#### Supplement to David Lewis’s Metaphysics

## Reduction

Consider a pair of reductive claims, one scientific, the other more philosophical:

- Facts about whether a physical object is
*alive*reduce to facts about its chemical structure. - Facts about
*what causes what*reduce to facts about what happens, together with facts about the fundamental laws of nature that govern what happens.

Both claims are plausible (the first overwhelmingly so). But that
pesky verb “reduce” might prompt concern. You might worry
that, left unanalyzed, the notion of “reduction” is too
unclear and slippery to be put to serious philosophical work. And if
you are Lewis, you will have an additional worry, since you wish to see
no unanalyzed *modal* notions appear as primitives in your
system (and you have the reasonable suspicion that
“reduction” is a modal notion). So we should consider
whether there is a way to analyze “the *X*-facts reduce to the
*Y*-facts” that will dispel these worries.

Start with the obvious strategy: state the thesis in question as a
*supervenience* claim—to wit, the claim that the *X*-facts
supervene on the *Y*-facts—and proceed to define
“supervenience” in the usual modal terms, e.g. by saying
that the *X*-facts supervene on the *Y*-facts iff no two possible worlds
differ with respect to the *X*-facts without differing with respect to
the *Y*-facts. (See e.g. Lewis 1986e, chapter 1; and Stalnaker 1996.) In
that way, it might seem, we can avoid unexplained talk of
“reduction”: the core idea would now be that no two
possible worlds differ at all without differing in their fundamental
structure. (And note that for Lewis, talk of possible worlds can itself
be analyzed away in non-modal terms.)

That won’t do, for three reasons. The first reason is
well-known: the notion of reduction we want is, logically speaking,
*asymmetric*, whereas the foregoing notion of supervenience
isn’t. This problem subdivides. Begin with a purely conceptual
point: we would like our understanding of “reduce to” to be
such that it is a purely logical or analytical consequence of, for
example, the claim that facts about tables reduce to facts about
spacetime points, that facts about spacetime points do *not*
reduce to facts about tables. There is nothing in the logic of
supervenience that guarantees this consequence. Now, we might respond
to that problem simply by analyzing reduction as *asymmetric*
supervenience. But successful though that maneuver is at handling the
purely conceptual problem, it runs afoul of a more substantive point,
which is that there are cases where we would like to say there is
reduction, but in which supervenience is symmetric.

As an artificial example, consider a square grid of pixels, each of
which can be dimmed or lit. Stipulate that the total number of pixels
\(N\) is odd. The relevant space of “possibilities”
will simply be the \(2^N\) possible distributions of
lit and dimmed pixels. Consider the \(N\) propositions each of
which states, for a given pixel, that that pixel is lit; let
the *Y*-facts be the facts about which of these propositions
are true. Consider the \(\frac{N(N-1)}{2}\) propositions each of which states, for
a given *pair* of pixels, that those pixels are in the same
state (both lit or both dimmed). Consider the \(N+1\) propositions, the
first of which states that no pixels are lit, the second of which
states that exactly one pixel is lit, etc. Let the *X*-facts be the
facts about which propositions of these latter two sorts are true. It
would seem natural to say that the *X*-facts *reduce to* the
*Y*-facts: the fact, concerning any pair of pixels, as to whether they
are in the same state is surely nothing over and above the particular
facts about those pixels’ states; the fact, concerning the totality of
pixels as a whole, is surely nothing over and above the particular
facts about each pixel’s
state.^{[10]} And we quite obviously have
*supervenience* of the *X*-facts on the *Y*-facts: there could be no
difference with respect to which pixels were in the same state, and
what the total number of lit pixels was, without *some*
difference with respect to which individual pixels were lit. But we
also have, almost as obviously, supervenience in the *other*
direction. To see this, observe that if we are given all the *X*-facts
aside from the facts about how many pixels are lit, we can quickly
deduce that the grid as a whole must be in one of two possible states:
Begin with pixel 1. From the assumption that it is lit, the state of
every other pixel follows from the *X*-facts; likewise from the
assumption that it is dim. But given that \(N\) is odd, these two states
must differ as to how many pixels are lit. So the remaining *X*-facts pin
down the state exactly. So there can be no difference with respect to
the *Y*-facts (i.e., with respect to which pixels are lit), without a
difference with respect either to which pixels have the same state, or
to what the total number of lit pixels is. But the fact that we have
supervenience—indeed, of a particularly strong kind, given that
the derivation of the *Y*-facts from the *X*-facts is purely
*logical*—does nothing to suggest that we
*don’t* have reduction of the *X*-facts to the *Y*-facts (and,
of course, no such reduction running in the other direction).

Just as we can have reduction without asymmetric supervenience, so
too we can have asymmetric supervenience without reduction. I will
offer three examples. First, suppose the fundamental physical laws of
our world are deterministic. Let the *X*-facts be the facts about the
state of the world at some specific future time \(t\); let the *Y*-facts be
the facts about the state of the world at some early time
\(t_0\), together with the facts about the fundamental laws.
Given determinism, no world could differ from ours with respect to its
\(t\)-state without differing with respect to either its
\(t_0\)-state, or the laws. But a world could easily differ with
respect to the *Y*-facts without differing with respect to the *X*-facts:
such a world might have a different \(t_0\)-state, together with
different laws—ones that allow that early state to evolve into
the *actual* \(t\)-state. So we have asymmetric supervenience of the
*X*-facts on the *Y*-facts. But this does absolutely nothing to show that
the facts about our world’s \(t\)-state somehow *reduce to*,
or are *nothing over and above*, the facts about its
\(t_0\)-state and laws.

One might complain that we have the wrong kind of supervenience here:
while it is true that no world could differ from *ours* with
respect to its \(t\)-state without differing with respect either
to its \(t_0\)-state or laws, it doesn’t
follow—and seems clearly false—that no *two worlds*
could differ with respect to their \(t\)-states without differing
with respect to either their \(t_0\)-states or
laws. Perhaps this stronger supervenience claim holds the key to
understanding reduction.

The next two examples suggest otherwise. The first begins with a
controversial assumption: that the fundamental laws of our world are
*metaphysically necessary*, so that metaphysical possibility
coincides with nomological possibility. Assume, as before, that these
fundamental laws are deterministic. This time, let the *X*-facts be
extremely partial facts about the \(t\)-state of the world (e.g., whether
there are two particles moving at a relative speed greater than
such-and-such a threshold, or something like that). Let the *Y*-facts be
facts about the complete physical state of the world at time
\(t_0\). Given our controversial assumption, we can now say that
no two worlds differ with respect to the *X*-facts without differing with
respect to the *Y*-facts. But given that the *X*-facts are, as it were,
extremely informationally impoverished, it won’t be the case that
no two worlds could differ with respect to the *Y*-facts without
differing with respect to the *X*-facts: two distinct
\(t_0\)-states could have, for example, the same consequences
with respect to certain broad and not-very-informative claims about
goings on at time \(t\). So now we have asymmetric supervenience of the
strong kind, without reduction.

Should we blame the controversial assumption about metaphysical
possibility? I think not: Those who hold that metaphysical and
nomological possibility coincide do not thereby *deprive*
themselves of a perfectly coherent grasp of the notion of
“reduction” (according to which, *inter alia*, facts about
the future *do not* reduce to facts about the past); nor is it
particularly plausible that they are working with a conception of
reduction fundamentally *different* from their opponents’.
At any rate, the third example skirts this issue. It is this:

Consider four spatial points, \(A\), \(B\), \(C\), and \(D\). Let the
distance \(AB = 5\) (in whatever units); \(BC = 5\); \(CD = 5\); and
\(AD = 15\). By the triangle inequality, \(AC \le AB + BC =
10\). Suppose that \(AC \lt 10\). Then (again by the inequality) \(AD
\le AC + CD \lt 15\), so \(AD \lt 15\), which is a contradiction. So \(AC
= 10\). Observe what we have shown: the facts about the \(AB\),
\(BC\), \(CD\), and \(AD\) distances *fix* the facts about the
\(AC\) distance. So no world could differ from this one with respect
to the \(AC\) distance without differing with respect to at least one
of the other distances. But the fact that \(AC = 10\) does
not *reduce to* the facts about the other four distances.

As before, we have the weaker form of supervenience—no world
could differ from *this one* in such-and-such a respect without
differing in such-and-such other respect—but not the stronger. We
can fix that problem at the cost of only a minor complication. Consider
the totality of facts about distances between *every* pair of
points, *except* the pair \(AC\). Let these facts be the *Y*-facts;
let the fact about the \(AC\) distance be the sole *X*-fact. Then no two
worlds differ with respect to the *X*-facts without differing with
respect to the *Y*-facts. From a logical standpoint, that does indeed
show that the *X*-facts are in a certain sense redundant. But it
emphatically does *not* show that they are “nothing over
and above” the *Y*-facts.

We should hold out no hope for an analysis of reduction
*purely* in terms of supervenience. But it does not follow that
there is no analysis, nor indeed that there is no analysis
*partly* in terms of supervenience. And, in fact, Lewis’s
own metaphysical commitments suggest an obvious
candidate.^{[11]}
Lewis believes in a
metaphysical hierarchy of properties and relations. A property or
relation gets its place in the hierarchy depending on how
“natural” it is. So he could happily say that reduction is
supervenience of the *less* natural on the *more*
natural: the *X*-facts reduce to the *Y*-facts just in case the *X*-facts
supervene on the *Y*-facts, and the properties and relations the *Y*-facts
concern are more natural than those that the *X*-facts concern.

That’s an attractive idea, but how successful it is will turn
squarely on how illuminating an account can be given of the “more
natural than” ordering on properties and relations. There is some
room for doubt here: couldn’t it turn out that our grasp of this
ordering derives from our *prior* grasp of such notions as
“reduce to”, “holds in virtue of”, “is
grounded in”, etc.? (Thus, properties and relations of one kind
are more natural than properties and relations of another if the facts
about how the latter are instantiated reduce to the facts about how the
former are instantiated.) A provisional verdict, then: if Lewis
wishes to do without a primitive notion of reduction, then his best bet
is to complete a bit of unfinished business, producing an explicit
account of the “more natural than” ordering on properties
and relations. (See the supplement on uses for the natural/non-natural
distinction for more discussion.)

One final comment. As noted, Lewis is a reductionist about modal facts
themselves. For example, he holds that facts about which propositions
are *contingent* and which *non-contingent* reduce to
facts about the truth or falsity of propositions at different
worlds—where the question of what worlds *are*, and what
it comes to for a proposition to be *true at* a world, can both
be answered in non-modal terms. But if we say that modal facts reduce
to non-modal facts, then we cannot mean merely that modal facts
supervene on non-modal facts more “natural” than those
modal facts. The worry is not one of circularity: for Lewis can define
the apparently modal expression “supervene on” in
non-modal terms. It is rather that supervenience, in this case, is
utterly trivial. Consider the modal facts about which propositions are
contingent. For Lewis, no two possible worlds differ with respect to
whether a given proposition *P* is contingent. A fortiori, no
two worlds differ in this respect without differing in… *any
other respect you care to mention*. So it is quite empty to say
that the modal facts about which propositions are contingent supervene
on some more natural, non-modal facts. Thus, for Lewis’s reductionist
claim about modality to be genuinely informative, it must be
understood in some other way. (See Lewis 1986e,
esp. pp. 86ff.)