Notes to Location and Mereology

1. See Yablo (1993) and Chalmers (2002) for distinctions between various sorts of conceivability and for discussion of how each of them connects or fails to connect to metaphysical possibility. For relevant criticism see the entry on the epistemology of modality, especially §4.1.

2. Different authors, and different time-slices of the same author, use different phrases to express the given relation.

  • Moore (1953: 356–7); van Inwagen (1990b: 10); Lewis (1991: 32; 1999: 194, 226–7); Sattig (2006); McDaniel (2007a,b); and Gilmore (2007) all use ‘occupies’.
  • Thomson (1983); Hudson (2001); Hawthorne (2006: 103–4); Uzquiano (2006); Gilmore (2006; 2009); and Eddon (2010) use ‘exactly occupies’.
  • Lewis (1999: 11); Gilmore (2002; 2003); and Gibson & Pooley (2006) all use ‘is wholly present at’.
  • Casati & Varzi (1999); Bittner, Donnelly, & Smith (2004); and Parsons (2007) use ‘is exactly located at’.
  • Hawthorne (2008: 276) and Kleinschmidt (2011) use ‘is wholly located at’.
  • Balashov (2010); Donnelly (2010); and Saucedo (2011) use ‘is located at’.

Admittedly, there is some controversy as to whether all these authors have exact location in mind. For example, Parsons (2007: 219–20) denies that Gilmore’s ‘exactly occupies’ expresses exact location.

3. Though Schaffer (2009a) would not endorse H1–H8 when they are interpreted as quantifying over all entities unrestrictedly. Instead he would holds that H1–H8 are true only when the variables are interpreted as ranging over material objects. (As we shall see, when these principles are not so restricted, they face potential counterexamples involving entities that seem not to be material objects, such as universals and tropes.)

4. This principle, minus the necessity operator, is endorsed in Casati and Varzi (1999) and labeled ‘Weak Expansivity’ by Parsons (2007).

5. Uzquiano (2006: 443) formulates principles very similar to Expansivity and Delegation and notes that they are especially uncontroversial.

6. Lewis considers a similar argument against immanent universals (that if they existed, they would violate the transitivity of co-location) and rejects it very casually:

by occurring repeatedly, universals defy intuitive principles. But this is no damaging objection, since plainly the intuitions were made for particulars. (1999: 11)

Why not reject his argument against states of affairs on similar grounds? (One might say: yes, states of affairs violate the uniqueness of composition, but that is no damaging objection, since plainly that principle holds only for material objects.) See Donnelly (2011a) for a critical discussion of arguments that, in her terms, “use mereological principles to support metaphysics”.

7. Though see Bird (2007) for a defense of the view that such laws are metaphysically necessary.

8. It is beyond the scope of this entry to enter into the details of Humean recombinability principles. The interested reader is referred to Saucedo (2011) where many of these subtleties about notions and formulations are discussed at length.

9. The possibility of qualitatively heterogenous extended simples was already discussed in the early modern period. Holden (2004: 81) for instance, argues that the popular modern Doctrine of Actual Parts—roughly the view that a body is a compound of a definite number of (possibly extended) parts that are independent of the whole or any act of division of said whole—was compatible with both homogeneous and heterogeneous ultimate parts, i.e., mereological simples.

10. For further cases in philosophy of religion see Pruss (2009, 2013); Hudson (2010, 2014); Baber (2013); Effingham (2015a); and Pickup (2015).

11. In addition to the works cited elsewhere in this entry, the literature on universals and their relation to space or spacetime includes Russell (1912 [1956]); Moore (1966: 77–86); Bar-Elli (1988: 120–21); Newman (1992); Zimmerman (1997); Lowe (1998, 2006); MacBride (1998); Ehring (2004); Magalhães (2006); Calosi & Varzi (2016); and Mahlan (2018).

12. For the purpose of this section, we assume that material objects are neither identical to events nor spacetime regions.

13. For more rigorous definitions of temporal parthood and fourdimensionalism, see Sider (2001: 59); Gibson & Pooley (2006: 163); Parsons (2007); Noonan (2009); Balashov (2010: 73); and Kleinschmidt (2011, 2017).

14. Locational endurantism is endorsed by van Inwagen (1990a, 1990b); Bittner, Donnelly, & Smith (2004); and Sattig (2006), and it is discussed sympathetically in Hawthorne (2006, 2008). Lewis (1999: 227) claims that there are possible worlds at which things endure via multilocation. Gilmore (2006) presents a relativity-based argument against locational endurantism. Gibson and Pooley defend locational endurantism against Gilmore’s argument and others, though they do not positively endorse the view. Gilmore (2007) presents a time-travel based argument in favor of locational endurantism; Eagle (2010a) responds; Gilmore (2010) and Eagle (2010b) are rejoinders. Rychter (2011) and Wasserman (2018) offer a different responses to Gilmore (2007). Balashov (2010) develops a series of detailed relativity based arguments against locational endurantism. Gilmore (2009), Donnelly (2010), and Kleinschmidt (2011) discuss the ways in which standard mereology would need to be modified if locational endurantism were true. Hofweber & Velleman (2011) deny the intelligibility of locational endurantism. Leonard (2018) and Correia (2022) develop versions of locational endurantism that is compatible with absence of exact locations.

15. Minimal Mereology is the mereological systema that only comprises the partial ordering axioms for parthood (Reflexivity, Anti-symmetry and Transitivity). Ground Mereology is the mereological system that is obtained by adding to Minimal Mereology the Weak Supplementation principle (if x is a proper part of y, there is a part of y that is disjoint from x). Classical Extensional Mereology is the mereological system that comprises the partial ordering axioms and the following two principles—at least on one of its equivalent axiomatizations: Strong Supplementation (if y is not part of x, there is a part of y that is disjoint from x), and Unrestricted Composition (any non-empty plurality has a mereological fusion). Its extensional character is witnessed by the fact that sameness of proper parts is sufficient for identity.

16. The original argument has a different modal force: the possibility of multilocation is inconsistent with ground mereology for occupants.

17. This is called Region Dissection in Calosi (2014) and Calosi & Costa (2015).

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