#### Supplement to Deontic Logic

## List of Supplements to Deontic Logic

- A. Mally and Symbolic Deontic Logic
- B. Von Wright’s 1951a System and SDL
- C. Alternative Axiomatization of SDL
- D. Two Counter-Models Regarding Additions to SDL
- E. Non-Performance versus Refraining/Forbearing
- F. The Paradox of Epistemic Obligation (Åqvist 1967)
- G. Collapse of Conflicts into Impossible Obligations
- H. A Puzzle Surrounding Kant’s Law

## A. Mally and Symbolic Deontic Logic

Although it is with von Wright 1951a that symbolic deontic logic takes
off as an on-going active academic area of study, we need to note that
Mally 1926 was a significant earlier episode that, due at least in
part, to serious technical problems, did not serve as a catalyst.
Despite the problems with the system he found (notably and
notoriously, the collapse of what ought to be into what is the case),
Mally was an impressive pioneer of deontic logic. He was apparently
uninfluenced by, and thus did not benefit from, early developments of
alethic modal logic. This is quite opposed to the later trend in the
1950s when deontic logic reemerged, this time as a full-fledged
discipline, deeply influenced by earlier developments in alethic modal
logic. Mally was the first to found deontic logic on the syntax of
propositional calculus explicitly, a strategy that others quickly
returned to after a deviation from this strategy in the very first
work of von Wright. Mally was the first in the twentieth century to
employ deontic constants in symbolic deontic logic (reminiscent of
Kanger and Anderson’s later use of deontic constants, but
without their “reduction”; more below). He was also the
first to attempt to provide an integrated account of non-conditional
and conditional ought statements, one that provided an
*analysis* of conditional *oughts* via a monadic deontic
operator coupled with a material conditional (reminiscent of similar
failed attempts in von Wright 1951a to analyze the dyadic notion of
commitment), and allowing for a form of factual detachment (more in
Section 4).
All in all, this seems to be a remarkable achievement in retrospect.
For more information on Mally’s system, including a diagnosis of
the source of his main technical mistake, and a sketch of how he might
have better avoided it, see the entry on
Mally’s deontic logic.

## B. Von Wright’s 1951a System and SDL

It is fair to say that von Wright 1951a launched deontic logic as an area of active research. There was a flurry of responses, and not a year has gone by since without published work in this area. Here, we briefly outline the main differences between von Wright’s 1951a system and SDL.

First, in von Wright’s 1951a system, variables ranged over
*act types* instead of propositions. As a result, the deontic
operator symbols (e.g., \(\OB\)) were interpreted as applying not to
sentences, but to names of act types (cf. “to attend” or
“attending”) to yield a sentence (e.g., “it is
obligatory to attend” or “attending is obligatory”).
Consequently, iterated deontic sequences (e.g., \(\OB \OB A\)) were
not well-formed formulas and shouldn’t have been on his intended
interpretation, since \(\OB A\) (unlike \(A)\) is a sentence, not an
act description, so not suitable for having \(\OB\) as a prefix to it
(cf. “it is obligatory it is obligatory to run” or
“running is obligatory is obligatory”). However, von
Wright does think that there can be negations, disjunctions and
conjunctions of act types, and so he uses standard connectives to
generate not only complex normative sentences (e.g., \(\OB A \amp \PE
A)\), but complex act descriptions (e.g., \(A \amp \neg B)\), and thus
complex normative sentences involving them (e.g., \(\OB (A \amp \neg
B) \rightarrow \PE (A \amp \neg B))\). The standard connectives of PC
are thus used in a systematically ambiguous way in von Wright’s
initial system with the hope of no confusion, but a more refined
approach (as he recognized) would call for the usual truth-functional
operators and a second set of act-type-compounding analogues to
these.^{[99]}
Still in line with this different interpretation, mixed formulas
(e.g., \(A \rightarrow \OB A)\) were not well-formed in his 1951
system. (Cf. “If to run then it is obligatory to run”.)
The standard violation condition for an obligation (e.g., \(\OB p \amp
\neg p)\) is also not expressible in his system. Finally, von Wright
rejected NEC, but otherwise accepts analogues to the basic principles
of SDL.

Researchers quickly opted for a syntactic approach where the variables and operators are interpreted propositionally as they are in PC (Prior 1955 [1962], Anderson 1956, Kanger 1957 [1971], and Hintikka 1957), and von Wright soon adopted this course himself in his key revisions of his “old system” (e.g. von Wright 1956, von Wright 1964, von Wright 1965, and the more widely read von Wright 1971 being essentially an amalgamation of the latter two articles). Note that this is essentially a return to the approach in Mally’s deontic logic of a few decades before.

## C. Alternative Axiomatization of SDL

The following alternative axiom system, which is provably equivalent
to SDL, “breaks up” SDL into a larger number of
“weaker parts” (SDL *à la carte*, as it
were). This has the advantage of facilitating comparisons with other
systems that reject one or more of SDL’s
theses.^{[100]}

SDL′ | All tautologous formulae of the language | (TAUT) |

\(\OB (p \amp q) \rightarrow(\OB p \amp \OB q) \) | (\(\OB\)-M) | |

\((\OB p \amp \OB q) \rightarrow \OB (p \amp q) \) | (\(\OB\)-C) | |

\(\neg \OB \bot \) | (\(\OB\)-OD) | |

\(\OB \top \) | (\(\OB\)-N) | |

If \(\vdash p\) and \(\vdash p \rightarrow q\), then \(\vdash q\) | (MP) | |

If \(\vdash p \leftrightarrow q\), then \(\OB p\leftrightarrow \OB q \) | (\(\OB\)-RE) |

Regarding SDL’s expressive powers, advocates typically endorse the Traditional Definitional Scheme discussed in Section 1.2. So let us note here that given those definitions of the remaining operators, we can derive a variety of theorems and rules governing them, some suggestive of alternative axiomatizations. For example, given \(\PE p \eqdf \neg \OB \neg p\), it is easy to show that \(\OB\)-K is equivalent to

\[\neg \PE (p \amp \neg q) \rightarrow(\PE \neg q \rightarrow \PE \neg p),\]
NC is equivalent to \(\neg \PE p \rightarrow \PE \neg p\), and
\(\OB\)-NEC is equivalent to if \(\vdash \neg p\), then \(\vdash \neg
\PE
p\).^{[101]}
In fact, we could have used any of our first four normative statuses
(\(\OB\), \(\PE\), \(\IM\), \(\OM\)) from the Traditional Scheme as
primitive to given alternative characterizations of SDL, but using
\(\OB\) is more prevalent.

## D. Two Counter-Models Regarding Additions to SDL

We now provide a counter-model to show that \(\OB\)-U, \(\OB (\OB p \rightarrow p)\), is indeed a genuine (non-derivable) addition to SDL:

Fig. D.1 [An extended description of figure D.1.]

Here, seriality holds, since each of the three worlds has at least one
world acceptable to it (in fact, exactly one), but *secondary*
seriality fails, since although \(j\) is acceptable to \(i, j\) is not
acceptable to itself. Now look at the top annotations regarding the
assignment of truth or falsity to \(p\) at \(j\) and \(k\). The lower
deontic formulae derive from this assignment and the accessibility
relations. (The value of \(p\) at \(i\) won’t matter.) Since
\(p\) holds at \(k\), which exhausts the worlds acceptable to \(j, \OB
p\) must hold at \(j\), but then, since \(p\) itself is false at
\(j\), \((\OB p \rightarrow p)\) must be false at \(j\). But \(j\) is
acceptable to \(i\), so not all \(i\)-acceptable worlds are ones where
\((\OB p \rightarrow p)\) holds, so \(\OB (\OB p \rightarrow p)\) must
be false at
\(i\).^{[102]}
We have already proven that seriality, which holds in this model,
automatically validates NC. It is easy to show that the remaining
ingredients of SDL hold here as
well.^{[103]}

We proved above that \((\OB \OB p \rightarrow \OB p)\) is derivable from \(\OB\)-U. Here is a model that shows that the converse fails:

Fig. D.2 [An extended description of figure D.2.]

It is left to the reader to verify that given the accessibility relations and indicated assignments to \(p\) at \(j\) and \(k, \OB \OB p \rightarrow \OB p\) must be (vacuously) true at \(i\), while \(\OB (\OB p \rightarrow p)\) must be false at \(i\).

## E. Non-Performance versus Refraining/Forbearing

Another interesting operator can be defined via a condition involving embedding of “\(\BA\)”:

\[\RF p \eqdf \BA \neg \BA p.\]
This expresses a widely endorsed analysis of refraining (or
“forbearing”).^{[104]}
In quasi-English, *it is a case of refraining by our agent
that* \(p\) if and only if our agent brings it about that she does
not bring it about that \(p\). The importance of this in agency theory
is based on the assumption that refraining from doing something is
distinct from simply not doing something. In the current agential
framework, this boils down to the denial of the following claim:

No agent brings about logical truths, but neither does an agent bring it about (by anything she does do) that she doesn’t bring about such logical truths. It has nothing to do with what she does. That * can’t hold is easily proven given any consistent system with \(\BA\)-RE and \(\BA\)-NO. So refraining from \(p\) is not equivalent to merely not bringing about \(p\). Whether or not it is of great importance in deontic logic itself is a more controversial matter. It would hinge on matters like whether or not there is a difference between being obligated to not bring it about that \(p\) and being obligated to bring it about that you don’t bring it about that \(p\).

An alternative account sometimes given of refraining is that of
inaction coupled with ability: to refrain from bringing it about that
\(p\) is to be *able* to bring it about that \(p\) and to not
bring it about that \(p\). (See von Wright 1963, on
“forbearance”.) This might be expressed as follows:

where “\(\AB\)” is interpreted as an agential
*ability* operator, perhaps a compound operator of the broad
form “\(\Diamond \BA p\)”, with “\(\Diamond\)“
suitably constrained (e.g., as what is now still possible or still
possible relative to our agent). In some frameworks, the two proposed
analysans of refraining are provably equivalent (e.g., Horty
2001).^{[105]}
Informally one might argue that if I am able to bring it about that
\(p\) and don’t, then I don’t bring it about that \(p\) by
whatever it is that I do bring about instead, and so I refrain per the
first analysis; and if I truly bring it about by what I do that I
don’t bring it about that \(p\), then I must have been able to
bring it about that \(p\) even though I didn’t, so I refrain per
the second analysis.

## F. The Paradox of Epistemic Obligation (Åqvist 1967)

Consider:

- (1)
- The bank is being robbed.
- (2)
- It ought to be the case that Jones (the guard) knows that the bank is being robbed.
- (3)
- It ought to be the case that the bank is being robbed.

Let us symbolize “Jones knows that the bank is being robbed” by “K\(_j\)r”, and add the operator K\(_j\) to SDL. Then it would appear that a correct way to symbolize (1)–(3) is:

\[\tag{\(1'\)} r \] \[\tag{\(2'\)} \OB K_j r \] \[\tag{\(3'\)} \OB r\]
But it is a logical truth that if one knows that \(p\), then \(p\) is
the case—Jones knows the bank is being robbed only if it is
being robbed. So \(\vdash K_j r \rightarrow r\) would hold in any
system augmented with a faithful logic of knowledge. So in such a
system, it would follow by RM that \(\vdash \OB K_j r \rightarrow \OB
r\) From this conditional and (2′), we can derive (3′) by
MP.^{[106]}
However, it hardly seems to follow from the fact that it is
obligatory that the guard knows that the bank is being robbed, that it
is likewise obligatory that the bank is being robbed. More generally,
it seems that any plausible enrichment of SDL with a knowledge
operator has the implausible property that, if an agent is obligated
to know that a certain (impermissible) state of affairs obtains, then
this state of affairs is itself also
obligatory.^{[107]}

## G. Collapse of Conflicts into Impossible Obligations

We saw in
Section 3
that Kant’s Law, when represented as \(\OB p \rightarrow
\Diamond p\), is a theorem of KT*d*. A weaker, and so more
plausible, claim than that of Kant’s Law is that something
cannot be obligatory unless it is at least *logically*
possible. In SDL, this might be expressed by the rule:

If \(\vdash \neg p\) then \(\vdash \neg \OB p\).

This is easily derivable in SDL from \(\OB\)-NEC and NC Claiming that
Romeo is not obligated to square the circle even if he solemnly
promised Juliet is a reasonable stance, and one essential to the vast
majority of deontic systems, since they endorse \(\OB\)-OD (i.e.,
\(\vdash \neg \OB
\bot)\).^{[108]}

However, this points to another puzzle for SDL. The rule above is
equivalent to \(\vdash \OB\)-OD in any system with \(\OB\)-RE, and in
fact, in the context of SDL, these are both equivalent to NC. That is,
we could replace the latter axiom with either \(\OB\)-OD or the
preceding rule and have a system equivalent to SDL. In particular, in
any system with K and RM, \((\OB p \amp \OB \neg p) \leftrightarrow
\OB \bot \) is a theorem. The distinction between conflicts of
obligation and logically impossible obligations collapses. Separating
NC from \(\OB\)-OD is now quite routine in conflict-allowing deontic
logics.^{[109]}

## H. A Puzzle Surrounding Kant’s Law

Consider:^{[110]}

- (1)
- I’m obligated to pay you back $10 tonight.
- (2)
- I can’t pay you back $10 tonight (e.g., I just gambled away my last dime).

Since this puzzle typically involves some notion of possibility, let
us represent the above sentences in KT*d*, which includes SDL,
but also has a possibility operator:

(1) and (2) appear to be consistent. Often, people are unable to
fulfill their financial obligations, yet it is a truism that financial
obligations are obligations. However in KT*d*, it is a theorem
that \(\OB p \rightarrow \Diamond p\). So we derive a contradiction
from this symbolization and the assumption that (1′) and
(2′) are true.

For a variant of this example, consider:

- (1)
- I owe you ten dollars, but I can’t pay you back.
- (2)
- I’m obligated to pay you ten dollars, but I can’t.

(2) seems to follow from (1), and (1) hardly seems contradictory, since owing money clearly does not entail being able to pay the money owed. Thomason 1981b suggests a distinction between deliberative contexts of evaluation and judgmental contexts, where in the latter context evaluations such as (1) above need not satisfy Kant’s law since, roughly, we go back in time and evaluate the present in terms of where things would now be relative to optimal past options that were accessible but no longer are.