Notes to Location and Mereology

1. Different authors, and different time-slices of the same author, use different phrases to express the given relation.

  • Moore (1953: 356–7), van Inwagen (1990b: 10), Lewis (1991: 32; 1999: 194, 226–7), Sattig (2006), McDaniel (2007a,b), and Gilmore (2007) all use ‘occupies’.
  • Thomson (1983), Hudson (2001), Hawthorne (2006: 103–4), Uzquiano (2006), Gilmore (2006; 2009), and Eddon (2010) use ‘exactly occupies’.
  • Lewis (1999: 11), Gilmore (2002; 2003), and Gibson and Pooley (2006) all use ‘is wholly present at’.
  • Casati and Varzi (1999), Bittner, Donnelly, and Smith (2004), and Parsons (2007) use ‘is exactly located at’.
  • Hawthorne (2008: 276) and Kleinschmidt (2011) use ‘is wholly located at’.
  • Balashov (2010), Donnelly (2010), and Saucedo (2011) use ‘is located at’.

Admittedly, there is some controversy as to whether all these authors have exact location in mind. For example, Parsons (2007: 219–20) denies that Gilmore's ‘exactly occupies’ expresses exact location.

2. Though Schaffer (2009) would not endorse H1–H8 when they are interpreted as quantifying over all entities unrestrictedly. Instead he would holds that H1–H8 are true only when the variables are interpreted as ranging over material objects. (As we shall see, when these principles are not so restricted, they face potential counterexamples involving entities that seem not to be material objects, such as universals and tropes.)

3. This principle, minus the necessity operator, is endorsed in Casati and Varzi (1999) and labeled ‘Weak Expansivity’ by Parsons (2007).

4. Uzquiano (2006: 443) formulates principles very similar to Expansivity and Delegation and notes that they are especially uncontroversial.

5. Lewis considers a similar argument against immanent universals (that if they existed, they would violate the transitivity of co-location) and rejects it very casually: “by occurring repeatedly, universals defy intuitive principles. But this is no damaging objection, since plainly the intuitions were made for particulars” (1999: 11). Why not reject his argument against states of affairs on similar grounds? (One might say: yes, states of affairs violate the uniqueness of composition, but that is no damaging objection, since plainly that principle holds only for material objects.) See Donnelly (2011a) for a critical discussion of arguments that, in her terms, ‘use mereological principles to support metaphysics’.

6. Though see Bird (2007) for a defense of the view that such laws are metaphysically necessary.

7. Supersubstantivalism is defended by Sider (2001), Skow (2005), and Schaffer (2009). Schaffer offers a variety of arguments for it, including arguments from parsimony, from Mereological Harmony, from General Relativity, and from Quantum Field Theory. For further discussion, see Skow (2007), Wake (2011), Thomas (2013), Gilmore (2014b), Nolan (2014), Dumsday (2016), and Lehmkuhl (forthcoming).

8. (7) is a bit stronger than McDaniel's NNC. It needs to be to yield the possibility of extended simples. Using just NNC, McDaniel can get only the weaker, disjunctive conclusion that: either it's possible for there to be a simple object exactly located at a complex region or it's possible for there to be a complex object exactly located at a simple region.

9. In addition to the works cited elsewhere in this entry, the literature on universals and their relation to space or spacetime includes Russell (1956), Moore (1966: 77–86), Wolterstorff (1970: 221–234), Bar-Elli (1988: 120–21), Newman (1992), Zimmerman (1997), Lowe (1998, 2006), MacBride (1998), Ehring (2004), Magalhães (2006), Calosi and Varzi (2014), and Mahlan (forthcoming).

10. For more rigorous definitions of temporal parthood and four-dimensionalism, see Sider (2001: 59), Gibson and Pooley (2006: 163), Parsons (2007), Noonan (2009), Balashov (2010: 73), and Kleinschmidt (2011, 2017).

11. Locational endurantism is endorsed by van Inwagen (1990a and 1990b), Bitter, Donnelly and Smith (2004), and Sattig (2006), and it is discussed sympathetically in Hawthorne (2006, 2008). Lewis (1999: 227) claims that there are possible worlds at which things endure via multilocation. Gilmore (2006) presents a relativity-based argument against locational endurantism. Gibson and Pooley defend locational endurantism against Gilmore's argument and others, though they do not positively endorse the view. Calosi (2010b: xi–xvi, 2011) presents a different relativity-based argument against locational endurantism. Gilmore (2007) presents a time-travel based argument in favor of locational endurantism; Eagle (2010a) responds; Gilmore (2010) and Eagle (2010b) are rejoinders. Rychter (2011) and Wasserman (2018) offer a different responses to Gilmore (2007). Balashov (2010) develops a series of detailed relativity-based arguments against locational endurantism. Gilmore (2009), Donnelly (2010), and Kleinschmidt (2011) discuss the ways in which standard mereology would need to be modified if locational endurantism were true. Hofweber and Velleman (2011) deny the intelligibility of locational endurantism. Leonard (forthcoming) develops a version of locational endurantism that harmonizes with the view that spacetime is gunky.

12. For further discussion see, Sider (2001: 101–109), who argues that backward time travel poses problems for endurantism, and Simon (2005), who replies. Effingham (2011) argues that backward time travel poses problems for standard definitions of ‘temporal part’. For more on time travel, persistence, and spatial location, see Benovsky (2011), Bernstein (2015), and Valaris and Michael (2015).

13. Moore (1953: 356) discusses a view according to which colors are multilocated and bear incompatible ‘shape-relations’ to different regions. Ehring (2002) develops a variant of the problem of change, applicable to multilocated universals, that involves incompatible spatial relations rather than incompatible intrinsic properties. Gilmore (2003) offers a relativizing response that treats apparently n-place spatial relations as being 2n-place, with n slots for spatially related things and another n slots for locations of those things. Keskinen, Keinänen, and Hakkarainen (2015) argue that this response fails. Carroll (2011) discusses change and incompatible properties in the context of time travel cases. Simon (forthcoming) offers an account designed to handle the case of a time-travelling enduring ghost whose younger and older selves have incompatible properties at the same location. For more on relativizing responses to the traditional problem of change, see Haslanger (2003) and Hawley (2010).

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Cody Gilmore <>

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