showing their alternative positions to fail as defeaters. While the arguments are in the service of claims (such as that the Vedas are eternal) that are unlikely to be attractive to modern readers, this text is often a model of philosophical subtlety and sophistication.
The philosophically rich Ślokavārttika can be understood, however, as a prolegomenon to the real, hermeneutical business of Mīmāṃsā, which is most significantly advanced in Kumārila’s Tantravārttika. Framed as a commentary on the remainder of Śabara’s chapter 1 through his chapter 3, this massive work addresses questions raised by the different kinds of sentences to be found in the Vedas, the status of Brahmanical literature that is not part of the Vedic corpus, and all manner of grammatical and metaphysical issues pertaining to the performance of Vedic ritual as that is enjoined by sometimes interpretively obscure Vedic texts. In this under-studied text, then, there is much to be learned about Kumārila’s highly ramified philosophy of language, as well as about the ideological and practical particulars of the ritualistic Vedic worldview. In addition to the Ślokavārttika and the Tantravārttika, Kumārila authored the Tupṭīkā, which comments on the remaining balance of Śabara’s commentary; and the no-longer-extant Bṛhatṭīkā, whose extensive treatment of many of the concerns of the Ślokavārttika is recoverable from the large parts of it that are preserved in the Buddhist Śāntarakṣita’s Tattvasaṃgraha (see Frauwallner 1962).
2. Epistemology: Direct realism and the doctrine of immediate justification
2.1 Early Mīmāṃsakas on the epistemic status of Vedic testimony
It is relevant to begin with Kumārila’s characteristic epistemological doctrine not only because this is widely thought to be among his most characteristic philosophical contributions, but also because Kumārila appeals to the epistemological intuitions elaborated in this doctrine in arguing, as well, for a great many of his other claims; indeed, the commonsense realism reflected in Kumārila’s epistemology represents a useful way into his overall philosophical project, which is shot through with essentially realist commitments. Thus, for example, Kumārila was strongly critical of the doctrine of svasaṃvitti (“self-awareness”), which is arguably foundational for the Buddhists Dignāga and Dharmakīrti; it is particularly insofar as that doctrine figures in a generally representationalist epistemology—one that is to be understood as part of a larger Buddhist case for epistemic and perhaps even metaphysical idealism—that Kumārila will have no truck with the idea, instead affirming that what we are immediately aware of is just the ordinary objects we typically take ourselves to be aware of. Kumārila’s guiding intuition, then, is that we are generally justified in taking awareness as veridically disclosing precisely the kind of world it seems to us to disclose.
Kumārila’s development of a comprehensive epistemological orientation along these lines is occasioned by Śabara’s commentary on the second of Jaimini’s Mīmāṃsā Sūtras. So, having announced in the first sūtra that the “desire to know dharma” is the constitutive concern of Mīmāṃsā, Jaimini then says in the second sūtra that “dharma is a goal defined by [Vedic] injunction (codanā)”—that, in other words, what is epistemically authoritative with respect to what Mīmāṃsakas take to be the summum bonum is just the texts of the Vedas (and more precisely, those injunctive passage that enjoin the execution of particular ritual acts). This amounts to the generally epistemological claim that among the various ways of knowing available to us, the linguistic items that are Vedic texts uniquely represent “reliable epistemic warrants” (pramāṇa) with regard to dharma.
Indian philosophers, particularly under the influence of the Nyāya tradition of thought (and of the appropriation and systematization of its main terms of art by the Buddhists Dignāga and Dharmakīrti), were generally preoccupied by Kumārila’s time with the issue of pramāṇas—with the question of which doxastic practices (perception, inference, testimony, etc.) should be reckoned as “epistemic criteria” or “reliable doxastic practices” (as we might render pramāṇa), and with characterizing the criteria so identified. Mīmāṃsā’s Buddhist opponents characteristically affirmed, in this regard, that only perception and inference had this status, and that all other ways of arriving at beliefs were somehow reducible to one of these. Proponents of Mīmāṃsā chiefly affirmed, in contrast, not only that there is an irreducibly and distinctively linguistic way of knowing, but indeed that it is this (and not perception) that should be understood as most significant. For while it is in the nature of perception to bear only on actually present states of affairs—the salient point of Jaimini’s fourth sūtra, on perception, is that this consists in the kind of sensory cognition had when there is contact with something present (satsaṃprayoge)—language alone has the capacity to engender awareness of future, or “to-be-realized” (bhāvya), states of affairs. Insofar, then, as the dharma that Mīmāṃsakas are most interested in is just such a state of affairs, the fact of perception’s bearing only on what is (as it were) ready-to-hand is to be reckoned a deficiency. The epistemological project for proponents of this school thus becomes that of making sense of the unique epistemic authority of the kinds of Vedic injunctions (paradigmatically, “one desirous of heaven should perform the agnihotra sacrifice”) that would not fare well on any account that instead privileged perception.
To that end, Kumārila’s predecessor Śabara argued that linguistic utterances engender some cognition (avabodhayati), and that as long as the idea thus engendered is clear or “determinate” (niścita), one is entitled to accept it as a basis for action. Of a sentence such as “one desirous of heaven should perform a sacrifice,” then, Śabara would mainly ask: do you understand the sentence? If not, then the sentence is reasonably disregarded owing to its engendering an essentially doubtful (saṃdigdham) cognition; but insofar as the sentence makes an epistemically contentful claim, we are entitled to judge the prima facie unambiguous cognition thus brought about to be false only if it is explicitly falsified—only if we have, that is, knowledge to the effect that someone has not gone to heaven as a result of having performed the agnihotra sacrifice. Determinately contentful linguistic cognitions that have not been falsified are reasonably taken, then, as bases for action.
2.2 Kumārila’s development of a general epistemological doctrine
Despite, however, Śabara’s probably warranted confidence that his interlocutors could never be in a position to show that sentences regarding the post-mortem careers of Vedic practitioners are falsified, the burden of proof will surely be thought by most to remain on him. It is at this point, though, that Kumārila more convincingly shifted, in effect, the burden of proof. His ground-breaking approach to epistemology involves raising a second-order question about the doxastic practices we take to be reliable (about, that is, pramāṇas). Of any way of knowing, then, that might be thought relevant to the adjudication of a claim such as Śabara’s (and Kumārila recognized that it is strategically advantageous in this regard to focus especially on perception), Kumārila asks: does it have its status as epistemically reliable—does it have, as Kumārila puts it, its prāmāṇya, or “being a pramāṇa”—“intrinsically” (svataḥ), or does it have this property only on account of something else (parataḥ)? What Kumārila thus asks is whether any cognition’s having the epistemic qualities in virtue of which it is to be reckoned a reliable warrant—truth-conduciveness, say, or the capacity to confer justification—is something that obtains immediately, or whether instead justification is necessarily mediated by one’s having higher-order reasons for confidence in one’s first-order cognitions.
The locus classicus for Kumārila’s argument here is verse 47 of the codanā sūtra chapter of the Ślokavārttika: “It should be understood that all pramāṇas’ have the property of being pramāṇas intrinsically; for a capacity not already existing by itself (svataḥ) cannot be produced by anything else.” (All of the passages given here from Kumārila and his commentators can be found in Arnold 2005, 57–114.) The argument Kumārila concisely expresses here in verse form is straightforward but compelling: if it is thought that any cognition finally counts as a reliable warrant only insofar as it can be demonstrated to be such (for example, by appeal to a subsequent cognition of the causes of the initial one), infinite regress ensues; for the subsequent, justifying cognition would, as itself a cognition, similarly require justification, and so on. Or, as Kumārila here suggests, if the initial cognition isn’t credited with the intrinsic “capacity” for conferring justification, then no further cognition could be able to bestow that, either—unless, of course, the further cognition is itself credited with immediately having that capacity, in which case, why not simply allow this with respect to the initial cognition? As Kumārila’s commentators like to put it, if it is thought that we must await second-order justification before thinking we are justified in crediting first-order cognitions, then “the whole world would be blind.”
Among Kumārila’s guiding intuitions here is the commonsensical thought that radical skepticism is not a tenable idea—that, in other words, it is to be presumed that we are, simply as a matter of empirical fact, already justified in believing a great deal, and that the task of epistemology is therefore to consider what must be the case in order for that to make sense. The thrust of Kumārila’s argument can be brought out by briefly contrasting this epistemological position with what Mīmāṃsakas not unreasonably took to be the characteristically Buddhist position in this regard (with its being particularly the thought of Buddhists like Dignāga and Dharmakīrti that Mīmāṃsakas targeted with their epistemological arguments). Against the kind of common-sense realism exemplified by proponents of Mīmāṃsā, these Buddhists were inclined to encourage wariness with regard to our ordinary epistemic intuitions; Buddhists, after all, are chiefly concerned to argue that we are mistaken in inferring (what is perhaps among our most unshakable convictions) that our manifestly episodic cognitions are the states of an underlying self. To that end, Buddhists like Dignāga and Dharmakīrti privileged what they took to be the constitutively nonconceptual, perceptual awareness that ultimately discloses, they take it, only fleeting particulars. Dharmakīrti’s intuition in this regard was that it is especially in virtue of the causally describable character of perception that it is thus to be privileged, since on his view, the capacity to interact causally with other particulars is what distinguishes anything as really existent. (This intuition means, among other things, that Buddhists would also attack the strong linguistic realism of Mīmāṃsakas, since the kinds of abstract objects posited to make sense of language cannot be thought to have causal efficacy.)
In characterizing what he takes to be the Buddhist position with regard to the issues we are here scouting following Kumārila, the later Mīmāṃsaka commentator Pārthasārathimiśra invokes these central commitments of Dharmakīrti to motivate a case for the direction of explanation that Mīmāṃsakas would reverse: “Since we see that there is cognition of a jar that is sometimes based on a jar, and sometimes not based on a jar, a jar cannot be ascertained only by that [i.e., only by a cognition that seems to us to have a jar as its content]. Accordingly, it must be ascertained that the arising of a cognition of a jar really is based on a jar only after ascertainment that there is a jar which really exists as the cause of that cognition, [which ascertainment can be] based only on perception of pragmatic efficacy.” This credibly represents Buddhists in the tradition of Dignāga and Dharmakīrti as holding that we reach epistemic bedrock only when we have “cognition whose phenomenal content is pragmatic efficacy” (arthakriyānirbhāsaṃ jñānam)—that, in other words, it is reasonable to doubt whether things really are as represented in cognition until we have arrived at the kind of awareness that is causally related to what it is of (as, for example, when one not only sees that there is a jar, but actually carries water with it).
That is what it might look like to suppose, against the Mīmāṃsakas, that the status of first-order cognitions as epistemically reliable should be thought to require demonstration with reference to something over and above the initial cognitions. Against this, Kumārila argues that the problem with such an appeal is that the second-order awareness that the thing perceived is pragmatically efficacious is itself just another cognition. Kumārila would allow, then, that a subsequent cognition concerning pragmatic efficacy could count as a potential source of falsification; the impossibility of carrying water with what had seemed to be a jar would indeed count as overriding the previously justified belief that one had seen a jar. What he refuses, however, is the claim that the cognition of pragmatic efficacy provides a fundamentally different kind of justification than the initial cognition. Confidence, to the contrary, that pragmatic efficacy does provide something more—that it tells us, e.g., that an initially justified belief is also true—could only be based on the presupposition that “pragmatic efficacy” is somehow more immediately available to awareness than, say, a jar; but this begs precisely the question at issue, and Kumārila can not unreasonably ask why the Buddhist is willing to credit the second-order cognition as intrinsically valid, but not the first.
2.3 The significance of falsification for Kumārila’s doctrine
It is important to appreciate the extent to which Kumārila’s epistemology involves essentially phenomenological considerations about the credibility of cognition. He says in this regard (at codanā verse 53) that “the epistemic reliability of cognition is obtained just by virtue of its consisting of cognition”—that, in other words, it is simply in the nature of contentful awareness to make an epistemic claim on the subject thereof, and that these claims are to be suspended or set aside only when specifically countervailing cognitions are forthcoming. Moreover, one typically does not go seeking knowledge that one’s first-order cognitions are false; rather, it is only when presented with overriding cognitions—cognitions, Kumārila says, typically brought about “effortlessly,” i.e., without any ostensibly justificatory search on the part of the subject—that one sometimes finds it necessary to revise one’s judgments. Kumārila does not propose, then, that one must first consider and rule out all possible defeaters before arriving at conviction; the point, rather, is that one’s judgment is justified until and unless some specifically overriding cognition happens to be forthcoming.
An account of the possible overriding of prima facie justified beliefs turns out, then, to be integral to Kumārila’s epistemology. One might, in this regard, worry that on the view he thus proposes, second-order cognitions of defeaters end up themselves having a privileged status; that is, Kumārila might be thought to credit “overriding cognitions” (bādhakajñāna) with a capacity for effecting epistemic closure such as he does not allow for the initial cognitions thus overridden (which, as with scientific hypotheses for Popper, are taken as never able to provide any definitive epistemic closure). Thus, for example, it could be supposed that one might just as well conclude, from the fact that two contradictory cognitions have arisen, that the second one is suspect—and that it would therefore be unwarrantedly privileging “overriding” cognitions to suppose that second-order cognitions ipso facto count as evidence of the falsity of the prior cognitions on which they bear. Here, though, it matters that Kumārila’s account involves essentially phenomenological considerations; his point is just that a subsequent cognition calls for the revision of a preceding one only if it seems to a subject to do so. Thus, to have some prima facie justified belief subsequently called into question just is for the subsequent cognition to present itself as having, phenomenologically, the force of overriding the preceding; if that is not how the second awareness seems, then its phenomenological content will not be that of an overriding cognition in the first place, and it therefore will not present itself to the subject thereof as undermining any already-held belief.
It might also be worried that Kumārila’s account of falsification leaves the epistemic process infinitely open, with something like an infinite regress of potential revisions—that we could never be entitled, on this account, to claim anything like knowledge. Regarding this line of objection, Kumārila and his commentators finally fall back on an appeal to common sense, urging that it is unreasonable to encourage doubt where no specific cognition of any deficiencies explicitly raises one; otherwise, as the commentator Sucaritamiśra puts it, “there would be the unwanted consequence of annihilating all worldly discourse.” The Mīmāṃsakas thus take it that skeptical concerns can reasonably be pressed only so far, and that if it is thought that we are entitled only to those beliefs that have been decisively secured against all such doubts, then it would turn out that we know very little indeed. This thought reflects, again, Kumārila’s commonsense realism, according to which it is beyond doubt that we do know a great deal, and that any epistemology according to which that turns out to be problematic is, ipso facto, to be thought suspect.
2.4 Alternative interpretations of Kumārila’s epistemology
The foregoing reading, on which Kumārila’s characteristic epistemological doctrine centrally involves the claim that phenomenologically determinate cognitions immediately confer prima facie justification, is informed by one of a couple of significant lines of traditional interpretation of Kumārila’s texts; in particular, this reflects the interpretation of the commentator Pārthasārathimiśra, which is arguably preferable both in terms of its exegetical adequacy to Kumārila, and in terms of its philosophical cogency. (See, however, McCrea 2018 for a different perspective on the matter.) There is, however, an alternative line of interpretation to be gleaned from the commentary of Kumārila’s near-contemporary Uṃveka Bhaṭṭa (whose commentary is referred to in the Buddhist Śāntarakṣita’s engagements with Kumārila). Among the salient points of Uṃveka’s reading is the worry that Kumārila cannot, as has so far been suggested, have meant to argue that all phenomenologically credible cognitions are to be credited with being truth-conducive; seemingly counter, then, to Kumārila’s own suggestion (quoted above) that “the validity of cognition is obtained just by virtue of its consisting of cognition,” Uṃveka notes that the fact of “being a cognition” (bodhakatva) commonly characterizes both veridical and erroneous cognitions.
Uṃveka worries, then, that if Kumārila is understood as saying that a cognition’s being truth-conducive follows simply from its being a cognition, there would be the unwanted consequence that if one mistook the glint of mother-of-pearl for that of a piece of silver (a stock example of error in Indian philosophy), this erroneous cognition would have to be credited as a “veridical cognition” (pramāṇa). (It matters for this discussion that the word pramāṇa is equivocal, alternately referring to reliable doxastic practices, and to episodes of veridical cognition such as result from the exercise thereof.) Uṃveka’s intuition, then, is that “being a pramāṇa” can only characterize, as it were, the certified outcome of the epistemic process; he is therefore concerned to interpret Kumārila’s doctrine in such a way that “being intrinsically truth-conducive” ends up being predicated only of what are clearly veridical cognitions.
To that end, Uṃveka urges that Kumārila be understood as arguing that what produces the truth-conduciveness intrinsic to some cognitions just is the causes of those cognitions that are veridical—that, in other words, the point of Kumārila’s characteristic claim is that the truth-conduciveness of any cognition originates intrinsically, arising from the same causal factors in virtue of which it is rightly said to be veridical. With respect, then, to Kumārila’s claim (at codanā 47) that “a capacity not already existing by itself cannot be produced by anything else,” Uṃveka glosses Kumārila’s “by anything else” as suggesting that a cognition’s capacity for truth-conduciveness cannot be produced by anything over and above the causal factors relevant to cognition. From the perspective of an interpretation informed by Pārthasārathimiśra, it thus seems that Uṃveka retains precisely the idea Kumārila means to call into question, which is that veridical cognitions can be distinguished particularly with reference to the causes thereof; for on Uṃveka’s view, what distinguishes a veridical cognition of silver from mistaking mother-of-pearl for such is the fact that in the former case alone, silver really is present as the cause of the cognition. Uṃveka thus takes it that what immediately or “intrinsically” attaches to cognitions is to be understood not in terms of what may be the case prima facie (not in terms of how cognitions may at first appear), but in terms of what we end up with. The status of truth-conducive cognitions as truth-conducive, then, is understood as by Uṃveka as “intrinsic” only in the sense that this status results from the same causes that give rise to the cognitions so characterized—which means we can determine which cognitions those are by identifying the relevant causes.
In contrast to this interpretation of Kumārila, the eleventh-century commentator Pārthasārathimiśra—who also wrote an independent essay on the doctrine here in view (entitled Svataḥprāmāṇyanirṇaya, “Ascertainment of Intrinsic Validity”; see A. Subrahmanya Shastri 1982, Arnold 2002)—embraced just the view that Uṃveka thought so problematic. Pārthasārathimiśra emphasizes that it was precisely Kumārila’s point to argue that all phenomenologically credible cognitions—all cognitions, that is, that first present themselves as candidates for the status of reliable epistemic warrants—should be thought intrinsically or immediately to have that status. This is, on one view of the matter, because Pārthasārathimiśra takes the fact of any cognition’s “being truth-conducive” (prāmāṇya) essentially to concern not truth, but justification—not, that is, the outcome of the epistemic process, but what gets it off the ground in the first place. Kumārila’s reference, then, to the “capacity” that cognitions immediately have in this regard is to be understood as a capacity for conferring justification—a thought that Pārthasārathimiśra expresses by saying he takes Kumārila’s doctrine to affirm (against Uṃveka) not that this status intrinsically exists (bhavati), but that it intrinsically “appears” (bhāti). The point of departure on this understanding of Kumārila, then, is the kind of epistemic claim that any cognition seems to a subject to make upon him.
Among the points Pārthasārathimiśra adduces in favor of this interpretation is that Uṃveka cannot make sense of the account of falsification that figures in Kumārila’s elaboration of his epistemology. On the reading of Kumārila’s epistemology proposed by Uṃveka, Pārthasārathi says, Kumārila would have to be understood as claiming, with regard to cognitions that turn out to be overridden, that their truth-status had changed. In other words, on the view that “being truth-conducive” (prāmāṇya) is intrinsically produced (i.e., by the same causes that produce the cognition), any subsequent revision in judgment would have to consist in the actual transformation of the initially known state of affairs—what had been true, that is, would now be false. Against this, Pārthasārathimiśra urges that “this doesn’t make sense, because of [the cognition’s having been] non-veridical from the outset.” This rejoinder virtually amounts to the statement of a realist conception of truth: in cases where our initial cognition is overridden, the initial cognition was false all along; all that changes is our awareness thereof. Pārthasārathi thus separates the (subjective, epistemic) state of justification from the (objective) fact of truth, and clarifies that what is intrinsic to cognition has to do with the former. This is why Pārthasārathi can coherently take the whole doctrine of intrinsic validity precisely to depend on what Uṃveka took to be an unwanted consequence: its being all determinately contentful cognitions that can reasonably be assumed immediately to confer justification.
On this reading, then, Kumārila’s doctrine is to be understood as holding that it is characteristic of contentful cognitions immediately to confer justification, with the mediation of higher-order cognitions capable not of conferring anything essentially different in kind, but only of calling for revision. If, absent the arising of any overriding cognition, the prima facie justification holds, then the initial cognition stands as veridical in virtue of the fact that it was truth-conducive—in virtue of the fact, as Pārthasārathi puts this point, that “being truth-conducive” (prāmāṇya) is the “motivator of the concept and the word ‘pramāṇa’” (pramāṇabuddhiśabdayor bhāvakatayā). This effectively reverses the direction of explanation favored by Uṃveka, who is instead concerned to argue that the status of being truth-conducive is caused by the same factors that cause veridical cognitions.
If it seems like settling for less thus to argue, with Pārthasārathi, that defeasible justification is all that can be yielded by our epistemic practices, he can rejoin by asking whether it could make sense to want anything more than that; what could it look like, epistemically, not only to be justified in holding a belief, but also to know it is true? In fact, this is already just what one is entitled to think in virtue of being justified, and it is hard to imagine what sense it could make to think we might be, with respect to any particular belief, in a better epistemic position than already entitled to think it true. Indeed, it is arguably just the point of Kumārila’s epistemology thus to challenge the intuition that “knowing” could only consist in knowing that one knows. Just, then, as with the influential efforts of contemporary “reformed epistemologists” to undermine the threat of “evidentialist” challenges (see, especially, Alston 1991, as well as Arnold 2005), Kumārila’s epistemology amounts to a critique of empiricist foundationalism—one that gets its purchase largely by showing that the foundationalist impulse ends up leading to intractable skeptical problems such as can only be foreclosed by an appeal to common sense.
3. Metaphysics and philosophy of language
3.1 On the eternality of the Vedas, and of language in general
Of course, there are, in addition to the foregoing philosophical considerations in favor of Kumārila’s epistemology, specifically Mīmāṃsaka concerns driving the project. In this regard, Pārthasārathi has a particularly cogent point in favor of the interpretation on which Kumārila has, as suggested above, effectively reversed the standard order of epistemological explanation. Thus, Pārthasārathi urges that Mīmāṃsakas cannot proceed on the assumption that Kumārila meant to ask about the status only of pramāṇas (i.e., only of those cognitions that are already known to be veridical); for that would effectively disqualify the Vedas from coming under the purview of this discussion, since Mīmāṃsā’s opponents will not grant that the Vedas count as epistemically reliable (as a pramāṇa) in the first place. Indeed, whether or not we are entitled to think the Vedas epistemically reliable is just the issue in question; it would therefore be to little avail to ask how it is simply that cognitions already known to be reliable have the status they do, since it must first be established that Vedic injunction is a rational basis for action in the first place. And the only way to further this goal, Pārthasārathi argues, is to show that all contentful cognitions (even those that turn out not to have been veridical) should be recognized as immediately conferring justification. Aptly expressing the reversed direction of epistemological explanation commended by this interpretation, William Alston has asked to similar effect: if a subject “were not often really perceiving X why should the experience involved provide justification for beliefs about X?” (1991: 10) Similarly, Pārthasārathi can ask: if it were not really the case that one desirous of heaven should perform a Vedic sacrifice, then why (as this epistemological program is concerned to show) would the experience of a Vedic injunction to that effect provide justification for that belief?
On the view, then, that Kumārila’s doctrine reverses the usual order of epistemological explanation, the claim is that insofar as any cognition engendered by a Vedic injunction intrinsically confers justification simply in virtue of its being a cognition, Vedic injunction first becomes a candidate for the status of “reliable doxastic practice” (pramāṇa)—and the point of Kumārila’s epistemology is that this is a status that any reliable doxastic practice should then be thought to enjoy until or unless it is overridden. Here, though, is where other characteristically Mīmāṃsaka commitments significantly come into play—chiefly, the commitment to the view that the Vedic texts are, like language itself, eternal or primordial. Jaimini’s fifth Mīmāṃsā Sūtra specifies in this regard that “the relations between words and their referents are primordial (autpattika)”—a view meant to underwrite the claim that the Vedas themselves are transcendent or “impersonal” (apauruṣeya). It is, then, particularly together with this view that Kumārila’s epistemology can be taken to warrant the Mīmāṃsaka claim that the Vedas are, in fact, uniquely authoritative; for insofar as they are thus taken essentially to transcend any human perspective, Vedic injunctions, uniquely among reliable doxastic practices, therefore cannot be falsified.
That the claims expressed by or implicit in Vedic texts cannot be falsified has to do with the distinctive capacity of language to bear on imperceptible states of affairs such as are not ready to hand, but always “going to be realized” (bhāvya or bhaviṣyat). Thus, to the extent that any linguistic episode reflects or expresses something of the epistemic perspective of a particular language-user, the claim it makes is always such as can be overridden based on considerations involving that limited epistemic perspective—based, e.g., on the speaker’s mendacity, or on his reporting a perceptual or inferential claim that turns out itself to be mistaken. Language itself, however, is not thus limited by any particular perspective; to the extent, then, that one joins Mīmāṃsakas (as Heidegger sometimes seems to do!) in finding intelligible the idea that language itself might, as it were, utter the Vedas, the fact of there being no epistemically limited author whose intentions the Vedas would express means there can, in this case alone, be no basis for overriding the claims that issue from these texts. (That Mīmāṃsakas argued strenuously against Buddhist and Jaina claims about the possible cultivation of omniscience reflects the stake they thus had in denying that there could be any epistemically unlimited perspective; language as such, in contrast to such individual knowers as the Buddha and the Jina, is not itself a limiting perspective.)
It is important to note (what is sometimes overlooked) that the foregoing claims about the eternality of language and of the Vedas are logically independent of the epistemological position Kumārila has elaborated; the epistemological doctrine of “immediate justification” does not, that is, by itself support the claim that the Vedas are uniquely authoritative. While Kumārila’s epistemology may, then, by itself show that Vedic texts are justifiably credited as epistemically reliable (that, in other words, Mīmāṃsaka beliefs are rationally held), it is logically independent claims about the eternality of the Vedas that are taken by Mīmāṃsakas to warrant the stronger conclusion that Vedic injunctions are uniquely so. It is important to appreciate the independence of these positions from one another, and accordingly to note that the assessment of Kumārila’s epistemology (both traditionally and among modern scholars) is sometimes driven more by resistance to the eternality claim than to anything integral to Kumārila’s epistemology.
Thus, for example, the tenth-century Nyāya thinker Jayanta Bhaṭṭa—who was himself much influenced by the thought of Kumārila, and who was inclined to cede to Mīmāṃsakas authority in hermeneutical matters—was worried, as a theist, about Kumārila’s epistemological case for the authoritative status of the Vedas. Jayanta thought Kumārila’s defense of the Vedas problematic, however, chiefly insofar as Kumārila’s epistemology dovetails with claims about the eternality of the Vedas, thus making for an essentially atheistic case for the eternality of the Vedas. So, while Nyāya thinkers like Jayanta characteristically held that authorship of the Vedas is to be attributed to īśvara, “God,” Kumārila’s defense of the eternality of language involves critiques of theism that are, indeed, very much like some characteristically Buddhist critiques of theism. (On this, see Krasser 1999.) But while Kumārila’s epistemological doctrine is clearly meant to dovetail with these other commitments to secure a unique epistemic status for the Vedas, the claimed eternality of language (and the consequent critique of theism) is not itself a point that is advanced by Kumārila’s epistemological case for the immediately justificatory status of contentful cognitions; indeed, that there is nothing intrinsically anti-theistic about his epistemology is suggested by the fact that William Alston (1991) has elaborated a strikingly similar epistemology precisely in order to show specifically theistic practices to be justified. To the extent, then, that Jayanta attacks Kumārila’s epistemology chiefly by pressing the point that it is problematic to suppose there could be authorless texts (as, for example, in his philosophical play Āgamaḍambara; see Dezso 2005, 213–17), it should be recognized that he misses the mark.
Despite the importance of thus distinguishing these two moments in Kumārila’s case for Vedic authority—the epistemological moment, that is, and the case for the essentially transcendent character of the Vedas—it should be allowed that Mīmāṃsaka commitments regarding the eternality of language in general (and of the Vedas in particular) are hardly incidental to their overall position. While, however, few modern readers are likely to be favorably inclined towards the view that the Vedic texts are authorless, these commitments reflect often profound intuitions, elaborated by Kumārila and other Mīmāṃsakas, about the irreducibly linguistic character of thought, and about the reality of the kinds of universals that must be posited to make sense of the objectivity of language. Arguing, in this regard, for the eternality of language, Kumārila challenged (chiefly Buddhist and Nyāya) proponents of contract- or convention-theories of linguistic origins to explain how any particular linguistic act could coherently be imagined as the first such act. The problem he raises is that any particular linguistic act is intelligible as a linguistic act—intelligible, that is, as instituting linguistic policies—only given the prior understanding that the meaning-creating utterance itself means something. One person could, that is, propose to another that (for example) this thing here be called a ‘cow’ only by telling her so—but the possibility of his doing so is just what we are in this case trying to explain.
Kumārila can be said in this regard to share Wittgenstein’s famously expressed intuition about the problem with Augustine’s account of language-acquisition. With regard to Augustine’s contention that language-learning is explicable in terms of foundational moments of deictic usage, Wittgenstein says that “Augustine describes the learning of human language as if the child came into a strange country and did not understand the language of the country; that is, as if it already had a language, only not this one. Or again: as if the child could already think, only not yet speak. And ‘think’ would here mean something like ‘talk to itself’.” (Wittgenstein 1958, §32) Kumārila can be taken similarly to have urged, in pressing his case for the eternality of language, that we can only imagine thinking to consist in “talking to oneself”—and that to understand that is to understand something more than just what things are called. What Kumārila challenges his Nyāya and Buddhist opponents to explain, then, is where we get the very idea of meaning something, and in what that consists.
Kumārila thus argues that the irreducible givenness of language—its always already being there—is a condition of the possibility of there being any particular speech acts, and of any thought such as might explain these. Particularly as against the essentially psychologistic account of language to be gleaned from the Buddhist Dharmakīrti, Kumārila’s view can be understood to credit something of the irreducibly social character of language, which is to be understood on this view as having an essentially mind-independent reality; the possibility of meaning anything cannot be explained with reference to the goings-on in any particular minds. It might reasonably be said, then, that while Dharmakīrti’s apoha doctrine amounts to a paradigm case of what V. N. Volosinov characterized as “individualistic subjectivism,” Kumārila’s account paradigmatically exemplifies the alternative pole that Volosinov characterized as “abstract objectivism.” (On these arguments, see Arnold 2006, and 2012, Chapter 4; Taber [forthcoming]. See, as well, Volosinov 1986, 45–63.)
3.2 On the reality of linguistic universals
It is important to note, with respect to Kumārila’s characteristically Mīmāṃsaka intuitions about language, that the word śabda—which often means “word,” as in the fifth of Jaimini’s Mīmāṃsā Sūtras, where it is relations between śabda and referents (artha) that are said to be primordial—is essentially ambiguous between what Saussure distinguished as langue and parole. Thus, the same word can also refer generally to “sound,” in the sense denoting any object of the auditory sense faculty. To that extent, śabda can be understood as referring either to language as such (Saussure’s langue), or to particular, temporally describable occasions of linguistic utterance (Saussure’s parole). It thus becomes clear that arguments for thinking that śabda is eternal will seem rather different depending on which of these senses one takes to be in play. Buddhists, especially insofar as they are typically apt to focus on particular occasions of use, find it obviously true that (as on one favored Buddhist example of a formally stated inference) “śabda is impermanent, because it is produced,” just like artifacts like jars (which we know to be both produced on particular occasions, and essentially impermanent). The Buddhist claim is less obviously compelling, however, if instead one takes it that śabda denotes always already available conditions of the possibility of any particular utterance’s counting as linguistic.
Still, while it is surely appropriate thus to credit Kumārila’s arguments for the eternality of language with capturing profound insights regarding our linguistic being, the case for his account of the eternality of language is greatly complicated by the fact that Kumārila actually holds, in a way, that it is in both of the foregoing senses of the word that śabda should be understood as eternal; on his view, that is, it is not only linguistic universals that are timeless, but also the phonemes that manifest these. This view reflects, no doubt, characteristically Mīmāṃsaka commitments, centering on the category of mantra, about the Vedas—commitments, in particular, about the inherent power not only of language as such, but of properly uttered Sanskrit sentences to bring into being the states of affairs they concern. Many Brahmanical texts preserve, in this regard, a famous story of the significance of precise transmission of the text: wishing, by uttering the nominal compound Indra*ndash;śatru (which could mean “conqueror of Indra”), to make his son triumphant, the mythical figure of Tvaṣṭar instead ensured his son’s death by pronouncing the compound so that it had the sense of an adjectival, bahuvrīhi compound (“having Indra as conqueror”)—with the latter state of affairs then brought into being by his utterance.
It is perhaps insofar as he was attuned to such a view of the significance of Vedic language that Kumārila was apt to eschew typically holistic understandings of meaning, and instead to hold the kind of atomistic view on which individual phonemes can be thought part of what is eternal about language. Kumārila was, in this regard, critical of the Sanskrit grammarians’ sphoṭa (“bursting forth”) theory of meaning, which had been elaborated precisely to account for the expression of meaning in light of the manifestly temporal character of linguistic utterance. The considerations here in play are not unlike those that preoccupied Husserl in his On the Phenomenology of the Consciousness of Internal Time (1991); just, then, as Husserl was led to venture that the seemingly instantaneous present of consciousness must somehow comprise something of the past and future if we are to account for things like the musical experience of melody, so, too, Sanskritic thinkers had wondered how to account for the dawning of meaning relative to the necessarily temporal unfolding of any sentence one could encounter. At the moment, for example, when the last phoneme of a sentence is uttered, the initial phonemes are no longer present; at what point, then, are we to say that the sentence’s meaning is experienced, and how are we to account for that with regard to the necessarily vanished moments that are involved?
While proponents of the sphoṭa (or “bursting forth”) theory had urged that we must, in this regard, posit the sudden dawning of something akin to a unitary proposition (which might, indeed, be taken as the sense of the word sphoṭa in this context), Kumārila instead argued that understanding—whether of sentences, or just of individual words—can be explained with reference to memory of discrete phonemes, and that reference to anything over and above the phonemes was therefore unnecessary. Similarly, Kumārila eschewed the holistic account of sentence-meaning—called anvitābhidhānavāda, the doctrine that a sentence is “the expressed meaning of a series [of words]” (per Brough, 1953, 416)—advanced by Prabhākara, who would argue that complete sentences represent the basic unit of meaning. Instead, Kumārila held the so-called abhihitānvayavāda doctrine—the view that a sentence is “a series of expressed word-meanings” (Brough, 416)—on which sentence-meaning is essentially analyzable in terms of word-meanings that are independently intelligible. Against, then, the kind of holistic view on which the sense of a word is to be known chiefly from substitution in sentences, Kumārila argued (just as he had against the sphoṭa theory) that “as the words are uttered in a sentence, each word performs its task of expressing its meaning, and the sentence is the summation of these meanings.” (Brough, 415; see, as well, Kunjunni Raja 1963, Matilal 1990, Siderits 1991.)
While such atomistic views might not be judged very promising, and while they are not obviously required by (and may even seem in tension with) such intuitions as that language essentially transcends individual occasions of use, they fit well with Kumārila’s additional commitment to thinking that the phonemes of Vedic Sanskrit are part of what is eternal in language—though it is surely difficult to imagine how something as eminently temporal as sound could thus be reckoned as in any sense timeless. Notwithstanding his counter-intuitive commitment to eternally existent phonemes, Kumārila was also an uncompromising realist about more clearly abstract universals, taking it, for example, that the referents of kind-terms are real properties such as being a cow. (See Scharf 1996.) This comes through not only in Kumārila’s philosophy of language, but also in his epistemology; against, then, Buddhists who argued (with Dignāga and Dharmakīrti) that perception is essentially non-conceptual, Kumārila firmly held that perceptions, properly speaking, immediately yield justified beliefs regarding things as the kinds of things they are; that perception thus discloses things under some description shows, among other things, that the kinds of conceptual items that figure in descriptions are real.
One can really see, that is, not only particular bovine critters, but also the fact of their exemplifying go-tva, the property of “being a cow”; this is just what it means to perceive any such particular as a cow. This is among the points regarding which Kumārila found it apt to deploy the epistemological doctrine of immediate justification; thus, among the reasons why it cannot reasonably be denied that properties like being a cow are real is that there is nothing that finally falsifies the many justified beliefs we have concerning things that are perceived as exemplifying just such properties. Insofar, that is, as we are prima facie justified in thinking of something perceived as being a cow really to be cow, and insofar as no overriding cognition is forthcoming, we are entitled to think the perceived fact of its being a cow is real. (See, on these lines of thought, Taber’s 2005 translation of the Ślokavārttika’s chapter on perception.)
With respect to the question of how timeless properties like being a cow relate to the individuals that “manifest” them (tokens are in this context referred to as vyakti, “manifestations” of types), Kumārila aimed to finesse the issue that bedeviled Brahmanical proponents of the Nyāya school. Thus, Naiyāyikas characteristically invoked the Vaiśeṣika category of “inherence” (samavāya), holding that an “inherence” relation obtained between universals and the particulars that instantiate them. Criticizing the Nyāya account on the grounds that thus positing an intermediary category to do the work of relating the two different kinds of things just opens up an infinite regress, Kumārila instead held a view with affinities to the kind of perspectivalism that is generally characteristic of Jaina philosophy; on this view, “universal” and “particular” represent different aspects of the same things, with neither aspect being finally intelligible apart from the other. (See, e.g., Ślokavārttika, ākṛtivāda 8, ff.; Jha, trans., 1983, 282, ff.)
3.3 Presumption, “apūrva,” and the nature of the self
Among the grounds for certain of Kumārila’s claims regarding universals is the epistemic practice of arthāpatti, or “necessary presumption.” This represents a doxastic practice admitted as distinct (i.e., as a pramāṇa) only by Mīmāṃsakas, with proponents of other schools of thought having regarded this as indistinct from inference (anumāna). If there is a difference from inference as that doxastic practice was systematized by Indian philosophers, it is perhaps that arthāpatti will not as readily admit of formalization; this represents, then, something more like inference to the best explanation—the presumption or “positing” (kalpanā) of something without which some explanandum would not make sense. According to a stock example, it must be supposed, of a corpulent person who never eats during the daytime, that he eats at night. Kumārila appealed to this mode of reasoning to argue, for example, for the necessity of positing universals as the referents of words; thus, what one understands, on rightly taking the meaning of a word, is that (a universal) without which the word’s communicative capacity would not be intelligible.
The same epistemic procedure is invoked, as well, to offer a peculiar alternative to the characteristically Buddhist view that awareness is inherently reflexive (that all awareness, that is, involves svasaṃvitti, or “self-awareness”). Profoundly wary of the significance of self-awareness in Buddhist arguments for idealism—Dharmakīrti’s arguments for the foundational character of self-awareness, for example, amount to a case at least for the kind of epistemic idealism on which the direct objects of awareness are mental representations (see Arnold 2008)—Kumārila was at pains to disallow that awareness is essentially reflexive. Against that idea, he held the counter-intuitive view that our awareness of ourselves as being aware is in fact a presumption from jñātatā, the fact of something’s “being known.” From the occurrence of an act of “being known,” that is, we presume there to have been an act of knowing, though that is not itself part of the content of our awareness. Lest this seem a manifestly untenable idea, it is worth noting that the broadly Sanskritic discussion of these issues typically took its bearings from grammarians’ analyses of the various factors relatable to a verb in any sentence; thus, Kumārila, like other Indian philosophers who argued against the Buddhist doctrine of self-awareness, urged that it is incoherent to hold that the same thing could at once be agent and patient of a single act—and if it is counter-intuitive to think, with Kumārila, of something’s “being known” prior to or independently of a subject’s knowing that, it may make a difference that the guiding idea of “being known” is that of an act such as can be referred to. “Being known,” then, is here thought to characterize the objects of such acts, and is therefore not something itself to be known by introspection. (For a sympathetic reconstruction of this doctrine in a different context, see Siderits 2011.)
Most controversially, Kumārila invoked the epistemic practice of “necessary presumption” in arguing (at great length in the Tantravārttika) for the category of apūrva, which it is hard not to consider a basically ad hoc category meant to account for the efficacy of Vedic sacrificial rites. Apūrva denotes, then, the temporally remote consequences of ritual acts—what it is, in other words, in virtue of which a correctly performed Vedic rite can be judged efficacious, even in the absence of any immediately observed effect of the expected kind. The felt need to posit such an entity follows from Kumārila’s convictions regarding the epistemic claim that is made (at least upon the right kind of person) by Vedic injunctions. Thus, insofar as one can (as Kumārila argued in elaborating the epistemology sketched in §2, above) justifiably hold that Vedic injunctions make contentful claims about matters of ultimate importance, and insofar as the rites enjoined thereby are manifestly temporal events that are yet said to bear on always “yet-to-be-realized” states of affairs, it must be the case that something relates present, temporally occurrent ritual performances to the essentially imperceptible realm of dharma; for otherwise, the Vedic injunctions would be meaningless.
Here again, Kumārila’s arguments relate closely to linguistic preoccupations in light of which the point he makes can seem more interesting than it might at first. With respect, then, to the question of what, in the Vedic texts, refers to the obscure “apūrva” he has thus posited, Kumārila holds that this should finally be understood as the referent of verbs; for nouns essentially denote already present things, whereas it is verbs in virtue of which injunctive sentences enjoin actions that are always to be completed. (See, e.g., Tantravārttika 2.2.1, ff.; and Ślokavārttika, vākyādhikaraṇa, 330, ff.) Kumārila’s arguments here track, then, an often-cited hermeneutical maxim favored by Mīmāṃsakas: “what exists conduces to what is to be brought into being” (bhūtaṃ bhavyāya kalpate). It is, in other words, the state of affairs whose “realization” (bhāvanā) is expressed by the verb that should be judged predominant particularly in the injunctive sentences that represent, for Mīmāṃakas, the most important parts of the Vedas. (See McCrea 2000.) So, just insofar as they refer to already-present things, nouns refer to things that are essentially subordinated to the realization (the bhāvanā, or “making real”) of the acts that are what such sentences primarily enjoin; insofar, then, as it is reasonable to think that verbs, too, must have referents, and insofar as these referents are always essentially yet to be realized, Kumārila thinks it necessary to posit apūrva (the temporally remote consequence of ritual acts) as being, as it were, the “referents” of verbs. (See Clooney 1990, 239, ff.; Halbfass 1991, 300–307)
Once again, Kumārila can here be seen to take his bearings from the thought that what matters most is what is disclosed by the unique capacity of language somehow to bring into view—indeed, to bring into being—a world beyond what is actually present. Kumārila’s richly elaborated sense of our linguistic being thus reflects, above all, a guiding commitment to the view that Vedic injunctions essentially enjoin the ongoing bringing into being of a ritual world that must continually be renewed—that, indeed, the world itself is sustained by Vedic sacrifice, which is rationally undertaken chiefly insofar as the texts that enjoin this essentially transcend any particular human perspective.
Kumārila’s confidence in the genuinely referential nature of language is also reflected, finally, in his characteristic arguments for the idea that it is an enduring ātman (“self”) that is the underlying subject of all of our actions (and that therefore stands to realize, in the future, the fruits of Vedic practices). Like thinkers in the Brahmanical Nyāya tradition of philosophy, Kumārila (here closely following Śabara) was concerned to vindicate this conviction particularly in the face of Buddhist arguments to the contrary (the claim that persons are “without self,” or anātma, being a cardinal Buddhist doctrine). Kumārila’s intuitions in this regard center on the thought that “the notion ‘I’” (ahaṃ-pratyaya) must have a real referent. That this is so, he argues, is directly experienced in the case of memory, the content of which constitutively involves reference to “I” as the subject of past experiences now remembered. In contrast, then, to arguments (such as those offered by many proponents of Nyāya) to the effect that memory presupposes an enduring subject, Kumārila’s distinctive claim is that in the always first-personally indexed content of mnemonic experience we really “encounter” the referent of the first-person pronoun. Insofar, that is, as it doesn’t make sense to think one might remember an experience, and at the same time be uncertain about whose experience it is that’s remembered, it must be thought that there is in this case genuine “recognition” (pratyabhijñā) of the referent of “the notion ‘I’.” (See, especially, Ślokavārttika, ātmavāda, verses 107–110; Jha 1983, trans., 401–02; Taber 1990.)
Interestingly, Buddhists like Dignāga and Dharmakīrti take the phenomenologically second-order character of memory here identified by Kumārila—the fact, that is, that mnemonic awareness is phenomenologically distinct from present awareness in virtue of the explicitly reflexive character of memory—as evidence only that moments of awareness have a reflexive aspect. That momentary mental states are thus characterized by their “self-awareness” is, for these Buddhists, nothing like awareness of a self; rather, it is something like the fact that moments of cognition are self-intimating. (On svasaṃvitti, see Ganeri 1999, Kellner 2010, Thompson 2011.)
Kumārila, we noted at the beginning of this section, is deeply resistant to the Buddhist doctrine of self-awareness, insofar as that is enlisted by these Buddhists as evidence for the idealist claim that we are, finally, indubitably aware only of the content of our own mental states. Against, though, the Buddhist appeal to the phenomenologically distinctive character of memory, Kumārila can argue that it is not moments of subjectivity that we encounter in memory, but rather the fact that the subject who now remembers is the same as the subject disclosed in the remembered experience. Not momentariness but continuity is the most phenomenologically salient feature of memory—and insofar as Kumārila here again takes his bearings from the guiding epistemological intuition that we are generally justified in taking awareness as veridically disclosing just what it seems to us to disclose. While Buddhists like Dignāga and Dharmakīrti propose, then, an explanation of personhood that is counter-intuitive in light of the phenomenally continuous character of awareness, Kumārila can again invoke his characteristic epistemological doctrine; thus, he argues not only that we are prima facie justified in believing ourselves really to be as we seem (particularly in the case of memory) to ourselves to be, but also that there is finally nothing that can be taken to override that conviction. (See ātmavāda verses 125–26 [Jha 1983, 405], and, as well, Taber 1990.) Kumārila’s account of the self, then, represents another expression of the common-sense realism that informs his entire project.
4. Ideology and ethics
That Kumārila can so often enlist common-sense intuitions in defense of his project, however, might be thought in tension with such surely non-commonsensical ideas as that there is a mysterious “apūrva” connecting the eminently temporal acts of Vedic practitioners to the always “yet-to-be” dharma from which Mīmāṃsakas take their bearings—and in tension, as well, with Mīmāṃsā’s foundational appeal to an essentially authorless corpus of Sanskrit texts. Indeed, Kumārila’s philosophically sophisticated efforts thus to detach characteristically Vedic claims from any finite human perspective can be understood as rather insidious. It is not beside the point to note in this regard that the Mīmāṃsā tradition he advanced can be characterized (as by Sheldon Pollock) as “the dominant orthodox discourse of traditional India” (1989, 604); for it is at least arguably the case that it is precisely the appeal to the transcendent character of the Vedas that secured Mīmāṃsā’s dominance, and that the securing of dominance was just the point of that appeal. That is surely as some of Mīmāṃsā’s critics argued; proponents of the skeptical “Cārvāka” school of thought, for example, argued that the various aspects of the Vedic worldview were all introduced by Brahmins simply in order to secure their own livelihood as the adjudicators of that tradition. Whether or not that represents a reasonable account of the aims of Kumārila and other Mīmāṃsakas, it is surely a defensible view at least that such ideological effects were among the upshots of Mīmāṃsaka influence. Sheldon Pollock has recurrently argued, in this vein, that the dominance achieved by proponents of the Mīmāṃsaka project is reflected in widespread Indic conceptions of authoritative discourse in general—conceptions such as Kumārila himself advanced with his arguments concerning, e.g., the epistemic status of the vast corpus of Brahmanical literature (generally styled smṛti, “tradition”) that extends beyond the Vedic corpus (contrastively styled śruti, “revelation”).
Thus, Kumārila argued at length in the Tantravārttika (e.g., 1.3.1, ff.) that traditional literature can be accepted as authoritative just insofar as it exhibits the property of “being rooted in the Vedas” (vedamūlatvam)—even if that means, in some cases, inferring the reality of a no-longer-accessible Vedic text as the basis for retaining manifestly important traditions that do not obviously stem from any extant Vedic text. Chief among the upshots of this is that what Kumārila and other Mīmāṃsakas took to be the basis for the distinctive epistemic status of the Vedas—namely, their being transcendently “impersonal” (apauruṣeya)—was effectively claimed, as well, for whole traditions of learning ostensibly relatable to the Vedas. As Pollock has suggested, “other sorts of Brahmanical intellectual practices seeking to legitimate their truth-claims had perforce to conform to this special model of what counts as knowledge, and so to suppress the evidence of their own historical existence.” (1989, 609; see, as well, Halbfass 1991, passim)
The characteristically Mīmāṃsaka claim that the Vedas are eternal can thus be understood to inform a pan-Sanskritic episteme such as lends itself to the sort of analysis that is characteristic of Pierre Bourdieu, according to whom “every established order tends to produce (to very different degrees and with very different means) the naturalization of its own arbitrariness.” (Bourdieu 1977, 164) The enormous influence of philosophical projects such as Kumārila’s, that is, arguably had the effect of masking the specifically located and interested character particularly of Brahmanical claims to authority, giving historical and contingent claims the status that goes with their supposedly just reflecting the way things are. It is not unreasonable, then, to see in the success of Kumārila’s project a paradigm case of the kind of historical situation in which, as Bourdieu puts it, “the established cosmological and political order is perceived not as arbitrary, i.e. as one possible order among others, but as a self-evident and natural order which goes without saying and therefore goes unquestioned.” (ibid., 165–6) To that extent, Kumārila’s philosophy would seem readily to admit of the kind of ideology critique advanced, following Bourdieu, by Pollock.
While that is not an unreasonable characterization of the context and implications of his philosophy, Kumārila can also be read as arguing for a radical de-centering of individual aims and projects—for the relativization of all claims and goals to an essentially linguistic reality that is above all distinguished by its vastly exceeding any particular perspective. Mīmāṃsakas typically distinguished, in this regard, between dimensions of Vedic practice that are essentially “for the sake of the person” (puruṣārtha), and those that are “for the sake of the sacrifice” (kratvartha)—and in the final analysis, it is the latter dimensions that are of ultimate significance for proponents of the Vedic worldview defended by Kumārila. (This interpretation is advanced by Clooney 1990, 163, ff.) While Kumārila’s robust realism surely extended, then, to the thought that the selves persons typically take themselves to be are real—that, e.g., the referential character of the first-person pronoun discloses something that is really the case—there is an important sense in which his project can be taken finally to cut against the pursuit of any self-centered agenda. Emphasizing, to similar effect, some profound intuitions that can be understood as reflected in the doctrine of the transcendence of the Vedas, J. N. Mohanty has suggested that the salient point of this claim is that “the intention of the author is not relevant for understanding the texts. The text itself is primary and autonomous.” (2007, 65)
Exemplifying, that is, a long-standing tradition that has always already preceded the individuals who find themselves constituted thereby, the Vedas, on the understanding of them commended by Mohanty, “constitute the founding texts for the Hindu world by opening up the horizon … within which the tradition has understood itself and [within which] we who belong to that tradition have understood ourselves.” (ibid.) Mohanty, then, not implausibly finds it possible to see a basically Gadamerian thought reflected in the idea of the Vedas as authorless, and thus to emphasize the character of these as representing a horizon for (rather than a constraint on) ethical thinking: “The Hindu understanding of dharma as embodied in the imperatives laid down in the [Vedas] preserves the idea of ethics as rooted solidly in that tradition which was founded by those texts, but which those texts have permitted us to reinterpret ever anew.” (ibid.) While this is an interestingly profound characterization of some of the insights driving Kumārila’s project, it is no less reasonable to emphasize, as well, that insofar as Kumārila’s arguments helped secure for Mīmāṃsakas the status of privileged arbiters of this ongoing “reinterpretation,” questions of power and authority remain ineliminable from an understanding of what he was up to.
Critical editions of primary texts
- Tantravārttika. Edited by Kashinath Vasudev Abhyankar, et al, 1970, ff., in Śrīmajjaiminipraṇīte Mīmāṃsādarśane…: (Mīmāṃsākaṇṭīravakumārilabhaṭṭapraṇītatantravārttikasahitaśābarabhāṣyopetaḥ) [7 volumes, comprising Kumārila’s Tantravārttika], Pune: Ānandāśrama Sanskrit Series.
- Ślokavārttika. Edited by K. Sāmbaśiva Śāstrī, 1990, in Mīmāṃsāślokavārtika with the Commentary Kāśikā of Sucaritamiśra (Parts I & II), Trivandrum: CBH Publications (reprint of Trivandrum Sanskrit Series, Nos. 23, 29, 31; 1913).
- Ślokavārttika. Edited by S. K. Ramanatha Sastri, 1971, in Ślokavārtikavyākhyā Tātparyaṭīkā of Uṃveka Bhaṭṭa, Madras: University of Madras, 1971.
- Ślokavārttika. Edited by Swami Dwarikadas Shastri, 1978, in Ślokavārttika of Śrī Kumārila Bhaṭṭa, with the Commentary Nyāyaratnākara of Śrī Pārthasārathi Miśra, Varanasi: Tara Publications.
- Ślokavārttika (Codanāsūtra section only). Edited by Kei Kataoka, 2011, in Kumārila on Truth, Omniscience, and Killing, Part 1: A Critical Edition of Mīmāṃsā-Ślokavārttika ad 1.1.2 (Codanāsūtra), Vienna: Verlag der Österreichischen Akademic der Wissenschaften.
- Nyāyaratnamāla [of Pārthasārathimiśra]. Edited by A. Subrahmanya Shastri, 1982, Nyāyaratnamāla of Pārthasārathi Miśra with the Commentary Nāyakaratnam by Śrī Rāmānujācārya, Varanasi: Banaras Hindu University.
- Tattvasaṃgraha [of Śāntarakṣita]. Edited by Swami Dwarikadas Shastri, 1997, Tattvasaṅgraha of Ācārya Shāntarakṣita with the Commentary ‘Pañjikā’ of Shri Kamalashīla (two volumes, continuous pagination), Varanasi: Bauddha Bharati.
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